Martin Heidegger is widely acknowledged to be one of the most original and important philosophers of the 20th century, while remaining one of the most controversial. His thinking has contributed to such diverse fields as phenomenology (Merleau-Ponty), existentialism (Sartre, Ortega y Gasset), hermeneutics (Gadamer, Ricoeur), political theory (Arendt, Marcuse, Habermas), psychology (Boss, Binswanger, Rollo May), and theology (Bultmann, Rahner, Tillich). His critique of traditional metaphysics and his opposition to positivism and technological world domination have been embraced by leading theorists of postmodernity (Derrida, Foucault, and Lyotard). On the other hand, his involvement in the Nazi movement has invoked a stormy debate. Although he never claimed that his philosophy was concerned with politics, political considerations have come to overshadow his philosophical work.
Heidegger’s main interest was ontology or the study of being. In his fundamental treatise, Being and Time, he attempted to access being (Sein) by means of phenomenological analysis of human existence (Dasein) in respect to its temporal and historical character. After the change of his thinking (“the turn”), Heidegger placed an emphasis on language as the vehicle through which the question of being can be unfolded. He turned to the exegesis of historical texts, especially of the Presocratics, but also of Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche and Hölderlin, and to poetry, architecture, technology, and other subjects. Instead of looking for a full clarification of the meaning of being, he tried to pursue a kind of thinking which was no longer “metaphysical.” He criticized the tradition of Western philosophy, which he regarded as nihilistic, for, as he claimed, the question of being as such was obliterated in it. He also stressed the nihilism of modern technological culture. By going to the Presocratic beginning of Western thought, he wanted to repeat the early Greek experience of being, so that the West could turn away from the dead end of nihilism and begin anew. His writings are notoriously difficult. Being and Time remains his most influential work.
Heidegger was born on September 26, 1889 in Messkirch in south-west Germany to a Catholic family. His father worked as sexton in the local church. In his early youth, Heidegger was being prepared for the priesthood. In 1903 he went to the high school in Konstanz, where the church supported him with a scholarship, and then, in 1906, he moved to Freiburg. His interest in philosophy first arose during his high school studies in Freiburg when, at the age of seventeen, he read Franz Brentano’s book entitled On the Manifold Meaning of Being according to Aristotle. By his own account, it was this work that inspired his life-long quest for the meaning of being. In 1909, after completing the high school, he became a Jesuit novice, but was discharged within a month for reasons of health. He then entered Freiburg University, where he studied theology. However, because of health problems and perhaps because of a lack of a strong spiritual vocation, Heidegger left the seminary in 1911 and broke off his training for the priesthood. He took up studies in philosophy, mathematics, and natural sciences. It was also at that time that he first became influenced by Edmund Husserl. He studied Husserl's Logical Investigations. In 1913 he completed a doctorate in philosophy with a dissertation on The Doctrine of Judgement in Psychologism under the direction of the neo-Kantian philosopher Heinrich Rickert.
The outbreak of the First World War interrupted Heidegger’s academic career only briefly. He was conscripted into the army, but was discharged after two months because of health reasons. Hoping to take over the chair of Catholic philosophy at Freiburg, Heidegger now began to work on a habilitation thesis, the required qualification for teaching at the university. His thesis, Duns Scotus’s Doctrine of Categories and Meaning, was completed in 1915, and in the same year he was appointed a Privatdozent, or lecturer. He taught mostly courses in Aristotelian and scholastic philosophy, and regarded himself as standing in the service of the Catholic world-view. Nevertheless, his turn from theology to philosophy was soon to be followed by another turn.
In 1916, Heidegger became a junior colleague of Edmund Husserl when the latter joined the Freiburg faculty. The following year, he married Thea Elfride Petri, a Protestant student who had attended his courses since the fall of 1915. His career was again interrupted by military service in 1918. He served for the last ten months of the war, the last three of those in a meteorological unit on the western front. Within a few weeks of his return to Freiburg, he announced his break with the “system of Catholicism” (January 9, 1919), got appointed as Husserl’s assistant (January 21, 1919), and began lecturing in a new, insightful way (February 7, 1919). His lectures on phenomenology and his creative interpretations of Aristotle would now earn him a wide acclaim. And yet, Heidegger did not simply become Husserl’s faithful follower. In particular, he was not captivated by the later developments of Husserl’s thought—by his neo-Kantian turn towards transcendental subjectivity and even less by his Cartesianism—but continued to value his earlier work, Logical Investigations. Laboring over the question of things themselves, Heidegger soon began a radical reinterpretation of Husserl’s phenomenology.
In 1923, with the support of Paul Natorp, Heidegger was appointed associate professor at Marburg University. Between 1923 and 1928, he enjoyed there the most fruitful years of his entire teaching career. His students testified to the originality of his insight and the intensity of his philosophical questioning. Heidegger extended the scope of his lectures, and taught courses on the history of philosophy, time, logic, phenomenology, Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Kant, and Leibniz. However, he had published nothing since 1916, a factor that threatened his future academic career. Finally, in February 1927, partly because of administrative pressure, his fundamental but also unfinished treatise, Being and Time, appeared. Within a few years, this book was recognized as a truly epoch-making work of 20th century philosophy. It earned Heidegger, in the fall of 1927, full professorship at Marburg, and one year later, after Husserl’s retirement from teaching, the chair of philosophy at Freiburg University. Although Being and Time is dedicated to Husserl, upon its publication Heidegger’s departure from Husserl’s phenomenology and the differences between two philosophers became apparent. In 1929, his next published works—“What is Metaphysics?,” “On the Essence of Ground,” and Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics—further revealed how far Heidegger had moved from neo-Kantianism and phenomenology of consciousness to his own phenomenological ontology.
Heidegger’s life entered a problematic and controversial stage with Hitler’s rise to power. In September 1930, Adolf Hitler’s National Socialist German Workers’ Party (NSDAP) became the second largest party in Germany, and on January 30, 1933 Hitler was appointed chancellor of Germany. Up to then virtually apolitical, Heidegger now became politically involved. On April 21, 1933, he was elected rector of the University of Freiburg by the faculty. He was apparently urged by his colleagues to become a candidate for this politically sensitive post, as he later claimed in an interview with Der Spiegel, to avoid the danger of a party functionary being appointed. But he also seemed to believe that he could steer the Nazi movement in the right direction. On May 3, 1933, he joined the NSDAP, or Nazi, party. On May 27, 1933, he delivered his inaugural rectoral address on “The Self-Assertion of the German University.” The ambiguous text of this speech has often been interpreted as an expression of his support for Hitler’s regime. During his tenure as rector he produced a number of speeches in the Nazi cause, such as, for example, “Declaration of Support for Adolf Hitler and the National Socialist State” delivered in November 1933. There is little doubt that during that time, Heidegger placed the great prestige of his scholarly reputation at the service of National Socialism, and thus, willingly or not, contributed to its legitimization among his fellow Germans. And yet, just one year later, on April 23, 1934, Heidegger resigned from his office and took no further part in politics. His rectoral address was found incompatible with the party line, and its text was eventually banned by the Nazis. Because he was no longer involved in the party’s activities, Heidegger’s membership in the NSDAP became a mere formality. Certain restrictions were put on his freedom to publish and attend conferences. In his lecture courses of the late 1930s and early 1940s, and especially in the course entitled Hölderlin’s Hymnen “Germanien” und “Der Rein” (Hölderlin’s Hymns “Germania” and “The Rhine”) originally presented at the University of Freiburg during the winter semester of 1934/35, he expressed covert criticism of Nazi ideology. He came under attack of Ernst Krieck, semi-official Nazi philosopher. For some time he was under the surveillance of the Gestapo. His final humiliation came in 1944, when he was declared the most “expendable” member of the faculty and sent to the Rhine to dig trenches. Following Germany’s defeat in the Second World War, Heidegger was accused of Nazi sympathies. He was forbidden to teach and in 1946 was dismissed from his chair of philosophy. The ban was lifted in 1949.
The 1930s are not only marked by Heidegger’s controversial involvement in politics, but also by a change in his thinking which is known as “the turn” (die Kehre). In his lectures and writings that followed “the turn,” he became less systematic and often more obscure than in his fundamental work, Being and Time. He turned to the exegesis of philosophical and literary texts, especially of the Presocratics, but also of Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche and Hölderlin, and makes this his way of philosophizing. A recurring theme of that time was “the essence of truth.” During the decade between 1931 and 1940, Heidegger offered five courses under this title. His preoccupation with the question of language and his fascination with poetry were expressed in lectures on Hörderlin which he gave between 1934 and 1936. Towards the end of 1930s and the beginning of 1940s, he taught five courses on Nietzsche, in which he submitted to criticism the tradition of western metaphysics, described by him as nihilistic, and made allusions to the absurdity of war and the bestiality of his contemporaries. Finally, his reflection upon the western philosophical tradition and an endeavor to open a space for philosophizing outside it, brought him to an examination of Presocratic thought. In the course of lectures entitled An Introduction to Metaphysics, which was originally offered as a course of lectures in 1935, and can be seen as a bridge between earlier and later Heidegger, the Presocratics were no longer a subject of mere passing remarks as in Heidegger’s earlier works. The course was not about early Greek thought, yet the Presocratics became there the pivotal center of discussion. It is clear that with the evolution of Heidegger’s thinking in the 1930s, they gained in importance in his work. During the 1940s, in addition to giving courses on Aristotle, Kant and Hegel, Heidegger lectured extensively on Anaximander, Parmenides, and Heraclitus.
During the last three decades of his life, from the mid 1940s to the mid 1970s, Heidegger wrote and published much, but in comparison to earlier decades, there was no significant change in his philosophy. In his insightful essays and lectures, such as “What are Poets for?” (1946), “Letter on Humanism” (1947), “The Question Concerning Technology” (1953), “The Way to Language” (1959), “Time and Being” (1962), and “The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking” (1964), he addressed different issues concerning modernity, labored on his original philosophy of history—the history of being—and attempted to clarify his way of thinking after “the turn”. Most of his time was divided between his home in Freiburg, his second study in Messkirch, and his mountain hut in the Black Forest. But he escaped provincialism by being frequently visited by his friends (including, among the others, the political philosopher Hannah Arendt, the physicist Werner Heisenberg, the theologian Rudolf Bultmann, the psychologist Ludwig Binswanger) and by traveling more widely than ever before. He lectured on “What is Philosophy?” at Cerisy-la-Salle in 1955, and on “Hegel and the Greeks” at Aix-en-Provence in 1957, and also visited Greece in 1962 and 1967. In 1966, Heidegger attempted to justify his political involvement during the Nazi regime in an interview with Der Spiegel entitled “Only God Can Save Us”. One of his last teaching stints was a seminar on Parmenides that he gave in Zähringen in 1973. Heiddegger died on May 26, 1976, and was buried in the churchyard in Messkirch. He remained intellectually active up until the very end, working on a number of projects, including the massive Gesamtausgabe, the complete edition of his works.
In order to understand Heidegger’s philosophy before “the turn”, let us first briefly consider his indebtedness to Edmund Husserl. As it has been mentioned, Heidegger was interested in Husserl from his early student years at the University of Freiburg when he read Logical Investigations. Later, when Husserl accepted a chair at Freiburg, Heidegger became his assistant. His debt to Husserl cannot be overlooked. Not only is Being and Time dedicated to Husserl, but also Heidegger acknowledges in it that without Husserl’s phenomenology his own investigation would not have been possible. How then is Heidegger’s philosophy related to the Husserlian program of phenomenology?
By “phenomenology” Husserl himself had always meant the science of consciousness and its objects; this core of sense pervades the development of this concept as eidetic, transcendental or constructive throughout his works. Following the Cartesian tradition, he saw the ground and the absolute starting point of philosophy in the subject. The procedure of bracketing is essential to Husserl’s “phenomenological reduction”—the methodological procedure by which we are led from “the natural attitude,” in which we are involved in the actual world and its affairs, to “the phenomenological attitude,” in which the analysis and detached description of the content of consciousness is possible. The phenomenological reduction helps us to free ourselves from prejudices and secure the purity of our detachment as observers, so that we can encounter “things as they are in themselves” independently of any presuppositions. The goal of phenomenology for Husserl is then a descriptive, detached analysis of consciousness, in which objects, as its correlates, are constituted.
What right does Husserl have to insist that the original mode of encounter with beings, in which they appear to us as they are as things in themselves, is the encounter of consciousness purified by phenomenological reduction and its objects? “Whence and how is it determined what must be experienced as the ‘things themselves’ in accordance with the principle of phenomenology?” These are pressing questions which Heidegger might well have asked. Perhaps because of his reverence for Husserl, he does not subject him to direct criticism in his fundamental work. Nevertheless, Being and Time is itself a powerful critique of the Husserlian phenomenology. Heidegger there gives attention to many different modes in which we exist and encounter things. He analyses the structures constitutive of things not only as they are encountered in the detached, theoretical attitude of consciousness, but also in daily life as “utensils” (Zuhandene) or in special moods, especially in anxiety (Angst). What is more, he exhibits there the structures that are constitutive of the particular kind of being which is the human being and which he calls “Dasein.” For Heidegger, it is not pure consciousness in which beings are originally constituted. The starting point of philosophy for him is not consciousness, but Dasein in its being.
The central problem for Husserl is the problem of constitution: How is the world as phenomenon constituted in our consciousness? Heidegger takes the Husserlian problem one step further. Instead of asking how something must be given in consciousness in order to be constituted, he asks: “What is the mode of being of that being in which the world constitutes itself?” In a letter to Husserl dated October 27, 1927, he states that the question of Dasein's being cannot be evaded, as far as the problem of constitution is concerned. Dasein is that being in which any being is constituted. Further, the question of Dasein's being directs him to the problem of being in general. The “universal problem of being,” he says in the same letter, “refers to that which constitutes and to that which is constituted.” While far from being dependent upon Husserl, Heidegger finds in his thought an inspiration leading him to the theme which has continued to draw his attention since his early years: the question of the meaning of being.
Phenomenology thus receives in Heidegger a new meaning. He conceives it more broadly, and more etymologically, than Husserl, as “letting what shows itself to be seen from itself, just as it shows from itself.” Husserl applies the term “phenomenology” to a whole philosophy. Heidegger takes it rather to designate a method. Since in Being and Time philosophy is described as “ontology” and has being as its theme, it cannot adopt its method from any of the actual sciences. For Heidegger the method of ontology is phenomenology. “Phenomenology,” he says, “is the way of access to what is to become the theme of ontology.” Being is to be grasped by means of the phenomenological method. However, being is always the being of a being, and accordingly, it becomes accessible only indirectly through some existing entity. Therefore, “phenomenological reduction” is necessary. One must direct oneself toward an entity, but in such a way that its being is thereby brought out. It is Dasein which Heidegger chooses as the particular entity to access being. Hence, as the basic component of his phenomenology, Heidegger adopts the Husserlian phenomenological reduction, but gives it a completely different meaning.
To sum up, Heidegger does not base his philosophy on consciousness as Husserl did. For him the phenomenological or theoretical attitude of consciousness, which Husserl makes the core of his doctrine, is only one possible mode of that which is more fundamental, namely, Dasein's being. Although he agrees with Husserl that the transcendental constitution of the world cannot be unveiled by naturalistic or physical explanations, in his view it is not a descriptive analysis of consciousness that leads to this end, but the analysis of Dasein. Phenomenology for him is not a descriptive, detached analysis of consciousness. It is a method of access to being. For the Heidegger of Being and Time, philosophy is phenomenological ontology which takes its departure from the analysis of Dasein.
In everyday German language the word “Dasein” means life or existence. The noun is used by other German philosophers to denote the existence of any entity. However, Heidegger breaks the word down to its components “Da” and “Sein,” and gives to it a special meaning which is related to his answer to the question of who the human being is. He relates this question to the question of being. Dasein, that being which we ourselves are, is distinguished from all other beings by the fact that it makes issue of its own being. It stands out to being. As Da-sein, it is the site, “Da”, for the disclosure of being, “Sein.”
Heidegger’s fundamental analysis of Dasein from Being and Time points to temporality as the primordial meaning of Dasein’s being. Dasein is essentially temporal. Its temporal character is derived from the tripartite ontological structure: existence, thrownness, and fallenness by which Dasein’s being is described. Existence means that Dasein is potentiality-for-being (Seinkönnen); it projects its being upon various possibilities. Existence represents thus the phenomenon of the future. Then, as thrownness, Dasein always finds itself already in a certain spiritual and material, historically conditioned environment; in short, in the world, in which the space of possibilities is always somehow limited. This represents the phenomenon of the past as having-been. Finally, as fallenness, Dasein exists in the midst of beings which are both Dasein and not Dasein. The encounter with those beings, “being-alongside” or “being-with” them, is made possible for Dasein by the presence of those beings within-the-world. This represents the primordial phenomenon of the present. Accordingly, Dasein is not temporal for the mere reason that it exists “in time,” but because its very being is rooted in temporality: the original unity of the future, the past and the present. Temporality cannot be identified with ordinary clock time - with simply being at one point in time, at one “Now” after another—which for Heidegger is a derivative phenomenon. Neither does Dasein’s temporality have the merely quantitative, homogeneous character of the concept of time found in natural science. It is the phenomenon of original time, of the time which “temporalizes” itself in the course of Dasein’s existence. It is a movement through a world as a space of possibilities. The “going back” to the possibilities that have been (the past) in the moment of thrownness, and their projection in the resolute movement “coming towards” (the future) in the moment of existence, which both take place in “being with” others (the present) in the moment of fallenness, provide for the original unity of the future, the past, and the present which constitutes authentic temporality.
As authentically temporal, Dasein as potentiality-for-being comes towards itself in its possibilities of being by going back to what has been; it always comes towards itself from out of a possibility of itself. Hence, it comports itself towards the future by always coming back to its past; the past which is not merely past but still around as having-been. But in this “going back” to what it has been which is constitutive together with “coming towards” and “being with” for the unity of Dasein’s temporality, Dasein hands down to itself its own historical “heritage,” namely, the possibilities of being that have come down to it. As authentically temporal, Dasein is thus authentically historical. The repetition of the possibilities of existence, of that which has been, is for Heidegger constitutive for the phenomenon of original history which is rooted in temporality.
Throughout his long academic career, Heidegger was preoccupied with the question of the meaning of being. His first formulation of this question goes as far back as his high school studies, during which he read Franz Brentano’s book On the Manifold Meaning of Being in Aristotle. In 1907, the seventeen-year-old Heidegger asked: “If what-is is predicated in manifold meanings, then what is its leading fundamental meaning? What does being mean?” The question of being, unanswered at that time, becomes the leading question of Being and Time twenty years later. Surveying the long history of the meaning attributed to “being,” Heidegger notes that in the philosophical tradition it has generally been presupposed that being is at once the most universal concept, the concept indefinable in terms of other concepts, and the self-evident concept. In short, it is a concept that is mostly taken for granted. However, Heidegger claims that even though we seem to understand being, its meaning is still veiled in darkness. Therefore, we need to restate the question of the meaning of being.
In accordance with the method of philosophy which he employs in his fundamental treatise, before attempting to provide an answer to the question of being in general, Heidegger sets out to answer the question of the being of the particular kind of entity that is the human being, which he calls Dasein. The vivid phenomenological descriptions of Dasein’s being-in-the-world, especially Dasein’s everydayness and resoluteness toward death, have attracted many readers with interests related to existential philosophy, theology, and literature. The basic concepts such as temporality, understanding, historicity, repetition, and authentic or inauthentic existence were carried over into and further explored in his later works. Still, from the point of view of the quest for the meaning of being, Being and Time was a failure and remained unfinished. As Heidegger himself admitted in his later essay, “Letter on Humanism” (1946), the third division of its first part, entitled “Time and Being,” was held back “because thinking failed in adequate saying of the turning and did not succeed with the help of the language of metaphysics.” The second part also remained unwritten.
“The turn” (Kehre) that occurs in the 1930’s is the change in Heidegger’s thinking mentioned above. The consequence of “the turn” is not the abandoning of the leading question of Being and Time. Heidegger stresses the continuity of his thought over the course of the change. Nevertheless, as “everything is reversed,” even the question concerning the meaning of Being is reformulated in Heidegger’s later work. It becomes a question of the openness, that is, of the truth, of being. Furthermore, since the openness of being refers to a situation within history, the most important concept in the later Heidegger becomes the history of being.
For a reader unacquainted with Heidegger’s thought, both the “question of the meaning of being” and the expression “history of being” sound strange. In the first place, such a reader may argue that when something is said to be, there is nothing expressed which the world “Being” could properly denote. Therefore, the word “being” is a meaningless term and the Heideggerian quest for the meaning of being is in general a misunderstanding. Secondly, the reader may also think that the being of Heidegger is no more likely to have a history than the being of Aristotle, so the “history of being” is a misunderstanding as well. Nevertheless, Heidegger’s task is precisely to show that there is a meaningful concept of being. “We understand the ‘is’ we use in speaking,” he claims, “although we do not comprehend it conceptually.” Therefore, Heidegger asks: Can being then be thought? We can think of beings: a table, my desk, the pencil with which I am writing, the school building, a heavy storm in the mountains . . . but being? If the being whose meaning Heidegger seeks seems so elusive, almost like no-thing, it is because it is not an entity. It is not something; it is not a being. “Being is essentially different from a being, from beings.” The “ontological difference,” the distinction between being (das Sein) and beings (das Seiende), is fundamental for Heidegger. The forgetfulness of being that, according to him, occurs in the course of Western philosophy amounts to the oblivion of this distinction.
The conception of the history of being is of central importance in Heidegger’s thought. Already in Being and Time its idea is foreshadowed as “the destruction of the history of ontology.” In Heidegger’s later writings the story is considerably recast and called the “history of being” (Seinsgeschichte). The beginning of this story, as told by Heidegger especially in the Nietzsche lectures, is the end, the completion of philosophy by its dissolution into particular sciences and nihilism—questionlessness of being, a dead end into which the West has run. Heidegger argues that the question of being would still provide a stimulus to the research of Plato and Aristotle, but it was precisely with them that the original experience of being of the early Greeks was covered over. The fateful event was followed by the gradual slipping away of the distinction between being and beings. Described variously by different philosophers, being was reduced to a being: to idea in Plato, substantia and actualitas in Medieval philosophy, objectivity in modern philosophy, and will to power in Nietzsche and contemporary thought. The task which the later Heidegger sets before himself is then to make a way back into the primordial beginning, so that the “dead end” can be replaced by a new beginning. And since the primordial beginning of western thought lies in ancient Greece, in order to solve the problems of contemporary philosophy and reverse the course of modern history, Heidegger ultimately turns for help to the Presocratics, the first western thinkers.
For the later Heidegger, “western philosophy,” in which there occurs forgetfulness of being, is synonymous with “the tradition of metaphysics.” Metaphysics inquires about the being of beings, but in such a way that the question of being as such is disregarded, and being itself is obliterated. The Heideggerian “history of being” can thus be seen as the history of metaphysics, which is the history of being’s oblivion. However, looked at from another angle, metaphysics is also the way of thinking that looks beyond beings toward their ground or basis. Each metaphysics aims at the fundamentum absolutum, the ground of such a metaphysics which presents itself indubitably. In Descartes, for example, the fundamentum absolutum is attained through the “Cogito” argument. Cartesian metaphysics is characterized by subjectivity because it has its ground in the self-certain subject. Furthermore, metaphysics is not merely the philosophy which asks the question of the being of beings. At the end of philosophy—i.e., in our present age where there occurs the dissolution of philosophy into particular sciences—the sciences still speak of the being of what-is as a whole. In the wider sense of this term, metaphysics is thus, for Heidegger, any discipline which, whether explicitly or not, provides an answer to the question of the being of beings and of their ground. In medieval times such a discipline was scholastic philosophy, which defined beings as entia creatum (created things) and provided them with their ground in ens perfectissimum (the perfect being), God. Today the discipline is modern technology, through which the contemporary human being establishes himself in the world by working on it in the various modes of making and shaping. Technology forms and controls the human position in today’s world. It masters and dominates beings in various ways.
“In distinction from mastering beings, the thinking of thinkers is the thinking of being.” Heidegger believes that early Greek thinking is not yet metaphysics. Presocratic thinkers ask the question concerning the being of beings, but in such a way that being itself is laid open. They experience the being of beings as the presencing (Anwesen) of what is present (Anwesende). Being as presencing means enduring in unconcealment, disclosing. Throughout his later works Heidegger uses several words in order rightly to convey this Greek experience. What-is, what is present, the unconcealed, is “what appears from out of itself, in appearing shows itself , and in this self-showing manifests.” It is the “emerging arising, the unfolding that lingers.” He describes this experience with the Greek words phusis (emerging dominance) and alêtheia (unconcealment). He attempts to show that the early Greeks did not “objectify” beings (they did not try to reduce them to an object for the thinking subject), but they let them be as they were, as self-showing rising into unconcealment. They experienced the phenomenality of what is present, its radiant self-showing. The departure of Western philosophical tradition from concern with what is present in presencing, from this unique experience that astonished the Greeks, has had profound theoretical and practical consequences.
According to Heidegger, the experience of what is present in presencing signifies the true, unmediated experience of “the things themselves” (die Sache selbst). We may recall that the call to “the things themselves” was included in the Husserlian program of phenomenology. By means of phenomenological description Husserl attempted to arrive at pure phenomena and to describe beings just as they were given independently of any presuppositions. For Heidegger, this attempt has, however, a serious drawback. Like the tradition of modern philosophy preceding him, Husserl stood at the ground of subjectivity. The transcendental subjectivity or consciousness was for him “the sole absolute being.” It was the presupposition that had not been accounted for in his program which aimed to be presuppositionless. Consequently, in Heidegger’s view, the Husserlian attempt to arrive at pure, unmediated phenomena fails. Husserl’s phenomenology departs from the original phenomenality of beings and represents them in terms of the thinking subject as their presupposed ground. By contrast, Heidegger argues, for the Presocratics, beings are grounded in being as presencing. Being, however, is not a ground. To the early Greeks, being, unlimited in its dis-closure, appears as an abyss, the source of thought and wonder. Being calls everything into question, casts the human being out of any habitual ground, and opens before him the mystery of existence.
The departure of western philosophical tradition from what is present in presencing results in metaphysics. Heidegger believes that today’s metaphysics, in the form of technology and the calculative thinking related to it, has become so pervasive that there is no realm of life that is not subject to its dominance. It imposes its technological-scientific-industrial character on human beings, making it the sole criterion of the human sojourn on earth. As it ultimately degenerates into ideologies and worldviews, metaphysics provides an answer to the question of the being of beings for contemporary men and women, but skillfully removes from their lives the problem of their own existence. Moreover, because its sway over contemporary human beings is so powerful, metaphysics cannot be simply cast aside or rejected. Any direct attempt to do so will only strengthen its hold. Metaphysics cannot be rejected, canceled or denied, but it can be overcome by demonstrating its nihilism. In Heidegger’s use of the term, “nihilism” has a very specific meaning. It refers to the forgetfulness of being. What remains unquestioned and forgotten in metaphysics is Being; hence, it is nihilistic.
According to Heidegger, Western humankind in all its relations with beings is sustained by metaphysics. Every age, every human epoch, no matter however different they may be—
Greece after the Presocratics, Rome, the Middle Ages, modernity—has asserted a metaphysics and, therefore, is placed in a specific relationship to what-is as a whole. Metaphysics inquires about the being of beings, but it reduces being to a being; it does not think of being as being. Insofar as being itself is obliterated in it, metaphysics is nihilism. The metaphysics of Plato is no less nihilistic than that of Nietzsche. Consequently, Heidegger tries to demonstrate the nihilism of metaphysics in his account of the history of being, which he considers as the history of being’s oblivion. His attempt to overcome metaphysics is not based on a common-sense positing of a different set of values or the setting out of an alternative worldview, but rather is related to his concept of history, the central theme of which is the repetition of the possibilities for existence. This repetition consists in thinking being back to the primordial beginning of the West—to the early Greek experience of being as presencing—and repeating this beginning, so that the Western world can begin anew.
Many scholars perceive something unique in the Greek beginning of philosophy. It is commonly acknowledged that Thales and his successors asked generalized questions concerning what is as a whole, and proposed general, rational answers which were no longer based on a theological ground. However, Heidegger does not associate the unique beginning with the alleged discovery of rationality and science. In fact, he claims that both rationality and science are later developments, so that they cannot apply to Presocratic thought. In his view, the Presocratics ask: “What are beings as such as a whole?” and they answer: aletheia—unconcealment. They experience beings in their phenomenality: as what is present in presencing. But the later thought which begins with Plato and Aristotle is unable to keep up with the beginning. With Plato and Aristotle metaphysics begins and the history of being’s oblivion originates.
The aim which the later Heidegger sets before himself is precisely to return to the original experience of beings in being that stands at the beginning of Western thought. This unmediated experience of beings in their phenomenality can be variously described: what is present in presencing, the unconcealment of what is present, the original disclosure of beings. To repeat the primordial beginning more originally in its originality means to bring us back to the Presocratic experiences, to dis-close them, and to let them be as they originally are. But the repetition is not for the sake of the Presocratics themselves. Heidegger’s work is not a mere antiquarian, scholarly study of early Greek thinking, nor is it an affirmation of the long lost Greek way of life. It occurs within the perspective of nihilism and being’s forgetfulness, both unknown to the Greeks, and has as a goal the future possibilities for existence. It happens as the listening that opens itself out to the words of the Presocratics from our contemporary age, from the age of the world picture and representation, the world which is marked by the domination of technology and the oblivion of being. In the first beginning, the task of the Greeks was to ask the question “What are beings?,” and hence to bring beings as such as a whole to the first recognition and the most simple interpretation. In the end, the task is to make questionable what at the end of a long tradition of philosophy-metaphysics has been forgotten. The new beginning begins thus with the question of being.
From Being and Time (1927) where the question of the meaning of being is first developed, but still expressed in the language of metaphysics, to “Time and Being” (1962) where an attempt to think being without regard to metaphysics is made, Heidegger goes full circle. Heidegger begins by asking about the multiple meanings of being and ends up conceding its multiplicity and acknowledging that there are multiple determinations or meanings of being in which being discloses itself in history. Nevertheless, in neither of these meanings does being give itself fully. “As it discloses itself in beings, being withdraws.” There is an essential withdrawal of being. Therefore, the truth of being is none of its particular historical determinations—idea, substantia, actualitas, objectivity or the will to power. The truth of being can be defined as the openness, the free region which always out of sight provides the space of play for the different determinations of being and human epochs established in them. It is that which is before actual things and grants them a possibility of manifestation as what is present, ens creatum, and objects.
The truth of being, its openness, is for Heidegger not something which we can merely consider or think of. It is not our own production. It is where we always come to stand. We find ourselves thrown in a historically conditioned environment, in an epoch in which the decision concerning the prevailing interpretation of the being of being is already made for us. Yet, by asking the question of being, we can at least attempt to free ourselves from our historical conditioning. Heidegger’s program expressed in “The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking” (1964) consists solely in the character of thinking which does not attempt to dominate, but engages in disclosing and opening up what shows itself, emerges, and is manifest. When Heidegger urges us to stand in being, he does not merely ask us to acknowledge our own place in being’s history, but to be future-oriented and see the future in a unity with the past as having-been and the present. It means turning oneself into being in its disclosing withdrawal.
Heidegger never claimed that his philosophy was concerned with politics. Nevertheless, there are certainly some political implications of his thought. He perceives the metaphysical culture of the West as a continuity. It begins with Plato and ends with modernity, and the dominance of science and technology. He thus implies in the post-modernist fashion that Nazism and the atom bomb, Auschwitz and Hiroshima, have been something like the “fulfillment” of the tradition of Western metaphysics and tries to distance himself from that tradition. He turns to the Presocratics in order to retrieve a pre-metaphysical mode of thought that would serve as a starting point for a new beginning. However, his grand vision of the essential history of the West and of western nihilism can be questioned. Modernity, whose development involves not only a technological but also a social revolution, which sets individuals loose from religious and ethnic communities, from parishes and family bonds, and which affirms materialistic values, can be regarded as a radical departure from earlier classical and Christian traditions. Contrary to Heidegger’s argument, rather than being a mere continuity, the “essential” history of the West can then be seen as a history of radical transformations. Christianity challenges the classical world, while assimilating some aspects of it, and is in turn challenged by modernity. Modernity overturns the ideas and values of the traditional (Christian and classical) culture of the West, and, once it becomes global, leads to the erosion of nonwestern traditional cultures.
Under the cover of immense speculative depth and rich ontological vocabulary full of intricate wordplay (both which make his writings extremely hard to follow) Heidegger expresses a simple political vision. He is a revolutionary thinker who denies the traditional philosophical division between theory and practice, and this is especially clear when he boldly declares in his Introduction to Metaphysics that “we have undertaken the great and lengthy task of demolishing a world that has grown old and of building it truly anew”. He wants to overturn the traditional culture of the West and build it anew on the basis of earlier traditions in the name of being. Like other thinkers of modernity, he adopts a Eurocentric perspective and sees the revival of German society as a condition for the revival of Europe (or the West), and that of Europe as a condition for the revival of for the whole world; like them, while rejecting God as an end, he attempts to set up fabricated ends for human beings. Ultimately, in the famous interview with Der Spiegel, he expresses his disillusionment with his project and says: “Philosophy will not be able to bring about a direct change of the present state of the world . . . The greatness of what is to be thought is too great.” Like being, which he describes as “disclosing self-concealing,” after making a disclosure he withdraws; after stirring up a revolution, he leaves all its problems to others. He says: “only a God can still save us,” but the God for whom, in the absence of philosophical thought, he now looks is clearly not that of the Christians or of any contemporary religion.
In the Spiegel interview Heidegger tells us that in order to begin anew, we need to go to the “age-old” (i.e., pre-classical and pre-metaphysical) traditions of thought. He invokes the concept of the ancient polis. Yet, since he does not want to concern himself with the question of ethics (beyond saying in the “Letter of Humanism” that the word “ethics appeared for the first time in the school of Plato” and thus implying that ethics does not think the truth of being and is nihilistic), he does not consider the fact that even in pre-Platonic and pre-Socratic times a Greek polis was an ethical community, in which moral questions were raised and discussed. The Iliad and Odyssey of Homer, the poems of Hesiod, and the tragedies of Sophocles, as well as the other ancient Greek texts, including the monumental political work of Thucydides, the History of the Peloponnesian War, express concerns with ethical behavior at both the individual and community levels. Furthermore, the strength of Western civilization, insofar as its roots can be traced to ancient Greece, is that from its beginning it was based on rationality, understood as free debate, and the affirmation of fundamental moral values. Whenever it turned to irrationality and moral relativism, as in Nazism and Communism, that civilization was in decline. Therefore, Heidegger is likely to be mistaken in his diagnosis of the ills of the contemporary society, and his solution to those ills seems to be wrong. Asking the question of being (and, drawing our attention to this question is certainly his significant contribution) is an important addition to, but never a replacement for asking moral questions in the spirit of rationality and freedom.
Heidegger claims that the human being as Da-sein can be understood as the “there” (Da) which being (Sein) requires in order to disclose itself. The human being is the unique being whose being has the character of openness toward Being. But men and women can also turn away from being, forget their true selves, and thus deprive themselves of their humanity. This is, in Heidegger’s view, the situation of contemporary humans, who have replaced authentic questioning concerning their existence with ready-made answers served up by ideologies, the mass media, and overwhelming technology. Consequently, Heidegger attempts to bring today’s men and women back to the question of being. At the beginning of the tradition of Western philosophy, the human being was defined as animal rationale, the animal endowed with reason. Since then, reason has become an absolute value which through education brings about a gradual transformation of all spheres of human life. It is not more reason in the modern sense of calculative thinking, Heidegger believes, that we need today, but more openness toward and more reflection on that which is nearest to us—being.
Heidegger’s earlier publications and transcripts of his lectures are being brought out in Gesamtausgabe, the complete edition of his works. The Gesamtausgabe, which is not yet complete and projected to fill about one hundred volumes, is published by Vittorio Klostermann, Frankfurt am Main. The series consists of four divisions: (I) Published Writings 1910-1976; (II) Lectures from Marburg and Freiburg, 1919-1944; (III) Private Monographs and Lectures, 1919-1967; (IV) Notes and Fragments. Below there is a list of the collected works of Martin Heidegger. English translations and publishers are cited with each work translated into English.
W. J. Korab-Karpowicz
Anglo-American University of Prague
Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/heidegge/
Copyright © The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy. All rights reserved.