Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) is one of the greatest systematic thinkers in the history of Western philosophy. In addition to epitomizing German idealist philosophy, Hegel boldly claimed that his own system of philosophy represented an historical culmination of all previous philosophical thought. Hegel’s overall encyclopedic system is divided into the science of Logic, the philosophy of Nature, and the philosophy of Spirit. Of most enduring interest are his views on history, society, and the state, which fall within the realm of Objective Spirit. Some have considered Hegel to be a nationalistic apologist for the Prussian State of the early 19th century, but his significance has been much broader, and there is no doubt that Hegel himself considered his work to be an expression of the self-consciousness of the World Spirit of his time. At the core of Hegel’s social and political thought are the concepts of freedom, reason, self-consciousness, and recognition. There are important connections between the metaphysical or speculative articulation of these ideas and their application to social and political reality, and one could say that the full meaning of these ideas can be grasped only with a comprehension of their social and historical embodiment. The work that explicates this concretizing of ideas, and which has perhaps stimulated as much controversy as interest, is the Philosophy of Right (Philosophie des Rechts), which will be a main focus of this essay.
G.W.F. Hegel was born in Stuttgart in 1770, the son of an official in the government of the Duke of Württemberg. He was educated at the Royal Highschool in Stuttgart from 1777-88 and steeped in both the classics and the literature of the European Enlightenment. In October, 1788 Hegel began studies at a theological seminary in Tübingen, the Tüberger Stift, where he became friends with the poet Hölderlin and philosopher Friedrich Schelling, both of whom would later become famous. In 1790 Hegel received an M.A. degree, one year after the fall of the Bastille in France, an event welcomed by these young idealistic students. Shortly after graduation, Hegel took a post as tutor to a wealthy Swiss family in Berne from 1793-96. In 1797, with the help of his friend Hölderlin, Hegel moved to Frankfurt to take on another tutorship. During this time he wrote unpublished essays on religion which display a certain radical tendency of thought in his critique of orthodox religion.
In January 1801, two years after the death of his father, Hegel finished with tutoring and went to Jena where he took a position as Privatdozent (unsalaried lecturer) at the University of Jena, where Hegel’s friend Schelling had already held a university professorship for three years. There Hegel collaborated with Schelling on a Critical Journal of Philosophy (Kritisches Journal der Philosophie) and he also published a piece on the differences between the philosophies of Fichte and Schelling (Differenz des Fichte’schen und Schelling’schen Systems der Philosophie) in which preference was consistently expressed for the latter thinker. After having attained a professorship in 1805, Hegel published his first major work, the Phenomenology of Spirit (Phänomenologie des Geistes, 1807) which was delivered to the publisher just at the time of the occupation of Jena by Napoleon’s armies. With the closing of the University, due to the victory of the French in Prussia, Hegel had to seek employment elsewhere and so he took a job as editor of a newspaper in Bamberg, Bavaria in 1807 (Die Bamberger Zeitung) followed by a move to Nuremberg in 1808 where Hegel became headmaster of a preparatory school (Gymnasium), roughly equivalent to a high school, and also taught philosophy to the students there until 1816. During this time Hegel married, had children, and published his Science of Logic (Wissenschaft der Logik) in three volumes.
One year following the defeat of Napoleon at Waterloo (1815), Hegel took the position of Professor of Philosophy at the University of Heidelberg where he published his first edition of the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Outline (Encyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften im Grundrisse, 1817). In 1818 he became Professor of Philosophy at the University of Berlin, through the invitation of the Prussion minister von Altenstein (who had introduced many liberal reforms in Prussia until the fall of Napoleon), and Hegel taught there until he died in 1831. Hegel lectured on various topics in philosophy, most notably on history, art, religion, and the history of philosophy and he became quite famous and influential. He held public positions as a member of the Royal Examination Commission of the Province of Brandenberg and also as a councellor in the Ministry of Education. In 1821 he published the Philosophy of Right (Philosophie des Rechts) and in 1830 was given the honor of being elected Rector of the University. On November 14, 1831 Hegel died of cholera in Berlin, four months after having been decorated by Friedrich Wilhelm III of Prussia.
Apart from his philosophical works on history, society, and the state, Hegel wrote several political tracts most of which were not published in his lifetime but which are significant enough in connection to the theoretical writings to deserve some mention. (These are published in English translation in Hegel’s Political Writings and Political Writings, listed in the bibliography of works by Hegel below.)
Hegel’s very first political work was on “On the Recent Domestic Affairs of Wurtemberg” (Über die neuesten innern Verhältnisse Württembergs…, 1798) which was neither completed nor published. In it Hegel expresses the view that the constitutional structure of Wurtemberg requires fundamental reform. He condemns the absolutist rule of Duke Ferdinand along with the narrow traditionalism and legal positivism of his officials and welcomes the convening of the Estates Assembly, while disagreeing with the method of election in the Diet. In contrast to the existing system of oligarchic privilege, Hegel argues that the Diet needs to be based on popular election through local town councils, although this should not be done by granting suffrage to an uneducated multitude. The essay ends inconclusively on the appropriate method of political representation.
A quite long piece of about 100 pages, The German Constitution (Die Verfassung Deutchlands) was written and revised by Hegel between 1799 and 1802 and was not published until after his death in 1893. This piece provides an analysis and critique of the constitution of the German Empire with the main theme being that the Empire is a thing of the past and that appeals for a unified German state are anachronistic. Hegel finds a certain hypocrisy in German thinking about the Empire and a gap between theory and practice in the German constitution. Germany was no longer a state governed by law but rather a plurality of independent political entities with disparate practices. Hegel stresses the need to recognize that the realities of the modern state necessitate a strong public authority along with a populace that is free and unregimented. The principle of government in the modern world is constitutional monarchy, the potentialities of which can be seen in Austria and Prussia. Hegel ends the essay on an uncertain note with the idea that Germany as a whole could be saved only by some Machiavellian genius.
The essay “Proceedings of the Estates Assembly in the Kingdom of Württemberg, 1815-1816″ was published in 1817 in the Heidelbergische Jahrbücher. In it Hegel commented on sections of the official report of the Diet of Württemberg, focusing on the opposition by the Estates to the King’s request for ratification of a new constitutional charter that recognized recent liberalizing changes and reforms. Hegel sided with King Frederick and criticized the Estates as being reactionary in their appeal to old customary laws and feudal property rights. There has been controversy over whether Hegel here was trying to gain favor with the King in order to attain a government position. However, Hegel’s favoring a sovereign kingdom of Wurtemberg over the German Empire and the need for a constitutional charter that is more rational than the previous are quite continuous with the previous essays. A genuine state needs a strong and effective central public authority, and in resisting the Estates are trying to live in the feudal past. Moreover, Hegel is not uncritical of the King’s constitutional provisions and finds deficiencies in the exclusion of members of professions from the Estates Assembly as well as in the proposal for direct suffrage in representation, which treats citizens like unintegrated atomic units rather than as members of a political community.
The last of Hegel’s political tracts, “The English Reform Bill,” was written in installments in 1831 for the ministerial newspaper, the Preussische Staatszeitung, but was interrupted due to censure by the Prussian King because of the perception of its being overly critical and anti-English. As a result, the remainder of the work was printed independently and distributed discretely. Hegel’s main line of criticism is that the proposed English reforms of suffrage will not make much of a difference in the distribution of political power and may only create a power struggle between the rising group of politicians and the traditional ruling class. Moreover, there are deep problems in English society that cannot be addressed by the proposed electoral reforms, including political corruption in the English burroughs, the selling of seats in parliament, and the general oligarchic nature of social reality including the wide disparities between wealth and poverty, Ecclesiastical patronage, and conditions in Ireland. While Hegel supports the idea of reform with its appeal to rational change as against the “positivity” of customary law, traditionalism and privilege, he thinks that universalizing suffrage with a property qualification without a thorough reform of the system of Common Law and the existing social conditions will only be perceived as token measures leading to greater disenchantment among the newly enfranchised and possibly inclinations to violent revolution. Hegel claims that national pride keeps the English from studying and following the reforms of the European Continent or seriously reflecting upon and grasping the nature of government and legislation.
There are several overall themes that reoccur in these political writings and that connect with some of the main lines of thought in Hegel’s theoretical works. First, there is the contrast between the attitude of legal positivism and the appeal to the law of reason. Hegel consistently displays a “political rationalism” which attacks old concepts and attitudes that no longer apply to the modern world. Old constitutions stemming from the Feudal era are a confused mixture of customary laws and special privileges that must give way to the constitutional reforms of the new social and political world that has arrived in the aftermath of the French Revolution. Second, reforms of old constitutions must be thorough and radical, but also cautious and gradual. This might sound somewhat inconsistent, but for Hegel a reform is radical due to a fundamental change in direction, not the speed of such change. Hegel suggests that customary institutions not be abolished too quickly for there must be some congruence and continuity with the existing social conditions. Hegel rejects violent popular action and sees the principal force for reform in governments and the estates assemblies, and he thinks reforms should always stress legal equality and the public welfare. Third, Hegel emphasizes the need for a strong central government, albeit without complete centralized control of public administration and social relations. Hegel here anticipates his later conception of civil society (bürgerliche Gesellschaft), the social realm of individual autonomy where there is significant local self-governance. The task of government is not to thoroughly bureaucratize civil society but rather to provide oversight, regulation, and when necessary intervention. Fourth, Hegel claims that representation of the people must be popular but not atomistic. The democratic element in a state is not its sole feature and it must be institutionalized in a rational manner. Hegel rejects universal suffrage as irrational because it provides no means of mediation between the individual and the state as a whole. Hegel believed that the masses lacked the experience and political education to be directly involved in national elections and policy matters and that direct suffrage leads to electoral indifference and apathy. Fifth, while acknowledging the importance of a division of powers in the public authority, Hegel does not appeal to a conception of separation and balance of powers. He views the estates assemblies, which safeguard freedom, as essentially related to the monarch and also stresses the role of civil servants and members of the professions, both in ministerial positions and in the assemblies. The monarchy, however, is the central supporting element in the constitutional structure because the monarch is invested with the sovereignty of the state. However, the power of the monarch is not despotical for he exercises authority through universal laws and statutes and is advised and assisted by a ministry and civil service, all members of which must meet educational requirements.
Hegel wrote several pieces while at the University of Jena that point in the direction of some of the main theses of the Philosophy of Right. The first was entitled “On the Scientific Modes of Treatment of Natural Law–Its Place in Practical Philosophy and Its Relationship to the Positive Science of Law” (Über die wissenschaftlichen Behandlungsarten des Naturrechts…), published originally in the Kritisches Journal der Philosophie in 1802, edited jointly by Hegel and Schelling. In this piece, usually referred to as the essay on Natural Law, Hegel criticizes both the empirical and formal approaches to natural law, as exemplified in British and Kantian philosophy respectively. Empiricism reaches conclusions that are limited by the particularities of its contexts and materials and thus cannot provide universally valid propositions regarding the concepts of various social and political institutions or of the relation of reflective consciousness to social and political experience. Formalist conclusions, on the other hand, are too insubstantial and abstract in failing to properly link human reason concretely to human experience. Traditional natural law theories are based on an abstract rationalism and the attempts of Rousseau, Kant, and Fichte to remedy this through their various ethical conceptions fail to overcome abstractness. For Hegel, the proper method of philosophical science must link concretely the development of the human mind and its rational powers to actual experience. Moreover, the concept of a social and political community must transcend the instrumentalizing of the state.
Hegel’s work entitled “The System of Ethical Life” (System der Sittlichkeit) was written in 1802-03 and first published in its entirety by Georg Lasson in 1913 in a volume entitled Schriften zur Politik und Rechtsphilosophie. In this work, Hegel develops a philosophical theory of social and political development that correlates with the self-development of essential human powers. Historically, humans begin in an immediate relation to nature and their social existence takes the form of natürliche Sittlichkeit, i.e., a non-selfconscious relation to nature and to others. However, the satisfaction of human desires leads to their reproduction and multiplication and leads to the necessity for labor, which induces transformation in the human world and people’s connections to it. This process leads to a self-realization that undermines the original naïve unity with nature and others and to the formation of overtly cooperative endeavors, e.g., in the making and use of tools. Another result of labor is the emergence of private property as an embodiment of human personality as well as of sets of legal relationships that institutionalize property ownership, exchange, etc., and deal with crimes against property. Furthermore, disparities in property and power lead to relationships of subordination and the use of the labor of others to satisfy one’s increasingly complex and expanded desires. Gradually, a system of mutual dependence, a “system of needs,” develops, and along with the increasing division of labor there also develops class differentiations reflecting the types of labor or activity taken up by members of each class, which Hegel classifies into the agricultural, acquisitive, and administerial classes. However, despite relations of interdependence and cooperation the members of society experience social connections as a sort of blind fate without some larger system of control which is provided by the state which regulates the economic life of society. The details of the structure of the state are unclear in this essay, but what is clear is that for Hegel the state provides an increased rationality to social practices, much in the sense that the later German sociologist Max Weber (1864-1920) would articulate how social practices become more rational by being codified and made more predictable.
The manuscripts entitled Realphilosophie are based on lectures Hegel delivered at Jena University in 1803-04 (Realphilosophie I) and 1805-06 (Realphilosophie II), and were originally published by Johannes Hoffmeister in 1932. These writings cover much of the same ground as the System der Sittlichkeit in explicating a philosophy of mind and human experience in relation to human social and political development. Some of the noteworthy ideas in these writings are the role and significance of language for social consciousness, for giving expression to a people (Volk) and for the comprehending of and mastery of the world, and the necessity and consequences of the fragmentation of primordial social relationships and patterns as part of the process of human development. Also, there is a reiteration of the importance of property relations as crucial to social recognition and how there would be no security of property or recognition of property rights if society were to remain a mere multitude of families. Such security requires a system of control over the “struggle for recognition” through interpersonal norms, rules, and juridical authority provided by the nation state. Moreover, Hegel repeats the need for strong state regulation of the economy, which if left to its own workings is blind to the needs of the social community. The economy, especially through the division of labor, produces fragmentation and diminishment of human life (compare Marx on alienation) and the state must not only address this phenomenon but also provide the means for the people’s political participation to further the development of social self-consciousness. In all of this Hegel appears to be providing a philosophical account of modern developments both in terms of the tensions and conflicts that are new to modernity as well as in the progressive movements of reform found under the influence of Napoleon.
Finally, Hegel also discusses the forms of government, the three main types being tyranny, democracy, and hereditary monarchy. Tyranny is found typically in primitive or undeveloped states, democracy exists in states where there is the realization of individual identity but no split between the public and private person, and hereditary monarchy is the appropriate form of political authority in the modern world in providing strong central government along with a system of indirect representation through Estates. The relation of religion to the state is undeveloped in these writings, but Hegel is clear about the supereminent role of the state that stands above all else in giving expression to the Spirit (Geist) of a society in a sort of earthly kingdom of God, the realization of God in the world. True religion complements and supports this realization and thus cannot properly have supremacy over or be opposed to the state.
The Phenomenology of Spirit (Die Phänomenologie des Geistes), published in 1807, is Hegel’s first major comprehensive philosophical work. Originally intended to be the first part of his comprehensive system of science (Wissenschaft) or philosophy, Hegel eventually considered it to be the introduction to his system. This work provides what can be called a “biography of spirit,” i.e., an account of the development of consciousness and self-consciousness in the context of some central epistemological, anthropological and cultural themes of human history. It has continuity with the works discussed above in examining the development of the human mind in relation to human experience but is more wide-ranging in also addressing fundamental questions about the meaning of perceiving, knowing, and other cognitive activities as well as of the nature of reason and reality. Given the focus of this essay, the themes of the Phenomenology to be discussed here are those directly relevant to Hegel’s social and political thought.
One of the most widely discussed places in the Phenomenology is the chapter on “The Truth of Self-Certainty” which includes a subsection on “Independence and Dependence of Self-Consciousness: Lordship and Bondage.” This section treats of the (somewhat misleadingly named) “master/slave” struggle which is taken by some, especially the Marxian-inspired, as a paradigm of all forms of social conflict, in particular the struggle between social classes. It is clear that Hegel intended the scenario to typify certain features of the struggle for recognition (Anerkennung) overall, be it social, personal, etc. The conflict between master and slave (which shall be referred to hereafter as lord and bondsman as more in keeping with Hegel’s own terminology and the intended generic meaning) is one in which the historical themes of dominance and obedience, dependence and independence, etc., are philosophically introduced. Although this specific dialectic of struggle occurs only at the earliest stages of self-consciousness, it nonetheless sets up the main problematic for achieving realized self-consciousness–the gaining of self-recognition through the recognition of and by another, through mutual recognition.
According to Hegel, the relationship between self and otherness is the fundamental defining characteristic of human awareness and activity, being rooted as it is in the emotion of desire for objects as well as in the estrangement from those objects, which is part of the primordial human experience of the world. The otherness that consciousness experiences as a barrier to its goal is the external reality of the natural and social world, which prevents individual consciousness from becoming free and independent. However, that otherness cannot be abolished or destroyed, without destroying oneself, and so ideally there must be reconciliation between self and other such that consciousness can “universalize” itself through the other. In the relation of dominance and subservience between two consciousnesses, say lord and bondsman, the basic problem for consciousness is the overcoming of its otherness, or put positively, the achieving of integration with itself. The relation between lord and bondsman leads to a sort of provisional, incomplete resolution of the struggle for recognition between distinct consciousnesses.
Hegel asks us to consider how a struggle between two distinct consciousnesses, let us say a violent “life-or-death” struggle, would lead to one consciousness surrendering and submitting to the other out of fear of death. Initially, the consciousness that becomes lord or master proves its freedom through willingness to risk its life and not submit to the other out of fear of death, and thus not identify simply with its desire for life and physical being. Moreover, this consciousness is given acknowledgement of its freedom through the submission and dependence of the other, which turns out paradoxically to be a deficient recognition in that the dominant one fails to see a reflection of itself in the subservient one. Adequate recognition requires a mirroring of the self through the other, which means that to be successful it must be mutual. In the ensuing relationship of lordship and bondage, furthermore, the bondsman through work and discipline (motivated by fear of dying at the hands of the master or lord) transforms his subservience into a mastery over his environment, and thus achieves a measure of independence. In objectifying himself in his environment through his labor the bondsman in effect realizes himself, with his transformed environment serving as a reflection of his inherently self-realizing activity. Thus, the bondsman gains a measure of independence in his subjugation out of fear of death. In a way, the lord represents death as the absolute subjugator, since it is through fear of this master, of the death that he can impose, that the bondsman in his acquiescence and subservience is placed into a social context of work and discipline. Yet despite, or more properly, because of this subjection the bondsman is able to attain a measure of independence by internalizing and overcoming those limitations which must be dealt with if he is to produce efficiently. However, this accomplishment, the self-determination of the bondsman, is limited and incomplete because of the asymmetry that remains in his relation to the lord. Self-consciousness is still fragmented, i.e., the objectification through labor that the bondsman experiences does not coincide with the consciousness of the lord whose sense of self is not through labor but through power over the bondsman and enjoyment of the fruits of the bondsman’s labor. Only in a realm of ethical life can self-determination be fully self-conscious to the extent that universal freedom is reflected in the life of each individual member of society.
Thus, in the Phenomenology consciousness must move on through the phases of Stoicism, Skepticism, and the Unhappy Consciousness before engaging in the self-articulation of Reason, and it is not until the section “Objective Spirit: The Ethical Order” that the full universalization of self-consciousness is in principle to be met with. Here we find a shape of human existence where all men work freely, serving the needs of the whole community rather than of masters, and subject only to the “discipline of reason.” This mode of ethical life, typified in ancient Greek democracy, also eventually disintegrates, as is expressed in the conflict between human and divine law and the tragic fate that is the outcome of this conflict illustrated in the story of Antigone. However, the ethical life described here is still in its immediacy and is therefore at a level of abstractness that falls short of the mediation of subjectivity and universality which is provided spiritually in revealed Christianity and politically in the modern state, which purportedly provides a solution to human conflict arising from the struggle for recognition. In any case, the rest of the Phenomenology is devoted to examinations of culture (including enlightenment and revolution), morality, religion, and finally, Absolute Knowing.
The dialectic of self-determination is, for Hegel, inherent in the very structure of freedom, and is the defining feature of Spirit (Geist). The full actualization of Spirit in the human community requires the progressive development of individuality which effectively begins with the realization in self-consciousness of the “truth of self-certainty” and culminates in the shape of a shared common life in an integrated community of love and Reason, based upon the realization of truths of incarnation, death, resurrection, and forgiveness as grasped in speculative Religion. The articulation Hegel provides in the Phenomenology, however, is very generic and is to be made concrete politically with the working out of a specific conception of the modern nation-state with its particular configuration of social and political institutions. It is to the latter that we must turn in order to see how these fundamental dialectical considerations take shape in the “solution” to the struggle for recognition in self-consciousness. However, before moving directly to Hegel’s theory of the state, and history, some discussion of his Logic is in order.
The Logic constitutes the first part of Hegel’s philosophical system as presented in his Encyclopedia. It was preceded by his larger work, The Science of Logic (Wissenschaft der Logik), published in 1812-16 in two volumes. The “Encyclopedia Logic” is a shorter version intended to function as part of an “outline,” but it became longer in the course of the three published versions of 1817, 1827, and 1830. Also, the English translation by William Wallace contains additions from the notes of students who heard Hegel’s lectures on this subject. (Reference to the paragraphs of the Encyclopedia will be made with the “¶” character.)
The structure of the Logic is triadic, reflecting the organization of the larger system of philosophy as well as a variety of other motifs, both internal and external to the Logic proper. The Logic has three divisions: the Doctrine of Being, the Doctrine of Essence, and the Doctrine of the Notion (or Concept). There are a number of logical categories in this work that are directly relevant to social and political theorizing. In the Doctrine of Being, for example, Hegel explains the concept of “being-for-self” as the function of self-relatedness in the resolving of opposition between self and other in the “ideality of the finite” (¶ 95-96). He claims that the task of philosophy is to bring out the ideality of the finite, and as will be seen later Hegel’s philosophy of the state is intended to articulate the ideality of the state, i.e., its affirmative and infinite or rational features. In the Doctrine of Essence, Hegel explains the categories of actuality and freedom. He says that actuality is the unity of “essence and existence” (¶ 142) and argues that this does not rule out the actuality of ideas for they become actual by being realized in external existence. Hegel will have related points to make about the actuality of the idea of the state in society and history. Also, he defines freedom not in terms of contingency or lack of determination, as is popular, but rather as the “truth of necessity,” i.e., freedom presupposes necessity in the sense that reciprocal action and reaction provide a structure for free action, e.g., a necessary relation between crime and punishment.
The Doctrine of the Notion (Begriff) is perhaps the most relevant section of the Logic to social and political theory due to its focus on the various dynamics of development. This section is subdivided into three parts: the subjective notion, the objective notion, and the idea which articulates the unity of subjective and objective. The first part, the subjective notion, contains three “moments” or functional parts: universality, particularity, and individuality (¶ 163ff). These are particularly important as Hegel will show how the functional parts of the state operate according to a progressive “dialectical” movement from the first to the third moments and how the state as a whole, as a functioning and integrated totality, gives expression to the concept of individuality (in ¶198 Hegel refers to the state as “a system of three syllogisms”). Hegel treats these relationships as logical judgments and syllogisms but they do not merely articulate how the mind must operate (subjectivity) but also explain actual relationships in reality (objectivity). In objective reality we find these logical/dialectical relationships in mechanism, chemism, and teleology. Finally, in the Idea, the correspondence of the notion or concept with objective reality, we have the truth of objects or objects as they ought to be, i.e., as they correspond to their proper concepts. The logical articulation of the Idea is very important to Hegel’s explanation of the Idea of the state in modern history, for this provides the principles of rationality that guide the development of Spirit in the world and that become manifested in various ways in social and political life.
In 1821, Hegel’s Philosophy of Right orginally appeared under the double title Naturrecht und Staatswissenschaften in Grundrisse; Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts (Natural Law and the Science of the State; Elements of the Philosophy of Right). The work was republished by Eduard Gans in 1833 and 1854 as part of Hegel’s Werke, vol. viii and included additions from notes taken by students at Hegel’s lectures. The English language translation of this work by T. M. Knox refers to these later editions as well as to an edition published in 1923 by Georg Lasson, which included corrections from previous editions.
The Philosophy of Right constitutes, along with Hegel’s Philosophy of History, the penultimate section of his Encyclopedia, the section on Objective Spirit, which deals with the human world and its array of social rules and institutions, including the moral, legal, religious, economic, and political as well as marriage, the family, social classes, and other forms of human organization. The German word Recht is often translated as ‘law’, however, Hegel clearly intends the term to have a broader meaning that captures what we might call the good or just society, one that is “rightful” in its structure, composition, and practices.
In the Introduction to this work Hegel explains the concept of his philosophical undertaking along with the specific key concepts of will, freedom, and right. At the very beginning, Hegel states that the Idea of right, the concept together with its actualization, is the proper subject of the philosophical science of right (¶ 1). Hegel is emphatic that the study is scientific in that it deals in a systematic way with something essentially rational. He further remarks that the basis of scientific procedure in a philosophy of right is explicated in philosophical logic and presupposed by the former (¶ 2). Furthermore, Hegel is at pains to distinguish the historical or legal approach to “positive law” (Gesetz) and the philosophical approach to the Idea of right (Recht), the former involving mere description and compilation of laws as legal facts while the latter probes into the inner meaning and necessary determinations of law or right. For Hegel the justification of something, the finding of its inherent rationality, is not a matter of seeking its origins or longstanding features but rather of studying it conceptually.
However, there is one sense in which the origin of right is relevant to philosophical science and this is the free will. The free will is the basis and origin of right in the sense that mind or spirit (Geist) generally objectifies itself in a system of right (human social and political institutions) that gives expression to freedom, which Hegel says is both the substance and goal of right (¶ 4). This ethical life in the state consists in the unity of the universal and the subjective will. The universal will is contained in the Idea of freedom as its essence, but when considered apart from the subjective will can be thought of only abstractly or indeterminately. Considered apart from the subjective or particular will, the universal will is “the element of pure indeterminacy or that pure reflection of the ego into itself which involves the dissipation of every restriction and every content either immediately presented by nature, by needs, desires, and impulses, or given and determined by any means whatever” (¶ 5). In other words, the universal will is that moment in the Idea of freedom where willing is thought of as state of absolutely unrestrained volition, unfettered by any particular circumstances or limitations whatsoever–the pure form of willing. This is expressed in the modern libertarian view of completely uncoerced choice, the absence of restraint (or “negative liberty” as understood by Thomas Hobbes). The subjective will, on the other hand, is the principle of activity and realization that involves “differentiation, determination, and positing of a determinacy as a content and object” (¶ 6). This means that the will is not merely unrestrained in acting but that it actually can give expression to the doing or accomplishing of certain things, e.g., through talent or expertise (sometimes called “positive freedom”). The unity of both the moments of abstract universality (the will in-itself) and subjectivity or particularity (the will for-itself) is the concrete universal or true individuality (the will in-and-for-itself). According to Hegel, preservation of the distinction of these two moments in the unity (identity-in-difference) between universal and particular will is what produces rational self-determination of an ego, as well as the self-consciousness of the state as a whole. Hegel’s conception of freedom as self-determination is just this unity in difference of the universal and subjective will, be it in the willing by individual persons or in the expressions of will by groups of individuals or collectivities. The “negative self-relation” of this freedom involves the subordination of the natural instincts, impulses, and desires to conscious reflection and to goals and purposes that are consciously chosen and that require commitment to rational principles in order to properly guide action.
The overall structure of the Philosophy of Right is quite remarkable in its “syllogistic” organization. The main division of the work corresponds to what Hegel calls the stages in the development of “the Idea of the absolutely free will,” and these are Abstract Right, Morality, and Ethical Life. Each of these divisions is further subdivided triadically: under Abstract Right there is Property, Contract, and Wrong; under Morality falls Purpose and Responsibility, Intention and Welfare, and Good and Conscience; finally, under Ethical Life comes the Family, Civil Society, and the State. These last subdivisions are further subdivided into triads, with fourth level subdivisions occurring under Civil Society and the State. This triadic system of rubrics is no mere description of a static model of social and political life. Hegel claims that it gives expression to the conceptual development of Spirit in human society based upon the purely logical development of rationality provided in his Logic. Thus, it is speculatively based and not derivable from empirical survey, although the particularities of the system do indeed correspond to our experience and what we know about ourselves anthropologically, culturally, etc.
The transition in the Logic from universality to particularity to individuality (or concrete universality) is expressed in the social and political context in the conceptual transition from Abstract Right to Morality to Ethical Life. In the realm of Abstract Right, the will remains in its immediacy as an abstract universal that is expressed in personality and in the universal right to possession of external things in property. In the realm of Morality, the will is no longer merely “in-itself,” or restricted to the specific characteristics of legal personality, but becomes free “for-itself,” i.e., it is will reflected into itself so as to produce a self-consciousness of the will’s infinity. The will is expressed, initially, in inner conviction and subsequently in purpose, intention, and conviction. As opposed to the merely juridical person, the moral agent places primary value on subjective recognition of principles or ideals that stand higher than positive law. At this stage, universality of a higher moral law is viewed as something inherently different from subjectivity, from the will’s inward convictions and actions, and so in its isolation from a system of objectively recognized legal rules the willing subject remains “abstract, restricted, and formal” (¶ 108). Because the subject is intrinsically a social being who needs association with others in order to institutionalize the universal maxims of morality, maxims that cover all people, it is only in the realm of Ethical Life that the universal and the subjective will come into a unity through the objectification of the will in the institutions of the Family, Civil Society, and the State.
In what follows, we trace through Hegel’s systematic development of the “stages of the will,” highlighting only the most important points as necessary to get an overall view of this work.
The subject of Abstract Right (Recht) is the person as the bearer or holder of individual rights. Hegel claims that this focus on the right of personality, while significant in distinguishing persons from mere things, is abstract and without content, a simple relation of the will to itself. The imperative of right is: “Be a person and respect others as persons” (¶ 36). In this formal conception of right, there is no question of particular interests, advantages, motives or intentions, but only the mere idea of the possibility of choosing based on the having of permission, as long as one does not infringe on the right of other persons. Because of the possibilities of infringement, the positive form of commands in this sphere are prohibitions.
(1) Property (the universality of will as embodied in things)
A person must translate his or her freedom into the external world “in order to exist as Idea” (¶ 41), thus abstract right manifests itself in the absolute right of appropriation over all things. Property is the category through which one becomes an object to oneself in that one actualizes the will through possession of something external. Property is the embodiment of personality and of freedom. Not only can a person put his or her will into something external through the taking possession of it and of using it, but one can also alienate property or yield it to the will of another, including the ability to labor for a restricted period of time. One’s personality is inalienable and one’s right to personality imprescriptible. This means one cannot alienate all of one’s labor time without becoming the property of another.
(2) Contract (the positing of explicit universality of will)
In this sphere, we have a relation of will to will, i.e., one holds property not merely by means of the subjective will externalized in a thing, but by means of another’s person’s will, and implicitly by virtue of one’s participation in a common will. The status of being an independent owner of something from which one excludes the will of another is thus mediated in the identification of one’s will with the other in the contractual relation, which presupposes that the contracting parties “recognize each other as persons and property owners” (¶ 71). (Note the significant development here beyond the dialectic of lord and bondsman.) Moreover, when contract involves the alienation or giving up of property, the external thing is now an explicit embodiment of the unity of wills. In contractual relations of exchange, what remains identical as the property of the individuals is its value, in respect to which the parties to the contract are on an equal footing, regardless of the qualitative external differences between the things exchanged. “Value is the universal in which the subjects of the contract participate” (¶ 77).
(3) Wrong (the particular will opposing itself to the universal)
In immediate relations of persons to one another it is possible for a particular will to be at variance with the universal through arbitrariness of decision and contingency of circumstance, and so the appearance (Erscheinung) of right takes on the character of a show (Schein), which is the inessential, arbitrary, posing as the essential. If the “show” is only implicit and not explicit also, i.e., if the wrong passes in the doer’s eyes as right, the wrong is non-malicious. In fraud a show is made to deceive the other party and so in the doer’s eyes the right asserted is only a show. Crime is wrong both in itself and from the doer’s point of view, such that wrong is willed without even the pretense or show of right. Here the form of acting does not imply a recognition of right but rather is an act of coercion through exercise of force. It is a “negatively infinite judgement” in that it asserts a denial of rights to the victim, which is not only incompatible with the fact of the matter but also self-negating in denying its own capacity for rights in principle.
The penalty that falls on the criminal is not merely just but is “a right established within the criminal himself, i.e., in his objectively embodied will, in his action,” because the crime as the action of a rational being implies appeal to a universal standard recognized by the criminal (¶ 100). The annulling of crime in this sphere of immediate right occurs first as revenge, which as retributive is just in its content, but in its form it is an act of a subjective will and does not correspond with its universal content and hence as a new transgression is defective and contradictory (¶ 102). All crimes are comparable in their universal property of being injuries, thus, in a sense it is not something personal but the concept itself which carries out retribution.
Crime, as the will which is implicitly null, contains its negation in itself, which is its punishment.
The nullity of crime is that it has set aside right as such, but since right is absolute it cannot be set aside. Thus, the act of crime is not something positive, not a first thing, but is something negative, and punishment is the negation of crime’s negation.
The demand for justice as punishment rather than as revenge, with regard to wrong, implies the demand for a will which, though particular and subjective, also wills the universal as such. In wrong the will has become aware of itself as particular and has opposed itself to and contradicted the universal embodied in rights. At this stage the universally right is abstract and one-sided and thus requires a move to a higher level of self-consciousness where the universally right is mediated by the particular convictions of the willing subject. We go beyond the criminal’s defiance of the universal by substituting for the abstract conception of personality the more concrete conception of subjectivity. The criminal is now viewed as breaking his own law, and his crime is a self-contradiction and not only a contradiction of a right outside him. This recognition brings us to the level of morality (Moralität) where the will is free both in itself and for itself, i.e., the will is self-conscious of its subjective freedom.
At the level of morality the right of the subjective will is embodied in immediate wills (as opposed to immediate things like property). The defect of this level, however, is that the subject is only for itself, i.e., one is conscious of one’s subjectivity and independence but is conscious of universality only as something different from this subjectivity. Therefore, the identity of the particular will and the universal will is only implicit and the moral point of view is that of a relation of “ought-to-be,” or the demand for what is right. While the moral will externalizes itself in action, its self-determination is a pure “restlessness” of activity that never arrives at actualization.
The right of the moral will has three aspects. First, there is the right of the will to act in its external environment, to recognize as its actions only those that it has consciously willed in light of an aim or purpose (purpose and responsibility). Second, in my intention I ought to be aware not simply of my particular action but also of the universal which is conjoined with it. The universal is what I have willed and is my intention. The right of intention is that the universal quality of the action is not merely implied but is known by the agent, and so it lies from the start in one’s subjective will. Moreover, the content of such a will is not only the right of the particular subject to be satisfied but is elevated to a universal end, the end of welfare or happiness (intention and welfare). The welfare of many unspecified persons is thus also an essential end and right of subjectivity. However, right as an abstract universal and welfare as abstract particularity, may collide, since both are contingent on circumstances for their satisfaction, e.g., in cases where claims of right or welfare by someone may endanger the life of another there can be a counter-claim to a right of distress. “This distress reveals the finitude and therefore the contingency of both right and welfare” (¶ 128). This “contradiction” between right and welfare is overcome in the third aspect of the moral will, the good which is “the Idea as the unity of the concept of the will with the particular will” (¶ 129).
In addition to the right of the subjective will that whatever it recognizes as valid shall be seen by it as good, and that an action shall be imputed to it as good or evil in accordance with its knowledge of the worth which the action has in its external objectivity (¶ 132), which together constitute a “right of insight,” the will also must recognize the good as its duty, which is, to begin with, duty for duty’s sake, or duty formally and without content (e.g., as expressed in the Kantian “categorical imperative”). Because of this lack of content, the subjective will in its abstract reflection into itself is “absolute inward certainty (Gewißheit) of self,” or conscience (Gewissen). While true or authentic conscience is the disposition to will what is absolutely good, and thus correspond with what is objectively right, purely formal conscience lacks an objective system of principles and duties. Although conscience is ideally supposed to mean the identity of subjective knowing and willing with the truly good, when it remains the subjective inner reflection of self-consciousness into itself its claim to this identity is deficient and one-sided. Moreover, when the determinate character of right and duty reduces to subjectivity, the mere inwardness of the will, there is the potentiality of elevating the self-will of particular individuals above the universal itself, i.e., of “slipping into evil” (¶ 139). What makes a person evil is the choosing of natural desires in opposition to the good, i.e., to the concept of the will. When an individual attempts to pass off his or her action as good, and thus imposing it on others, while being aware of the discrepancy between its negative character and the objective universal good, the person falls into hypocrisy. This is one of several forms of perverse moral subjectivity that Hegel discusses at length in his remarks (¶ 140).
Hegel’s analysis of the moral implications of “good and conscience” leads to the conclusion that a concrete unity of the objective good with the subjectivity of the will cannot be achieved at the level of personal morality since all attempts at this are problematic. The concrete identity of the good with the subjective will occurs only in moving to the level of ethical life (Sittlichkeit), which Hegel says is “the Idea of freedom…the concept of freedom developed into the existing world and the nature of self-consciousness” (¶ 142). Thus, ethical life is permeated with both objectivity and subjectivity: regarded objectively it is the state and its institutions, whose force (unlike abstract right) depends entirely on the self-consciousness of citizens, on their subjective freedom; regarded subjectively it is the ethical will of the individual which (unlike the moral will) is aware of objective duties that express one’s inner sense of universality. The rationality of the ethical order of society is thus constituted in the synthesis of the concept of the will, both as universal and as particular, with its embodiment in institutional life.
The synthesis of ethical life means that individuals not only act in conformity with the ethical good but that they recognize the authority of ethical laws. This authority is not something alien to individuals since they are linked to the ethical order through a strong identification which Hegel says “is more like an identity than even the relation of faith or trust” (¶ 147). The knowledge of how the laws and institutions of society are binding on the will of individuals entails a “doctrine of duties.” In duty the individual finds liberation both from dependence on mere natural impulse, which may or may not motivate ethical actions, and from indeterminate subjectivity which cannot produce a clear view of proper action. “In duty the individual acquires his substantive freedom” (¶ 149). In the performance of duty the individual exhibits virtue when the ethical order is reflected in his or her character, and when this is done by simple conformity with one’s duties it is rectitude. When individuals are simply identified with the actual ethical order such that their ethical practices are habitual and second nature, ethical life appears in their general mode of conduct as custom (Sitten). Thus, the ethical order manifests its right and validity vis-à-vis individuals. In duty “the self-will of the individual vanishes together with his private conscience which had claimed independence and opposed itself to the ethical substance. For when his character is ethical, he recognizes as the end which moves him to act the universal which is itself unmoved but is disclosed in its specific determinations as rationality actualized. He knows that his own dignity and the whole stability of his particular ends are grounded in this same universal, and it is therein that he actually attains these” (¶ 152). However, this does not deny the right of subjectivity, i.e., the right of individuals to be satisfied in their particular pursuits and free activity; but this right is realized only in belonging to an objective ethical order. The “bond of duty” will be seen as a restriction on the particular individual only if the self-will of subjective freedom is considered in the abstract, apart from an ethical order (as is the case for both Abstract Right and Morality). “Hence, in this identity of the universal will with the particular will, right and duty coalesce, and by being in the ethical order a man has rights in so far as he has duties, and duties in so far as he has rights” (¶ 155).
In the realm of ethical life the logical syllogism of self-determination of the Idea is most clearly applied. The moments of universality, particularity, and individuality initially are represented respectively in the institutions of the family, civil society, and the state. The family is “ethical mind in its natural or immediate phase” and is characterized by love or the feeling of unity in which one is not conscious of oneself as an independent person but only as a member of the family unit to which one is bound. Civil society, on the other hand, comprises an association of individuals considered as self-subsistent and who have no conscious sense of unity of membership but only pursue self-interest, e.g., in satisfying needs, acquiring and protecting property, and in joining organizations for mutual advantage. Finally, the constitution of the political state brings together in a unity the sense of the importance of the whole or universal good along with the freedom of particularity of individual pursuits and thus is “the end and actuality of both the substantial order and the public life devoted thereto” (¶ 157).
The family is characterized by love which is “mind’s feeling of its own unity,” where one’s sense of individuality is within this unity, not as an independent individual but as a member essentially related to the other family members. Thus, familial love implies a contradiction between, on the one hand, not wanting to be a self-subsistent and independent person if that means feeling incomplete and, on the other hand, wanting to be recognized in another person. Familial love is truly an ethical unity, but because it is nonetheless a subjective feeling it is limited in sustaining unity (pars. 158-59, and additions).
The union of man and woman in marriage is both natural and spiritual, i.e., is a physical relationship and one that is also self-conscious, and it is entered into on the basis of the free consent of the persons. Since this consent involves bringing two persons into a union, there is the mutual surrender of their natural individuality for the sake of union, which is both a self-restriction and also a liberation because in this way individuals attain a higher self-consciousness.
(B) Family Capital
The family as a unit has its external existence in property, specifically capital (Vermögen) which constitutes permanent and secured possessions that allow for endurance of the family as “person” (¶ 170). This capital is the common property of all the family members, none of whom possess property of their own, but it is administered by the head of the family, the husband.
(C) Education of Children & Dissolution of the Family
Children provide the external and objective basis for the unity of marriage. The love of the parents for their children is the explicit expression of their love for each other, while their immediate feelings of love for each other are only subjective. Children have the right to maintenance and education, and in this regard a claim upon the family capital, but parents have the right to provide this service to the children and to instill discipline over the wishes of their children. The education of children has a twofold purpose: the positive aim of instilling ethical principles in them in the form of immediate feeling and the negative one of raising them out of the instinctive physical level. Marriage can be dissolved not by whim but by duly constituted authority when there is total estrangement of husband and wife. The ethical dissolution of the family results when the children have been educated to be free and responsible persons and they are of mature age under the law. The natural dissolution of the family occurs with the death of the parents, the result of which is the passing of inheritance of property to the surviving family members. The disintegration of the family exhibits its immediacy and contingency as an expression of the ethical Idea (pars. 173-80).
With civil society (bürgerliche Gesellschaft) we move from the family or “the ethical idea still in its concept,” where consciousness of the whole or totality is focal, to the “determination of particularity,” where the satisfaction of subjective needs and desires is given free reign (pars. 181-182). However, despite the pursuit of private or selfish ends in relatively unrestricted social and economic activity, universality is implicit in the differentiation of particular needs insofar as the welfare of an individual in society is intrinsically bound up with that of others, since each requires another in some way to effectively engage in reciprocal activities like commerce, trade, etc. Because this system of interdependence is not self-conscious but exists only in abstraction from the individual pursuit of need satisfaction, here particularity and universality are only externally related. Hegel says that “this system may be prima facie regarded as the external state, the state based on need, the state as the Understanding (Verstand) envisages it” (¶ 183). However, civil society is also a realm of mediation of particular wills through social interaction and a means whereby individuals are educated (Bildung) through their efforts and struggles toward a higher universal consciousness.
(A) The System of Needs
This dimension of civil society involves the pursuit of need satisfaction. Humans are different from animals in their ability to multiply needs and differentiate them in various ways, which leads to their refinement and luxury. Political economy discovers the necessary interconnections in the social and universalistic side of need. Work is the mode of acquisition and transformation of the means for satisfying needs as well as a mode of practical education in abilities and understanding. Work also reveals the way in which people are dependent upon one another in their self-seeking and how each individual contributes to the need satisfaction of all others. Society generates a “universal permanent capital” (¶ 199) that everyone in principle can draw upon, but the natural inequalities between individuals will translate into social inequalities. Furthermore, labor undergoes a division according to the complexities of the system of production, which is reflected in social class divisions: the agricultural (substantial or immediate); the business (reflecting or formal); and the civil servants (universal). Membership in a class is important for gaining status and recognition in a civil society. Hegel says that “A man actualizes himself only in becoming something definite, i.e., something specifically particularized; this means restricting himself exclusively to one of the particular spheres of need. In this class-system, the ethical frame of mind therefore is rectitude and esprit de corps, i.e., the disposition to make oneself a member of one of the moments of civil society by one’s own act … in this way gaining recognition both in one’s own eyes and in the eyes of others” (¶ 207).
The “substantial” agricultural class is based upon family relationships whose capital is in the products of nature, such as the land, and tends to be patriarchial, unreflective, and oriented toward dependence rather than free activity. In contrast to this focus on “immediacy,” the business class is oriented toward work and reflection, e.g., in transforming raw materials for use and exchange, which is a form of mediation of humans to one another. The main activities of the business class are craftsmanship, manufacture, and trade. The third class is the class of civil servants, which Hegel calls the “universal class” because it has the universal interests of society as its concern. Members of this class are relieved from having to labor to support themselves and maintain their livelihood either from private resources such as inheritance or are paid a salary by the state as members of the bureaucracy. These individuals tend to be highly educated and must qualify for appointment to government positions on the basis of merit.
(B) Administration of Justice
The principle of rightness becomes civil law (Gesetz) when it is posited, and in order to have binding force it must be given determinate objective existence. To be determinately existent, laws must be made universally known through a public legal code. Through a rational legal system, private property and personality are given legal recognition and validity in civil society, and wrongdoing now becomes an infringement, not merely of the subjective right of individuals but also of the larger universal will that exists in ethical life. The court of justice is the means whereby right is vindicated as something universal by addressing particular cases of violation or conflict without mere subjective feeling or private bias. “Instead of the injured party, the injured universal now comes on the scene, and … this pursuit consequently ceases to be the subjective and contingent retribution of revenge and is transformed into the genuine reconciliation of right with itself, i.e, into punishment” (¶ 220). Moreover, court proceedings and legal processes must take place according to rights and rules of evidence; judicial proceedings as well as the laws themselves must be made public; trial should be by jury; and punishment should fit the crime. Finally, in the administration of justice, “civil society returns to its concept, to the unity of the implicit universal with the subjective particular, although here the latter is only that present in single cases and the universality in question is that of abstract right” (¶ 229).
(C) The Police and the Corporation
The Police (Polizei) for Hegel is understood broadly as the public authorities in civil society. In addition to crime fighting organizations, it includes agencies that provide oversight over public utilities as well as regulation of and, when necessary, intervention into activities related to the production, distribution, and sale of goods and services, or with any of the contingencies that can affect the rights and welfare of individuals and society generally (e.g., defense of the public’s right not to be defrauded, and also the management of goods inspection). Also, the public authority superintends education and organizes the relief of poverty. Poverty must be addressed both through private charity and public assistance since in civil society it constitutes a social wrong when poverty results in the creation of a class of “penurious rabble” (¶ 245). Society looks to colonization to increase its wealth but poverty remains a problem with no apparent solution.
The corporation (Korporation) applies especially to the business class, since this class is concentrated on the particularities of social existence and the corporation has the function of bringing implicit similarities between various private interests into explicit existence in forms of association. This is not the same as our contemporary business corporation but rather is a voluntary association of persons based on occupational or various social interests (such as professional and trade guilds, educational clubs, religious societies, townships, etc.) Because of the integrating function of the corporation, especially in regard to the social and economic division of labor, what appear as selfish purposes in civil society are shown to be at the same time universal through the formation of concretely recognized commonalities. Hegel says that “a Corporation has the right, under the surveillance of the public authority, (a) to look after its own interests within its own sphere, (b) to co-opt members, qualified objectively by requisite skill and rectitude, to a number fixed by the general structure of society, (c) to protect its members against particular contingencies, (d) to provide the education requisite to fit other to become members. In short, the right is to come on the scene like a second family for its members …” (¶ 252). Furthermore, the family is assured greater stability of livelihood insofar as its providers are corporation members who command the respect due to them in their social positions. “Unless he is a member of an authorized Corporation (and it is only by being authorized that an association becomes a Corporation), an individual is without rank or dignity, his isolation reduces his business to mere self-seeking, and his livelihood and satisfaction become insecure” (¶ 253). Because individual self-seeking is raised to a higher level of common pursuits, albeit restricted to the interest of a sectional group, individual self-consciousness is raised to relative universality. Hence, “As the family was the first, so the Corporation is the second ethical root of the state, the one planted in civil society” (¶ 255).
The political State, as the third moment of Ethical Life, provides a synthesis between the principles governing the Family and those governing Civil Society. The rationality of the state is located in the realization of the universal substantial will in the self-consciousness of particular individuals elevated to consciousness of universality. Freedom becomes explicit and objective in this sphere. “Since the state is mind objectified, it is only as one of its members that the individual has objectivity, genuine individuality, and an ethical life … and the individual’s destiny is the living of a universal life” (¶ 258). Rationality is concrete in the state in so far as its content is comprised in the unity of objective freedom (freedom of the universal or substantial will) and subjective freedom (freedom of everyone in knowing and willing of particular ends); and in its form rationality is in self-determining action or laws and principles which are logical universal thoughts (as in the logical syllogism).
The Idea of the State is itself divided into three moments: (a) the immediate actuality of the state as a self-dependent organism, or Constitutional Law; (b) the relation of states to other states in International Law; (c) the universal Idea as Mind or Spirit which gives itself actuality in the process of World-History.
(1) The Constitution (internally)
Only through the political constitution of the State can universality and particularity be welded together into a real unity. The self-consciousness of this unity is expressed in the recognition on the part of each citizen that the full meaning of one’s actual freedom is found in the objective laws and institutions provided by the State. The aspect of identity comes to the fore in the recognition that individual citizens give to the ethical laws such that they “do not live as private persons for their own ends alone, but in the very act of willing these they will the universal in the light of the universal, and their activity is consciously aimed at none but the universal end” (¶ 260). The aspect of differentiation, on the other hand, is found in “the right of individuals to their particular satisfaction,” the right of subjective freedom which is maintained in Civil Society. Thus, according to Hegel, “the universal must be furthered, but subjectivity on the other hand must attain its full and living development. It is only when both these moments subsist in their strength that the state can be regarded as articulated and genuinely organized” (¶ 260, addition).
As was indicated in the introduction to the concept of Ethical Life above, the higher authority of the laws and institutions of society requires a doctrine of duties. From the vantage point of the political State, this means that there must be a correlation between rights and duties. “In the state, as something ethical, as the inter-penetration of the substantive and the particular, my obligation to what is substantive is at the same time the embodiment of my particular freedom. This means that in the state duty and right are united in one and the same relation” (¶ 261). In fulfilling one’s duties one is also satisfying particular interests, and the conviction that this is so Hegel calls “political sentiment” (politische Gesinnung) or patriotism. “This sentiment is, in general, trust (which may pass over into a greater or lesser degree of educated insight), or the consciousness that my interest, both substantive and particular, is contained and preserved in another’s (that is, the state’s) interest and end, i.e., in the other’s relation to me as an individual” (¶ 268).
Thus, the “bond of duty” cannot involve being coerced into obeying the laws of the State. “Commonplace thinking often has the impression that force holds the state together, but in fact its only bond is the sense of order which everybody possesses” (¶ 268, addition).
According to Hegel, the political state is rational in so far as it inwardly differentiates itself according to the nature of the Concept (Begriff). The principle of the division of powers expresses inner differentiation, but while these powers are distinguished they must also be built into an organic whole such that each contains in itself the other moments so that the political constitution is a concrete unity in difference. Constitutional Law is accordingly divided into three moments: (a) the Legislature which establishes the universal through lawmaking; (b) the Executive which subsumes the particular under the universal through administering the laws; (c) the Crown which is the power of subjectivity of the state in the providing of the act of “ultimate decision” and thus forming into unity the other two powers. Despite the syllogistic sequence of universality, particularity, and individuality in these three constitutional powers, Hegel discusses the Crown first followed by the Executive and the Legislature respectively. Hegel understands the concept of the Crown in terms of constitutional monarchy.
(a) The Crown
“The power of the crown contains in itself the three moments of the whole, namely, (a) the universality of the constitution and the laws; (b) counsel, which refers the particular to the universal; and (g) the moment of ultimate decision, as the self-determination to which everything else reverts and from which everything else derives the beginning of its actuality” (¶ 275). The third moment is what gives expression to the sovereignty of the state, i.e., that the various activities, agencies, functions and powers of the state are not self-subsistent but rather have their basis ultimately in the unity of the state as a single self or self-organized organic whole. The monarch is the bearer of the individuality of the state and its sovereignty is the ideality in unity in which the particular functions and powers of the state subsist. “It is only as a person, the monarch, that the personality of the state is actual. Personality expresses the concept as such; but the person enshrines the actuality of the concept, and only when the concept is determined as a person is it the Idea or truth” (¶ 279).
The monarch is not a despot but rather a constitutional monarch, and he does not act in a capricious manner but is bound by a decision-making process, in particular to the recommendations and decisions of his cabinet (supreme advisory council). The monarch functions solely to give agency to the state, and so his personal traits are irrelevant and his ascending to the throne is based on hereditary succession, and thus on the accident of birth. “In a completely organized state, it is only a question of the culminating point of formal decision … he has only to say ‘yes’ and dot the ‘i’ …. In a well organized monarchy, the objective aspect belongs to law alone, and the monarch’s part is merely to set to the law the subjective ‘I will’” (¶ 280, addition). The “majesty of the monarch” lies in the free asserting of ‘I will’ as an expression of the unity of the state and the final step in establishing law.
(b) The Executive
The executive has the task of executing and applying the decisions formally made by the monarch. “This task of merely subsuming the particular under the universal is comprised in the executive power, which also includes the powers of the judiciary and the police” (¶ 287). Also, the executive is the higher authority that oversees the filling of positions of responsibilities in corporations. The executive is comprised of the civil servants proper and the higher advisory officials organized into committees, both of which are connected to the monarch through their supreme departmental heads. Overall, government has its division of labor into various centers of administration managed by special officials. Individuals are appointed to executive functions on the basis of their knowledgibility and proof of ability and tenure is conditional on the fulfillment of duties, with the offices in the civil service being open to all citizens.
The executive is not an unchecked bureaucratic authority. “The security of the state and its subjects against the misuse of power by ministers and their officials lies directly in their hierarchical organization and their answerability; but it lies too in the authority given to societies and corporations …” (¶ 295). However, civil servants will tend to be dispassionate, upright, and polite in part as “a result of direct education in thought and ethical conduct” (¶ 296). Civil servants and the members of the executive make up the largest section of the middle class, the class with a highly developed intelligence and consciousness of right. Moreover, “The sovereign working on the middle class at the top, and Corporation-rights working on it at the bottom, are the institutions which effectively prevent it from acquiring the isolated position of an aristocracy and using its education and skill as a means to an arbitrary tyranny” (¶ 297).
(c) The Legislature
For Hegel, “The legislature is concerned (a) with the laws as such in so far as they require fresh and extended determination; and (b) with the content of home affairs affecting the entire state” (¶ 298). Legislative activity focuses on both providing well-being and happiness for citizens as well as exacting services from them (largely in the form of monetary taxes). The proper function of legislation is distinguished from the function of administration and state regulation in that the content of the former are determinate laws that are wholly universal whereas in administration it is application of the law to particulars, along with enforcing the law. Hegel also says that the other two moments of the political constitution, the monarchy and the executive, are the first two moments of the legislature, i.e., are reflected in the legislature respectively through the ultimate decision regarding proposed laws and an advising function in their formation. Hegel rejects the idea of independence or separation of powers for the sake of checks and balances, which he holds destroys the unity of the state (¶ 300, addition). The third moment in the legislature is the estates (Stände), which are the classes of society given political recognition in the legislature.
In the legislature, the estates “have the function of bringing public affairs into existence not only implicitly, but also actually, i.e., of bringing into existence the moment of subjective formal freedom, the public consciousness as an empirical universal, of which the thoughts and opinions of the Many are particulars” (¶ 301). Not only do the estates guarantee the general welfare and public freedom, but they are also the means by which the state as a whole enters the subjective consciousness of the people through their participation in the state. Thus, the estates incorporate the private judgment and will of individuals in civil society and give it political significance.
The estates have an important integrating function in the state overall. “Regarded as a mediating organ, the Estates stand between the government in general on the one hand, and the nation broken up into particulars (people and associations) on the other. … [I]n common with the organized executive, they are a middle term preventing both the extreme isolation of the power of the crown … and also the isolation of the particular interests of persons, societies and Corporations” (¶ 302). Also, the organizing function of the estates prevents groups in society from becoming formless masses that could form anti-government feelings and rise up in blocs in opposition to the state.
The three classes of civil society, the agricultural, the business, and the universal class of civil servants, are each given political voice in the Estates Assembly in accordance with their distinctiveness in the lower spheres of civil life. The legislature is divided into two houses, an upper and lower. The upper house comprises the agricultural estate (including the peasant farmers and landed aristocracy), a class “whose ethical life is natural, whose basis is family life, and, so far as its livelihood is concerned, the possession of land. Its particular members attain their position by birth, just as the monarch does, and, in common with him, they possess a will which rests on itself alone” (¶ 305). Landed gentry inherit their estates and so owe their position to birth (primogeniture) and thus are free from the exigencies and uncertainties of the life of business and state interference. The relative independence of this class makes it particularly suited for public office as well as a mediating element between the crown and civil society.
The second section of the estates, the business class, comprises the “fluctuating and changeable element in civil society” which can enter politics only through its deputies or representatives (unlike the agricultural estate from which members can present themselves to the Estates Assembly in person). The appointment of deputies is “made by society as a society” both because of the multiplicity of members but also because representation must reflect the organization of civil society into associations, communities, and corporations. It is only as a member of such groups that an individual is a member of the state, and hence rational representation implies that consent to legislation is to be given not directly by all but only by “plenipotentiaries” who are chosen on the basis of their understanding of public affairs as well as managerial and political acumen, character, insight, etc. Moreover, their charge is to further the general interest of society and not the interest of a particular association or corporation instead (¶ 308-10).
The deputies of civil society are selected by the various corporations, not on the basis of universal direct suffrage which Hegel believed inevitably leads to electoral indifference, and they adopt the point of view of society. “Deputies are sometimes regarded as ‘representatives’; but they are representatives in an organic, rational sense only if they are representatives not of individuals or a conglomeration of them, but of one of the essential spheres of society and its large-scale interests. Hence, representation cannot now be taken to mean simply the substitution of one man for another; the point is that the interest itself is actually present in its representative, while he himself is there to represent the objective element of his own being” (¶ 311).
The debates that take place in the Estates Assembly are to be open to the public, whereby citizens can become politically educated both about national affairs and the true character of their own interests. “The formal subjective freedom of individuals consists in their having and expressing their own private judgements, opinions, and recommendations as affairs of state. This freedom is collectively manifested as what is called ‘public opinion’, in which what is absolutely universal, the substantive and the true, is linked with its opposite, the purely particular and private opinions of the Many” (¶ 316). Public opinion is a “standing self-contradiction” because, on the one hand, it gives expression to genuine needs and proper tendencies of common life along with common sense views about important matters and, on the other, is infected with accidental opinion, ignorance, and faulty judgment. “Public opinion therefore deserves to be as much respected as despised — despised for its concrete expression and for the concrete consciousness it expresses, respected for its essential basis, a basis which only glimmers more or less dimly in that concrete expression” (¶ 318). Moreover, while there is freedom of public communication, freedom of the press is not totally unrestricted as freedom does not mean absence of all restriction, either in word or deed.
Hegel calls the class of civil servants the “universal class” not only because as members of the executive their function is to “subsume the particular under the universal” in the administration of law, but also because they reflect a disposition of mind (due perhaps largely from their education) that transcends concerns with selfish ends in the devotion to the discharge of public functions and to the public universal good. As one of the classes of the estates, civil servants also participate in the legislature as an “unofficial class,” which seems to mean that as members of the executive they will attend legislative assemblies in an advisory capacity, but this is not entirely clear from Hegel’s text. Also, given that the monarch and the classes of civil society when conceived in abstraction are opposed to each other as “the one and the many,” they must become “fused into a unity” or mediated together through the civil servant class. From the point of view of the crown the executive is such a middle term, because it carries out the final decisions of the crown and makes it “particularized” in civil society. On the other hand, in order for the classes of civil society to actually sense this unity with the crown a mediation must occur from the other direction, so to speak, where the upper house of the estates, in virtue of certain likenesses to the Crown (e.g., role of birth for one’s position) is able to mediate between the Crown and civil society as a whole.
(2) Sovereignty vis-à-vis foreign States
The interpenetration of the universal with the particular will through a complex system of social and political mediations is what produces the self-consciousness of the nation-state considered as an organic (internally differentiated and interrelated) totality or concrete individual. In this system, particular individuals consciously pursue the universal ends of the State, not out of external or mechanical conformity to law, but in the free development of personal individuality and the expression of the unique subjectivity of each. However, individuality is not something possessed by particular persons alone, or even primarily by such persons. The state as a whole, i.e., the nation-state as distinct from the political state as one of its moments, constitutes a higher form of individuality. In principle, Mind or Spirit possesses a singleness in its “negative self-relation,” i.e., in the sense that unity in a being is a function of setting itself off from other beings. “Individuality is awareness of one’s existence as a unit in sharp distinction from others. It manifests itself here in the state as a relation to other states, each of which is autonomous vis-à-vis the others. This autonomy embodies mind’s actual awareness of itself as a unit and hence it is the most fundamental freedom which a people possesses as well as its highest dignity” (¶ 322). For any being to have self-conscious independence requires distinguishing the self from any of its contingent characteristics (inner self-negation), which externally is a distinction from another being. This consciousness of what one is not is for the nation-state its negative relation to itself embodied externally in the world as the relation of one state to another. However, this is not a mere externality, “But in fact this negative relation is that moment in the state which is most supremely its own, the state’s actual infinity as the ideality of everything finite within it” (¶ 323).
According to Hegel, war is an “ethical moment” in the life of a nation-state and hence is neither purely accidental nor an inherent evil. Because there is no higher earthly power ruling over nation-states, and because these entities are oriented to preserving their existence and sovereignty, conflicts leading to war are inevitable. Also, defense of one’s nation is an ethical duty and the ultimate test of one’s patriotism is war. “Sacrifice on behalf of the individuality of the state is the substantial tie between the state and all its members and so is a universal duty” (¶ 325). In making a sacrifice for the sake of the state individuals prove their courage, which involves a transcendence of concern with egoistic interests and mere material existence. “The intrinsic worth of courage as a disposition of mind is to be found in the genuine absolute, final end, the sovereignty of the state. The work of courage is to actualize this final end, and the means to this end is the sacrifice of personal actuality” (¶ 328). Moreover, war, along with catastrophy, disease, etc, highlights the finitude, insecurity, and ultimate transitoriness of human existence and puts the health of a state to a test. Hegel does not consider the ideal of “perpetual peace,” as advocated by Kant, a realistic goal towards which humanity can strive. Not only is the sovereignty of each state imprescriptible, but any alliance or league of states will be established in opposition to others.
“International law springs from the relations between autonomous states. It is for this reason that what is absolute in it retains the form of an ought-to-be, since its actuality depends on different wills each of which is sovereign” (¶ 330). States are not private persons in civil society who pursue their self-interest in the context of universal interdependence but rather are completely autonomous entities with no relations of private right or morality. However, since a state cannot escape having relations with other states, there must be at least some sort of recognition of each by the other. International law prescribes that treaties between states ought to be kept, but this universal proviso remains abstract because the sovereignty of a state is its guiding principle, hence states are to that extent in a state of nature in relation to each other (in the Hobbesian sense of there being natural rights to one’s survival with no natural duties to others). “Their rights are actualized only in their particular wills and not in a universal will with constitutional powers over them. This universal proviso of international law therefore does not go beyond an ought-to-be, and what really happens is that international relations in accordance with treaty alternate with the severance of these relations” (¶ 333). Obviously, if states come to disagree about the nature of their treaties, etc., and there is no acceptable compromise for each party, then matters will ultimately be settled by war.
States recognize their own welfare as the highest law governing their relations to one another, however, the claim by a state to recognition of this welfare is quite different from claims to welfare by individual person in civil society. “The ethical substance, the state, has its determinate being, i.e., its right, directly embodied in something existent … and the principle of its conduct and behavior can only be this concrete existent and not one of many universal thoughts supposed to be moral commands” (¶ 337). States recognize each other as states, and even in war there is awareness of the possibility that peace can be restored and that therefore war ought to come to an end, as well as understandings about the proper limitations on the waging of war. However, at most this translates into the jus gentium, the law of nations understood as customary relationships, which remains a “maelstrom of external contingency.” The principles of the mind or spirit (Volksgeist) of a nation-state are wholly restricted because its particularity is already that of realized individuality, possessing objective actuality and self-consciousness. Hence, the reciprocal relations of states to one another partake of a “dialectic of finitude” out of which arises the universal mind, “the mind of the world, free from all restriction, producing itself as that which exercises its right–and its right is the highest right of all–over these finite minds in the ‘history of the world which is the world’s court of judgment’” (¶ 340).
To say that history is the world’s court of judgment is to say that over and above the nation-states, or national “spirits,” there is the mind or Spirit of the world (Weltgeist) which pronounces its verdict through the development of history itself. The verdicts of world history, however, are not expressions of mere might, which in itself is abstract and non-rational. Rather than blind destiny, “world history is the necessary development, out of the concepts of mind’s freedom alone, of the moments of reason and so of the self-consciousness and freedom of mind” (¶ 342). The history of Spirit is the development through time of its own self-consciousness through the actions of peoples, states, and world historical actors who, while absorbed in their own interests, are nonetheless the unconscious instruments of the work of Spirit. “All actions, including world-historical actions, culminate with individuals as subjects giving actuality to the substantial. They are the living instruments of what is in substance the deed of the world mind and they are therefore directly at one with that deed though it is concealed from them and is not their aim and object” (¶ 348). The actions of great men are produced through their subjective willing and their passion, but the substance of these deeds is actually the accomplishment not of the individual agent but of the World Spirit (e.g., the founding of states by world-historical heroes).
Hegel says that in the history of the world we can distinguish several important formations of the self-consciousness of Spirit in the course of its free self-development, each corresponding to a significant principle. More specifically, there are four world-historical epochs, each manifesting a principle of Spirit as expressed through a dominant culture. In the Philosophy of Right, Hegel discusses these in a very abbreviated way in paragraphs 253-260, which brings this work to an end. Here we will draw from the more elaborated treatment in the appendix to the introduction to Hegel’s lectures on the Philosophy of World History.
(1) The Oriental Realm (mind in its immediate substance)
Here Spirit exists in its substantiality (objectivity) without inward differentiation. Individuals have no self-consciousness of personality or of rights–they are still immersed in external nature (and their divinities are naturalistic as well). Hegel characterizes this stage as one of consciousness in its immediacy, where subjectivity and substantiality are unmediated. In his Philosophy of History Hegel discusses China, India, and Persia specifically and suggests that these cultures do not actually have a history but rather are subject to natural cyclical processes. The typical governments of these cultures are theocratic and more particularly despotism, aristocracy, and monarchy respectively. Persia and Egypt are seen as transitional from these “unhistorical” and “non-political” states. Hegel calls this period the “childhood” of Spirit.
(2) The Greek Realm (mind in the simple unity of subjective and objective)
In this realm, we have the mixing of subjective freedom and substantiality in the ethical life of the Greek polis, because the ancient Greek city-states give expression to personal individuality for those who are free and have status. However, the relation of individual to the state is not self-conscious but is unreflective and based on obedience to custom and tradition. Hence, the immediate union of subjectivity with the substantial mind is unstable and leads to fragmentation. This is the period of the “adolescence” of Spirit.
(3) The Roman Realm (mind in its abstract universality)
At this stage, individual personality is recognized in formal rights, thus including a level of reflection absent in the Greek realm of “beautiful freedom.” Here freedom is difficult because the universal subjugates individuals, i.e., the state becomes an abstraction over above its citizens who must be sacrificed to the severe demands of a state in which individuals form a homogeneous mass. A tension between the two principles of individuality and universality ensues, manifesting itself in the formation of political despotism and insurgency against it. This realm gives expression to the “manhood” of Spirit.
(4) The Germanic Realm (reconciled unity of subjective and objective mind)
This realm comprises along with Germany and the Nordic peoples the major European nations (France, Italy, Spain) along with England. The principle of subjective freedom comes to the fore in such a way as to be made explicit in the life of Spirit and also mediated with substantiality. This involves a gradual development that begins with the rise of Christianity and its spiritual reconciliation of inner and outer life and culminates in the appearance of the modern nation-state, the rational Idea of which is articulated in the Philosophy of Right. (Along the way there are several milestones Hegel discusses in his Philosophy of History that are especially important in the developing of the self-consciousness of freedom, in particular the Reformation, the Enlightenment, and the French Revolution.) One of the significant features of the modern world is the overcoming of the antithesis of church and state that developed in the Medieval period. This final stage of Spirit is mature “old age.”
In sum, for Hegel the modern nation-state can be said to manifest a “personality” and a self-consciousness of its inherent nature and goals, indeed a self-awareness of everything which is implicit in its concept, and is able to act rationally and in accordance with its self-awareness. The modern nation-state is a “spiritual individual,” the true historical individual, precisely because of the level of realization of self-consciousness that it actualizes. The development of the perfected nation-state is the end or goal of history because it provides an optimal level of realization of self-consciousness, a more comprehensive level of realization of freedom than mere natural individuals, or other forms of human organization, can produce.
In closing this account of Hegel’s theory of the state, a few words on a “theory and practice” problem of the modern state. In the preface to the Philosophy of Right Hegel is quite clear that his science of the state articulates the nature of the state, not as it ought to be, but as it really is, as something inherently rational. Hegel’s famous quote in this regard is “What is rational is actual and what is actual is rational,” where by the ‘actual’ (Wirklich) Hegel means not the merely existent, i.e., a state that can be simply identified empirically, but the actualized or realized state, i.e., one that corresponds to its rational concept and thus in some sense must be perfected. Later in the introduction of the Idea of the state in paragraph 258, Hegel is at pains to distinguish the Idea of the state from a state understood in terms of its historical origins and says that while the state is the way of God in the world we must not focus on particular states or on particular institutions of the state, but only on the Idea itself. Furthermore he says, “The state is no ideal work of art; it stands on earth and so in the sphere of caprice, chance, and error, and bad behavior may disfigure it in many respects. But the ugliest of men, or a criminal, or an invalid, or a cripple, is still always a living man. The affirmative, life, subsists despite his defects, and it is this affirmative factor which is our theme here” (¶ 258, addition). The issue, then, is whether the actual state — the subject of philosophical science — is only a theoretical possibility and whether from a practical point of view all existing states are in some way disfigured or deficient. Our ability to rationally distill from existing states their ideal characteristics does not entail that a fully actualized state does, or will, exist. Hence, there is perhaps some ambiguity in Hegel’s claim about the modern state as an actualization of freedom.
Below are works by Hegel that relate most directly to his social and political philosophy.
The books listed below either focus on one or more aspects of Hegel’s social and political thought or include some discussion in this area and, moreover, are significant enough works on Hegel to be included. The most comprehensive bibliography on Hegel is Hegel-Bibliographie (München: K. G Saur Verlag, 1980). For books and articles in the last 25 years, consult the Philosopher’s Index.
David A. Duquette
St. Norbert College
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 3, 2005 | Originally published: