In philosophy and theology, the word “hell,” in its most general sense, refers to some kind of bad post-mortem state. The English word is apparently derived from an Indo-European word meaning “to cover,” which is associated with burial, and by extension, with a “place of the dead.” Accounts of hell’s nature describe these dimensions:
- The duration of hell: is it temporary or permanent?
- The felt quality of hell: is it a state of consciousness, or lack of consciousness? If the former, what is it like to be in hell?
- The purpose of hell: why do some people go there?
Some Eastern religions teach that after death, people suffer conscious punishment for their sins before eventually being reincarnated. However, this ‘temporary hell’ plays a relatively peripheral role in these religions, which aim primarily at escaping the cycle of rebirth altogether. Therefore, this article concentrates on philosophical issues surrounding the doctrine of hell as it has arisen in the theistic religions of Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. In these, hell is central to traditional eschatological teachings about a last judgment. This is the culminating event of history, in which God bodily resurrects the dead and separates the righteous or saved (those with love for or faith in God) from the wicked, admitting the saved to some kind of heaven or paradise, and damning the wicked to a permanent hell.
Section One explains several alternative understandings of what hell is like. On the traditional Christian model of hell, articulated by some of the West’s most historically significant philosophers and theologians, hell involves permanent, conscious suffering for the purpose of punishing human sin. According to annihilationism, the damned ultimately cease to exist and so are not conscious. According to the free will view of hell, the purpose of hell is to respect the choice of the damned not to be with God in heaven. Finally, according to universalism, there is either no hell at all, or only a temporary hell. Section Two considers the ‘problem of hell’ (which is a particular form of the general philosophical problem of evil): if, as theistic religions traditionally have taught, God is all-powerful, all-knowing and completely good, it seems morally and logically impossible that God would allow anyone to be utterly and ineradicably ruined, as the damned in hell would seem to be. Advocates of the traditional view normally respond to this problem by claiming that hell is a function of impartial divine justice; this line of response is explored in Section Three. Finally, Section Four explains how the free will view deals with the problem of hell.
Table of Contents
- The Nature of Hell
- The Problem of Hell
- Hell and Justice
- Hell and Freedom
- References and Further Reading
The Tanakh/Bible contains various images of the last judgment. One striking picture in Hebrew scripture occurs at the end of Isaiah (66:22-24). [Quotations from the Bible are from the New Revised Standard Version.] Faithful Jews, who will “remain before” God in a prosperous “new heavens and new earth,” “shall go out and look at the dead bodies of the people who have rebelled against [God], for their worm shall not die, their fire shall not be quenched, and they shall be an abhorrence to all flesh.” In the Gospel of Mark (9:48), Jesus appropriates this imagery in describing hell as a place “where their worm never dies, and the fire is never quenched.” In the Gospel of Matthew (25:31-46), Jesus teaches that at the last judgment, those who failed to care for “the least of my family” will “go away into eternal punishment,” which is “the eternal fire prepared for the devil and his angels.” Elsewhere in Matthew (8:12, 22:13, 24:51, and 25:30), Jesus invokes a rather different image, suggesting that hell is “outer darkness” (that is, outside heaven) “where there will be weeping and gnashing of teeth.” He teaches that many will seek to enter heaven but be shut out (Luke 13:22-30), suggesting that there is no way to escape from hell once there. Finally, the Christian Bible’s closing book (Revelation 20:7-15) describes the devil, along with Death, Hades, and “anyone whose name was not found written in the book of life,” being cast “into the lake of fire and sulfur . . . and they will be tormented day and night forever and ever.” The Qur’an teaches that hell is “a prison-house” (17:8) in which “those who disbelieve and act unjustly . . . shall remain forever” (4:168) to receive “a sufficient recompense” (9:68) for their sins. There they will “…burn in hellfire. No sooner will their skins be consumed than [God] shall give them other skins, so that they may truly taste” divine wrath (4:55). [Quotations from the Qur’an are from the translation by N. J. Dawood (Penguin Books, 1974).]
Reflection on these scriptural images has given rise to the traditional view of hell. The passage from Isaiah, in which the residents of hell are dead bodies, suggests that hell is a state of unconscious existence, or perhaps even non-existence. While some of the Gospel passages may fit with this view, the ones about weeping and gnashing of teeth seem to suggest instead that the residents of hell are conscious of their bad condition. Furthermore, the passages from Revelation and the Qur’an suggest that the denizens of hell experience torment (extreme conscious suffering). So, on the traditional view, the felt quality of hell is suffering (this implies that the damned exist and are conscious), and its purpose is to punish those who have failed to live faithfully in this life. With respect to duration, the traditional view teaches that the suffering of hell is not only permanent, but necessarily permanent, because there is no possible way for the damned to escape hell once there as a irreversible consequence of their sins. Different versions of the traditional view spring from different understandings of the suffering involved in hell.
In the harshest version – which takes much of the scriptural imagery literally – hell involves extreme forms of both mental and physical suffering. On the Day of Judgment, the dead will all be physically resurrected, and the bodies of the damned will be consigned to a literal lake of fire. According to Augustine, this fire will cause a physical agony of burning, but will not consume the flesh of the damned, so that their agony will never end. Furthermore, the damned will suffer psychologically: their most powerful desire will be to escape from hell, but they will realize that escape is impossible, and so will experience not only frustration, but despair. Furthermore, as Augustine puts it, they will be “tortured with a fruitless repentance.” (Book 9) Realizing that their own actions have placed them in this miserable position, they will be filled with regret and self-loathing.
Some traditionalists object that the literal view of hell, as a place of physical torment, presents God as sadistic. They prefer to see the scriptural images of fire, darkness, and so forth as potent symbols or metaphors for the psychological suffering of hell. Because humans were made for God, their most fundamental desire (whether they consciously acknowledge it or not) is to enjoy eternal union with God. As a state of eternal separation from God, hell would frustrate this central human desire. Therefore, even if the damned felt physical pleasure, they would still experience psychological suffering: frustration, despair, regret, and self-loathing. This ‘psychological suffering only’ view of hell can be further subdivided into harsher and milder views concerning the extent to which the damned suffer.
On the harsher view of psychological suffering, the torments of hell will cause the damned to see clearly, perhaps for the first time, that they truly desire union with God. Although this epiphany will bring them to genuine repentance and willingness to obey God, it will be ‘too late’ for them to enter heaven, for hell is necessarily an eternal state, from which there is no escape. On the harsh model, the damned really want to leave hell, but can’t.
Although this view fits with some scriptural imagery noted above (in which people try to enter heaven and are turned away), it is difficult to reconcile with the idea that God loves all people, including the damned. It would seem that a truly repentant denizen of hell would have attained the very same psychological state of love for God that the blessed in heaven enjoy. Therefore, it is hard to imagine that a loving God would want to keep such a person in hell (and to suggest that God might want to admit such people to heaven, but be unable to do so, would be to do deny God’s omnipotence).
Against this objection, some may argue that God does not in fact love all people, but only the elect, who are predestined for salvation. Others might point out that heaven is a reward for loving God in the unclear conditions of mortal life; those repenting only after God has made things clear to them would fail to merit heaven in the same way as the blessed (however, this argument would be difficult for many Christians to make, given their stress on the importance of divine grace, rather than individual merit, in the process of salvation).
In the milder view of psychological suffering, while the damned may have a desire to leave hell and enter heaven, they would also wish to remain as they are: self-obsessed, morally vicious, etc. This view contends that the damned continually act on their desire to remain the same, and so are unwilling to repent and submit to God. If they seek to enter into heaven, it is only on their own terms. This is a ‘mild’ version of hell because, though the damned suffer in hell, they do not suffer badly enough to want (all things considered) to leave. In their vicious state, they could not enjoy union with God, and so prefer hell.
The mild view is easier to reconcile with the idea that God loves even the damned; if a denizen of hell were to genuinely repent, God would admit such a person to heaven. Thus, hell will be a permanent state for the damned only because they will never repent. There are two ways to explain why the damned will refuse to repent.
First, they may be unable to repent, because they have lost their freedom to choose what is truly good. In this case, hell is necessarily eternal; it is not possible for the damned to escape from hell once they arrive there. Second, the damned may be able to repent, but remain eternally unwilling to do so. That is, while the damned will actually remain in hell for all eternity, it is possible for their stay in hell to be temporary, since they could repent and be admitted to heaven.
This second explanation of eternal damnation is actually a departure from the traditional view of hell. As noted above, the traditional view teaches that the duration of hell is necessarily eternal because it is not possible for the damned to escape. This second view, according to which hell is eternal, but not necessarily eternal, is discussed here only because it is so close to the traditional view and does not have a widely accepted label. [The closest thing to an established label comes from Kvanvig (1993), which uses the term “second chance theory of hell” for any view denying that it is impossible for the damned to escape hell. See pages 71-73.]
It could be objected that on either version of the mild view, hell is not a form of punishment because it is not imposed on the damned against their will. However, it does not seem that all punishment must be contrary to the will of its recipient. It seems rather that punishment is a negative consequence demanded by justice, regardless of whether or not the one punished wishes to be punished. For example, if justice demands that God remove the ability of the damned to repent, then this removal would seem to be a form of punishment (one which shapes, rather than opposes, the wills of the damned).
Annihilationism (also known as the ‘conditional immortality’ view) teaches that ultimately the damned cease to exist, and so are not conscious for all eternity. Whereas the traditional view is comprehensive in the sense that it specifies the purpose, duration, and the felt quality of hell, annihilationism is a thesis only about the last of these categories. Therefore, it is possible for annihilationists to take different positions on the overall nature of hell. They normally assume that once God annihilates a person, she will never again come into existence; annihilation is a permanent state. However, annihilationists disagree about God’s reason for annihilating the damned. Many see annihilation as retributive punishment for sin, while others think that God annihilates the damned out of love for them (this will be discussed further in section four).
According to annihilationism, the ultimate fate of the damned does not involve suffering (because it is a state of non-existence). However, it is open to annihilationists to assert that God puts the damned through a period of conscious suffering (enough, perhaps, to ‘pay them back’ for their sins) before finally snuffing out their existence. Descriptions of this temporary conscious suffering could vary in harshness along the lines described above for the traditional view.
The best argument for annihilationism derives from the traditional theistic doctrine of divine conservation: all things depend on God to conserve their existence from moment to moment, and so exist only so long as they are connected to God in some way. But if hell is complete and utter separation or disconnection from God, then hell would be a state of non-existence. Against annihilationism, some would object that it is contrary to God’s creative nature to annihilate anything (this will be discussed further in section four).
The free will view is primarily a thesis about the purpose of hell. It teaches that God places the damned in hell not to punish them, but to honor the choices they have freely made. On this view, hell originates not so much from divine justice as from divine love.
According to the free will view, one of God’s purposes in creation is to establish genuine love-based relationships between God and humans, and within the human community. But love is a relation that can exist only between people who are genuinely free. Therefore, God gives people freedom in this life to decide for themselves whether or not they will reciprocate God’s love by becoming the people God created them to be. People freely choose how they act, and through these choices they shape their moral character (a collection of stable tendencies to think, feel, and act, in certain ways). Those who develop a vicious character suffer psychologically, both in this life and in the life to come, for in the afterlife, people will keep the character they have developed in this life. So the suffering of hell consists (at the least) in living with one’s own bad character.
The question may arise: Why does God not simply alter the character of vicious people after they die, so that they become virtuous and God-loving denizens of heaven? Some would argue that such alteration would be too radical to preserve personal identity over time: the person admitted to heaven, though in many ways similar to the original vicious person, would not be numerically the same person because of serious differences in moral character; in altering the vicious person, God would be, in effect, annihilating her and replacing her with a numerically distinct virtuous counterpart. Against this argument, it could be claimed that even if instantaneous transformation would undermine personal identity, an omnipotent God could surely transform vicious people through a more gradual process that preserves personal identity. But even if it is possible, adherents of the free will view would consider such divinely-engineered transformation deeply inconsistent with the divine plan. For if God remade vicious people into saints, the humans’ new attitude toward God would not be truly their own, thus removing the genuineness of the love relationship between God and creature.
The free will view’s emphasis on character formation leads quite naturally to the Roman Catholic doctrine of purgatory. Because of their bad character, vicious people cannot have an afterlife entirely devoid of suffering. Those in purgatory, though initially vicious, are able and willing to repent, freely receiving a good character from God; therefore their suffering is temporary and they eventually enter into heaven. Those in hell, on the other hand, are either unable or unwilling to repent; the only afterlife God can give such people is an afterlife of self-inflicted suffering.
One pressing question for the free will view is why God gives the damned an afterlife at all, rather than simply letting them cease to exist at death (a version of annihilationism). This, and other objections to the free will view, will be discussed in section four.
Like annihilationism, the free will view is not a comprehensive view of hell, and so is subject to variation. It can be combined with either the claim that the damned suffer consciously for all eternity, or the claim that they are (eventually) annihilated. Another point of variation concerns post-mortem freedom: some teach that the damned have the ability after death to continue freely choosing and shaping their character, while others claim that the damned are locked into their vicious characters, unable to change.
Strictly speaking, universalism is not a view of what hell is like, but it is nevertheless an important view relevant to any discussion of hell. Universalism teaches that all people will ultimately be with God in heaven. There are two main versions of the view. According to necessary universalism, it is not possible for anyone to be eternally separated from God; necessarily, all are saved. According to contingent universalism, while it is possible that people could use their free will to reject God forever, no one will actually do this; eventually, everyone will say yes to God’s love. While it would be consistent with the basic universalist thesis to say that all people go immediately to heaven upon death, most universalists (in an effort to incorporate scriptural warnings about hell) insist that many people will undergo a temporary period of post-mortem suffering before entering heaven. This period of suffering, which could be seen as a temporary hell or as a kind of purgatory, could be motivated either by divine justice, as in the traditional view of hell, or by divine love, as in the free will view.
Atheists have leveled two different ‘arguments from evil’ against the existence of God (see Evil, Evidential Problem of, and Evil, Logical Problem of). According to the evidential argument from evil, we would not expect a world created by a necessarily omnipotent, omniscient, morally perfect being (that is, an ‘omniperfect’ God) to contain suffering of the kinds and amounts that we actually experience; therefore, though the suffering (i.e. evil) we see does not logically imply the non-existence of an omniperfect God, it does count as evidence against God’s existence. According to the logical argument from evil, it is not even logically possible for an omniperfect God to coexist with evil. Given the evident existence of evil, it is impossible for there to be an omniperfect God. Furthermore, since religious belief systems normally assert the existence of both God and evil, they are internally incoherent.
The problem of hell is a version of the logical problem of evil, and can be stated thus:
(1) An omniperfect God would not damn anyone to hell without having a morally sufficient reason (that is, a very good reason based on moral considerations) to do so.
(2) It is not possible for God to have a morally sufficient reason to damn anyone.
(3) Therefore, it is not possible for God to damn anyone to hell.
This argument concludes that if there is an omniperfect God—one that necessarily has the perfection of Goodness—then no one will be damned. Therefore traditional theological systems, which insist on both damnation and God’s omniperfection, are incoherent and must be revised. Theologians must give up either the doctrine of damnation or the traditional understanding of God as omniperfect.
In light of the above argument, those who retain their belief in God’s omniperfection have two options: embrace necessary universalism, or challenge the soundness of the argument. The argument is valid, so those who wish to reject it must deny one of its premises.
The argument’s first premise seems to follow from the nature of the relevant divine attributes. To say that a being is morally perfect is (in part) to say that such a being would not want any suffering to occur unless there were a morally sufficient reason for it to occur. God’s omnipotence and omniscience imply that God has knowledge and power sufficient to ensure that things happen only if God wants them to happen. So it seems that a perfectly good, omnipotent, and omniscient being would not allow suffering – particularly of the extreme sort associated with damnation – unless there was a very good moral justification for allowing it.
The second premise of the argument is much more controversial, however. Anti-universalists (i.e. those who affirm both divine omniperfection and damnation) have denied the premise in two different ways. The first is simply to deny that, given our finite minds, we can be sure that (2) is true. Is it not at least possible for God to have a morally sufficient reason for allowing damnation? Perhaps there is some great good (which we cannot now, and perhaps never will, grasp) that God cannot realize without the damnation of souls. Leibniz (c. 1672) suggests one possible example of such a good: the overall perfection of the universe. It may be that God brings about the damnation of some because preventing their damnation would have made the overall story of the universe less good. While a view such as Leibniz’s may be appealing to moral utilitarians, people with more Kantian moral intuitions will object that a God who pursues the perfection of the universe (or any other unseen good) at the expense of the damned is not morally perfect at all, but is instead using the damned as a mere means to divine ends (see Kant’s Ethics).
Second, anti-universalists can claim that (2) is certainly false because we know of a morally sufficient reason for God to allow damnation. They have proposed two such reasons. The first, and historically the most popular, is justice: if God failed to damn the wicked, God would be acting unjustly—acting in collusion with the wicked—and so would be morally imperfect. The second, more popular in the last century, is freedom: if God necessitated the salvation of everyone, then God would be removing human freedom to say “no” to God in an ultimate way, and consequently the value of saying “yes” to God would be significantly diminished.
Many defenders of the traditional view of hell claim that though God is loving, God is also just, and justice demands the eternal punishment of those who sin against God. However, others often object that far from demanding damnation, justice would prohibit it, since there would be a discrepancy between the temporary, finite crimes committed by the sinner and the everlasting, infinite punishment inflicted by God. Some see such reasoning as favoring annihilationism: if hell is punishment, then it must involve (at most) a finite amount of conscious suffering followed by annihilation. On the other hand, capital punishment (the earthly analogue of annihilation) is usually considered a more serious punishment than life imprisonment without parole (which could be considered analogous to eternal conscious punishment).
The following ‘infinite seriousness’ argument aims to show that justice not only permits God to damn some (contra the objection above), but actually demands it.
(4) Other things being equal, the seriousness of a crime increases as the status (the degree of importance or value) of its victim increases.
(5) God has an infinitely high status.
(6) Therefore, crimes against God are infinitely serious (from (4) and (5)).
(7) All sin is a crime against God.
(8) Therefore, all sin is infinitely serious (from (6) and (7)).
(9) The more serious a crime is, the more serious its punishment should be.
(10) Therefore, all sin should receive an infinitely serious punishment (from (8) and (9)).
Premise (9) is relatively uncontroversial, because it seems to be just cashing out part of what we mean when we talk about the “seriousness” of a crime. To say that a crime is not serious is (in part) to say that does not merit a serious punishment; to say that a crime is moderately serious is to say that it deserves a moderately severe penalty, and so on. Premise (5) is also uncontroversial, since an infinitely perfect being would seem to have infinite value and importance. However, some of the other premises of the infinite seriousness argument are subject to dispute.
At first glance, (7) may seem false: how can Smith’s theft of Jones’ wallet wrong God, especially if Smith is unaware of God’s existence and so cannot intend the theft to be directed against God? However, many believe that when one person is sufficiently precious to, and dependent upon, another, a wrong committed against the first person automatically wrongs the second. For example, harm done to an infant is arguably also harm done to the infant’s mother. But if all things depend on God for their continued existence, and all people are precious to God, then by the same principle it would seem that God is wronged by all sin, even if the sinner does not intend to wrong God.
Premise (4), which claims that seriousness of a crime is a function not only of the nature of the crime itself and the harm it causes, but also of the status of the victim(s) wronged by the crime, seems to fit with some widely shared moral intuitions. For example, other things being equal, killing a human (a higher status victim) seems to be a much more serious crime than killing a neighbor’s dog (a lower status victim). However, when the harm against a victim is indirect (e.g., by means of harming someone precious to the victim), it is not clear that the victim’s status is relevant to the seriousness of the crime. Other things being equal, killing a saint’s best friend seems no worse than killing a criminal’s, even though the saint would arguably enjoy a higher social status. On the other hand, this may not be a genuine counterexample to the first premise, because saints and criminals are both of the same natural kind (humanity); perhaps all the infinite seriousness argument needs is a principle according to which harms against beings of more ontologically perfect kinds are more serious than harms against beings of less perfect kinds.
Finally, as Jonathon Kvanvig (1993) notes, factors such as the criminal’s intentions are relevant to determining the appropriate degree of punishment for a crime. For example, premeditated murder is normally considered more serious than murder committed in a fit of passion. Therefore, it seems that not all sin deserves the same degree of punishment, even if all sin is against God. Insofar as damnation would inflict the same punishment (eternal separation from God) for all sin, it would be fundamentally unjust. This objection would seem to vitiate even annihilationist conceptions of hell, if they see annihilation as punishment. In response, it could be suggested that although all the damned are given an infinitely lengthy punishment, more serious criminals are placed in more harsh conditions. Or perhaps it could be claimed that although not all sins deserve infinite punishment, everyone commits at least one infinitely serious sin at some point in life, and so would deserve infinite punishment.
Even if the infinite seriousness argument is sound, the idea of divine mercy creates difficulties for a defense of the traditional view of damnation, as follows. Suppose that every person deserves damnation. Theistic religions teach that God is willing to forgive the sins of the faithful, so that they will not receive their just punishment. But if God is able and willing to forgo the punishment in one case, why not in all cases? There are two main (seemingly incompatible) responses to this question. Some claim that if God were to forgive everyone, this would display God’s mercy, but not God’s justice. Therefore, because God seeks to reveal all the divine attributes, God cannot will the salvation of all. Others insist that although God is willing to forgive everybody, not everyone is willing to ask for, or accept, God’s forgiveness, resulting in self-inflicted retribution.
Because the traditional view of hell understands the purpose of damnation to be retribution for sin, it would seem to stand or fall with the infinite seriousness argument. As discussed at the end of section one, however, those who see hell as an expression of divine love have proposed an entirely different morally sufficient reason for God to allow damnation: respect for freedom. In the free will view, damnation is the only possible way for God to honor the freedom of the damned. To force the sinners into heaven against their wills would not, in this view, be an act of Divine love. Instead, God respects human autonomy by allowing us to shape our character through our own free choices, and by refusing to unilaterally change the character we have chosen; if in this life, we freely develop into morally vicious and miserable people, then that is how God will allow us to remain for eternity.
But if the only possible eternity open to the damned is one of fundamental ruin and despair, why would God give them a never-ending afterlife? Would it not be more loving of God to let the damned cease to exist at death (or, if justice demands it, after a temporary postmortem period of punishment)? The two main versions of the free will view require different lines of response to this question. Those who deny post-mortem freedom might insist that only the guaranteed existence of an eternal afterlife (good or bad) can render our ante-mortem choices truly momentous. Therefore, to guarantee the importance of our earthly freedom, God must give an afterlife to everyone. For those who affirm post-mortem freedom, God gives the damned a never-ending afterlife (at least in part) so that they can continue to choose whether to accept or reject God’s love. Indeed, some who defend the free will view suggest that because our earthly freedom and knowledge with respect to God are often very limited (indeed, because God’s very existence is not evident to many), no one would be in a position to make a truly decisive choice for or against God until the afterlife, in a situation where the agent had a clearer understanding of what was at stake. The subsequent discussion will focus on versions of the free will view that posit post-mortem choice.
The free will view assumes an incompatibilist account of free will, according to which a person is genuinely free with respect to her choices only if she (or an event involving her) is the ultimate causal determinant of those choices. Therefore, if God causally determined denizens of hell to repent, then God—rather than the humans—would be the ultimate determining cause of the repentence, and the humans would not be the agent of their own repentance. Those that hold the compatibilists view concerning free will and determinism claim that free actions can be causally predetermined, as long as the chain of causes runs through the will and intellect of the free agent in an appropriate way. If compatibilism is correct, then God could determine everyone to enter heaven freely, by first causing them to desire heaven enough to repent. Therefore, in claiming that God cannot both (1) give creatures genuine freedom and (2) guarantee that all will be saved , the free will view relies on incompatibilism, which is a very controversial view. For more on the compatibilist/incompatibilist controversy, see the entry on Free Will.
Even if an incompatibilist notion of freedom is taken for granted, it is not clear that the desire to honor human free choices would provide God with a morally sufficient reason to allow damnation. To see why, consider an analogous human situation. Perhaps parents should, out of respect for their children’s freedom, allow them to harm themselves in relatively insignificant ways. But as the degree of self-harm increases, it becomes less and less clear that non-intervention is the loving parental policy. Could it ever be truly loving to allow one’s child to, say, commit suicide? If the child were very young, or did not clearly understand the nature or consequences of her choice, then it would seem clearly wrong for the parent not to do everything in her power to stop the suicide. But if the child is both fully mature and fully cognizant of her choice and its ramifications, then some would consider parental intervention a violation of the child’s rightful autonomy. Insofar as the free will view appeals to God’s respect for the freedom and autonomy of the damned, it seems to conceive of the damned as related to God in something like the way an adult child is related to a parent. Those who see humans as more like infants in relation to God – because of the vast gap between divine and human power – will probably not be persuaded by the free will view.
Another possible objection to the free will view concerns the relationship between freedom and rationality. Free choices, if they are to have any real value, must be more than simply random or uncaused events—they must be explicable in terms of reasons. Free action must be a species of rational action. But there seems to be no reason to choose eternal suffering (or non-existence) over an eternity of bliss. The choice to remain in hell would be utterly irrational, and so could not count as a genuinely free choice. Defenders of the free will view would likely counter this objection by distinguishing between objective and subjective reasons. If people amass enough false beliefs, then what is in fact bad or harmful can seem good or beneficial to them. So perhaps the choice to remain in hell, while admittedly not objectively rational, could be motivated by the damned person’s subjective reasons (that is, by how things seem to him or her). Even if this line of defense is successful, it leaves open questions about the value of freedom in such cases: is it really a good thing for agents to have the power to act in ways that bring about their own objective ruin?
Although the freedom view does not rule out the traditional picture of hell as eternal existence apart from God, some would argue that it requires openness to other possibilities as well. What would happen, for example, if the damned hated God to such an extent that they would prefer non-existence to retaining even the slightest dependence on God? It would seem that God as depicted in the free will view would (out of respect for the freedom of the damned) give them what they wished for, unless there were a good reason not to. Thus, in the freedom view it would seem possible that the damned may end in annihilation. Hell would then be disjunctive: it could involve eternal conscious suffering or annihilation. Advocates of the free will view who favor a more traditional conception of hell can respond to the foregoing argument by positing some reason for God not to honor a damned person’s choice for annihilation. Here are four possible responses.
First, some suggest that souls, once created, are intrinsically immortal, and cannot be destroyed even by God. Most theists would not find this suggestion plausible, however, because it seems to do away with divine omnipotence.
Second, perhaps annihilating the damned would violate God’s moral principles. According to Stump (1986), Aquinas believed that being and goodness are convertible, and so considered morality to require that God never destroy a being unless doing so would promote an even greater level of being/goodness. Since annihilating a damned soul would decrease being without a compensating increase in being elsewhere in the universe, God is morally bound not to do it. This view could be criticized (as was Leibniz’s view above) for giving insufficient weight to the idea that God is first and foremost good to individuals, and only secondarily concerned with abstract issues like the amount of being in the universe.
Third, God might refuse to annihilate the damned because it is better for them (regardless of global considerations) to go on existing, because existence itself is a significant good for those who enjoy it. On the other hand, in using phrases like “a fate worse than death,” people seem to presuppose that the goodness of existence can be outweighed by negative features of existence. Therefore, if the sufferings of hell are serious enough, they could make continued existence there even worse for the damned than non-existence. So whether we consider this third suggestion (that eternal conscious separation from God is better for the damned than annihilation) to be plausible will depend on how bad we consider non-existence to be, and how bad we consider the felt quality of hell to be.
Fourth, God might refuse to annihilate the damned out of hope. This claim could be endorsed even by those who believe that an eternity of conscious separation from God would be worse than non-existence. We would think it right to interfere in the attempted suicide of a young person with temporary depression, because of her hope for a brighter future. Similarly, it would seem right for God to keep the damned in existence (even if this existence is temporarily worse than non-existence for them) if there were some hope that they might repent. Out of respect for freedom, God would not unilaterally alter the character of the damned so as to cause their repentance, but out of love and hope God would refuse to allow the damned to extinguish the possibility of reconciliation. If God allows the damned to continue in their suffering only out of hope that they may repent, then no one (not even God) can be certain that the damned will go on suffering eternally. For if God knew (through middle knowledge) that the damned would never freely repent, then God would have no reason to prolong their suffering.
For those who favor the fourth explanation over the first three, the freedom view faces a dilemma regarding the eternity of hell. On the one hand, if there is no hope that the damned will repent, God would seem to have no reason not to honor their (possible) choice for annihilation, thus rendering hell (understood as a state of conscious suffering) possibly temporary. On the other hand, if there is hope that a person in hell will repent, then while God would not honor a choice for annihilation, there is still the possibility for hell to be temporary, since a person who fully repented would eventually go to heaven. On this latter, hopeful, scenario, hell becomes not a place of everlasting retributive punishment, but a place of indefinitely long therapeutic punishment, aimed at the ultimate reconciliation of sinners with God. While it remains possible that some people will in fact hold out against God forever, on the freedom view the functional role of hell is very similar to that of purgatory in Roman Catholic theology: a state of being aimed at leading a person to heaven, through the removal of character flaws that would prevent her from enjoying beatific intimacy with God. The main difference is that the inhabitants of purgatory are certainly destined to join with God in heaven, while the inhabitants of hell face an uncertain future.
- Adams, Marilyn M. (1993) ‘The Problem of Hell: A Problem of Evil for Christians’, in E. Stump (ed.) Reasoned Faith, A Festschrift for Norman Kretzmann, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 301–27.
- An explanation of the problem of hell, advocating for universalism.
- Augustine, City of God, Book 21.
- Articulates and defends a literal version of the traditional Christian view of hell.
- Crockett, William, ed. (1997) Four Views on Hell. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans Publishing Co.
- Advocates of the literal view, the psychological view, annihilationism, and purgatory take turns explaining their own views and responding to the views of the others.
- Kvanvig, Jonathan L. (1993) The Problem of Hell. New York: Oxford University Press.
- An extremely thorough study of philosophical issues surrounding the problem of hell; argues at length against a retributive model of hell and in favor of love as the divine motivation for hell.
- Leibniz, G. W. (c. 1672) The Philosopher’s Confession.
- Proposes a ‘best possible world’ defense of damnation.
- Lewis, C.S. (1946) The Great Divorce. London: MacMillan.
- A psychologically astute fictional story about heaven and hell; it assumes something like the free will view.
- Stump, Eleonore (1986) ‘Dante’s Hell, Aquinas’s Moral Theory, and the Love of God’, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 16:181-196.
- Attributes a version of the free will view to Dante and shows that it can be defended on Aquinas’ moral principles.
- Swinburne, Richard (1983) ‘A Theodicy of Heaven and Hell’, The Existence & Nature of God, ed. Alfred J. Freddoso, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press. pp. 37-54.
- An articulation and defense of the free will view highlighting the importance of character formation; considers annihilation as well as eternal existence as possibilities for the damned.
- Talbott, Thomas B. (1999) The Inescapable Love of God. Universal Publishers.
- An extended argument for universalism.
- Walls, Jerry (1992) Hell: The Logic of Damnation. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
- A defense of the free will view, emphasizing the need for postmortem choice.
C. P. Ragland
Saint Louis University
Last updated: May 24, 2008 | Originally published: May/24/2008
Categories: Philosophy of Religion