Carl Hempel, a German-born philosopher who immigrated to the United States, was one of the prominent philosophers of science in the twentieth century. His paradox of the ravens—as an illustration of the paradoxes of confirmation—has been a constant challenge for theories of confirmation. Together with Paul Oppenheim, he proposed a quantitative account of degrees of confirmation of hypotheses by evidence. His deductive-nomological model of scientific explanation put explanations on the same logical footing as predictions; they are both deductive arguments. The difference is a matter of pragmatics, namely that in an explanation the argument’s conclusion is intended to be assumed true whereas in a prediction the intention is make a convincing case for the conclusion. Hempel also proposed a quantitative measure of the power of a theory to systematize its data.Later in his life, Hempel abandoned the project of an inductive logic. He also emphasized the problems with logical positivism (logical empiricism), especially those concerning the verifiability criterion. Hempel eventually turned away from the logical positivists’ analysis of science to a more empirical analysis in terms of the sociology of science.
Hempel studied mathematics, physics, and philosophy in Gottingen, Heidelberg, Vienna, and Berlin. In Vienna, he attended some of the meetings of the Vienna Circle. With the help of Rudolf Carnap , he managed to leave Europe before the Second World War, and he came to Chicago on a research grant secured by Carnap. He later taught at the City University of New York, Yale University and Princeton University.
One of the leading members of logical positivism, he was born in Oranienburg, Germany, in 1905. Between March 17 and 24, 1982, Hempel gave an interview to Richard Nolan; the text of that interview was published for the first time in 1988 in Italian translation (Hempel, “Autobiografia intellettuale” in Oltre il positivismo logico, Armando: Rome, Italy, 1988). This interview is the main source of the following biographical notes.
Hempel studied at the Realgymnasium at Berlin and, in 1923, he was admitted at the University of Gottingen where he studied mathematics with David Hilbert and Edmund Landau and symbolic logic with Heinrich Behmann. Hempel was very impressed with Hilbert’s program of proving the consistency of mathematics by means of elementary methods; he also studied philosophy, but he found mathematical logic more interesting than traditional logic. The same year he moved to the University of Heidelberg, where he studied mathematics, physics, and philosophy. From 1924, Hempel studied at Berlin, where he met Reichenbach who introduced him to the Berlin Circle. Hempel attended Reichenbach’s courses on mathematical logic, the philosophy of space and time, and the theory of probability. He studied physics with Max Planck and logic with von Neumann.
In 1929, Hempel took part in the first congress on scientific philosophy organized by logical positivists. He meet Carnap and—very impressed by Carnap—moved to Vienna where he attended three courses with Carnap, Schlick, and Waismann, and took part in the meetings of the Vienna Circle. In the same years, Hempel qualified as teacher in the secondary school and eventually, in 1934, he gained the doctorate in philosophy at Berlin, with a dissertation on the theory of probability. In the same year, he immigrated to Belgium, with the help of a friend of Reichenbach, Paul Oppenheim (Reichenbach introduced Hempel to Oppenheim in 1930). Two years later, Hempel and Oppenheim published the book Der Typusbegriff im Lichte der neuen Logik on the logical theory of classifier, comparative and metric scientific concepts.
In 1937, Hempel was invited—with the help of Carnap—to the University of Chicago as Research Associate in Philosophy. After another brief period in Belgium, Hempel immigrated to the United States in 1939. He taught in New York, at City College (1939-1940) and at Queens College (1940-1948). In those years, he was interested in the theory of confirmation and explanation, and published several articles on that subject: “A Purely Syntactical Definition of Confirmation,” in The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 8, 1943; “Studies in the Logic of Confirmation” in Mind, 54, 1945; “A Definition of Degree of Confirmation” (with P. Oppenheim) in Philosophy of Science, 12, 1945; “A Note on the Paradoxes of Confirmation” in Mind, 55, 1946; “Studies in the Logic of Explanation” (with P. Oppenheim) in Philosophy of Science, 15, 1948.
Between 1948 and 1955, Hempel taught at Yale University. His work Fundamentals of Concept Formation in Empirical Science was published in 1952 in the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science. From 1955, he taught at the University of Princeton. Aspects of Scientific Explanation and Philosophy of Natural Science were published in 1965 and 1966 respectively. After the pensionable age, he continued teaching at Berkley, Irvine, Jerusalem, and, from 1976 to 1985, at Pittsburgh. In the meantime, his philosophical perspective was changing and he detached from logical positivism: “The Meaning of Theoretical Terms: A Critique of the Standard Empiricist Construal” in Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science IV (ed. by Patrick Suppes), 1973; “Valuation and Objectivity in Science” in Physics, Philosophy and Psychoanalysis (ed. by R. S. Cohen and L. Laudan), 1983; “Provisoes: A Problem Concerning the Inferential Function of Scientific Theories” in Erkenntnis, 28, 1988. However, he remained affectionately joined to logical positivism. In 1975, he undertook the editorship (with W. Stegmüller and W. K. Essler) of the new series of the journal Erkenntnis. Hempel died November 9, 1997, in Princeton Township, New Jersey.
Hempel and Oppenheim’s essay “Studies in the Logic of Explanation,” published in volume 15 of the journal Philosophy of Science, gave an account of the deductive-nomological explanation. A scientific explanation of a fact is a deduction of a statement (called the explanandum) that describes the fact we want to explain; the premises (called the explanans) are scientific laws and suitable initial conditions. For an explanation to be acceptable, the explanans must be true.
According to the deductive-nomological model, the explanation of a fact is thus reduced to a logical relationship between statements: the explanandum is a consequence of the explanans. This is a common method in the philosophy of logical positivism. Pragmatic aspects of explanation are not taken into consideration. Another feature is that an explanation requires scientific laws; facts are explained when they are subsumed under laws. So the question arises about the nature of a scientific law. According to Hempel and Oppenheim, a fundamental theory is defined as a true statement whose quantifiers are not removable (that is, a fundamental theory is not equivalent to a statement without quantifiers), and which do not contain individual constants. Every generalized statement which is a logical consequence of a fundamental theory is a derived theory. The underlying idea for this definition is that a scientific theory deals with general properties expressed by universal statements. References to specific space-time regions or to individual things are not allowed. For example, Newton’s laws are true for all bodies in every time and in every space. But there are laws (e.g., the original Kepler laws) that are valid under limited conditions and refer to specific objects, like the Sun and its planets. Therefore, there is a distinction between a fundamental theory, which is universal without restrictions, and a derived theory that can contain a reference to individual objects. Note that it is required that theories are true; implicitly, this means that scientific laws are not tools to make predictions, but they are genuine statements that describe the world—a realistic point of view.
There is another intriguing characteristic of the Hempel-Oppenheim model, which is that explanation and prediction have exactly the same logical structure: an explanation can be used to forecast and a forecast is a valid explanation. Finally, the deductive-nomological model accounts also for the explanation of laws; in that case, the explanandum is a scientific law and can be proved with the help of other scientific laws.
Aspects of Scientific Explanation, published in 1965, faces the problem of inductive explanation, in which the explanans include statistical laws. According to Hempel, in such kind of explanation the explanans give only a high degree of probability to the explanandum, which is not a logical consequence of the premises. The following is a very simple example.
The relative frequency of P with respect to Q is r
The object a belongs to P
Thus, a belongs to Q
The conclusion “a belongs to Q” is not certain, for it is not a logical consequence of the two premises. According to Hempel, this explanation gives a degree of probability r to the conclusion. Note that the inductive explanation requires a covering law: the fact is explained by means of scientific laws. But now the laws are not deterministic; statistical laws are admissible. However, in many respects the inductive explanation is similar to the deductive explanation.
During his research on confirmation, Hempel formulated the so-called paradoxes of confirmation. Hempel’s paradoxes are a straightforward consequence of the following apparently harmless principles:
Hence, (~Ra & ~Ba), which confirms (x)(~Bx → ~Rx), also supports (x)(Rx → Bx). Now suppose Rx means “x is a raven” and Bx means “x is black.” Therefore, “a isn’t a raven and isn’t black” confirms “all ravens are black.” That is, the observation of a red fish supports the hypothesis that all ravens are black.
Note also that the statement (x)((~Rx ∨ Rx) → (~Rx ∨ Bx)) is equivalent to (x)(Rx → Bx). Thus, (~Ra ∨ Ba) supports “all ravens are black” and hence the observation of whatever thing which is not a raven (tennis-ball, paper, elephant, red herring) supports “all ravens are black.”
In his monograph Fundamentals of Concept Formation in Empirical Science (1952), Hempel describes the methods according to which physical quantities are defined. Hempel uses the example of the measurement of mass.
An equal-armed balance is used to determine when two bodies have the same mass and when the mass of a body is greater than the mass of the other. Two bodies have the same mass if, when they are on the pans, the balance remains in equilibrium. If a pan goes down and the other up, then the body in the lowest pan has a greater mass. From a logical point of view, this procedure defines two relations, say E and G, so that:
The relations E and G satisfy the following conditions:
E(a,b) G(a,b) G(b,a)
Relations E and G thus define a partial order.
The second step consists in defining a function m which satisfies the following three conditions:
m(a © b) = m(a) + m(b)
Conditions (1)-(7) describe the measurement not only of mass but also of length, of time and of every extensive physical quantity. (A quantity is extensive if there is an operation which combines the objects according to condition 7, otherwise it is intensive; temperature, for example, is intensive.)
In “The Meaning of Theoretical Terms” (1973), Hempel criticizes an aspect of logical positivism’s theory of science: the distinction between observational and theoretical terms and the related problem about the meaning of theoretical terms. According to Hempel, there is an implicit assumption in neopositivist analysis of science, namely that the meaning of theoretical terms can be explained by means of linguistic methods. Therefore, the very problem is how can a set of statements be determined that gives a meaning to theoretical terms. Hempel analyzes the various theories proposed by logical positivism.
According to Schlick, the meaning of theoretical concepts is determined by the axioms of the theory; the axioms thus play the role of implicit definitions. Therefore, theoretical terms must be interpreted in a way that makes the theory true. But according to such interpretation—Hempel objects—a scientific theory is always true, for it is true by convention, and thus every scientific theory is a priori true. This is a proof—Hempel says—that Schlick’s interpretation of the meaning of theoretical terms is not tenable. Also the thesis which asserts that the meaning of a theoretical term depends on the theory in which that term is used is, according to Hempel, untenable.
Another solution to the problem of the meaning of theoretical terms is based on the rules of correspondence (also known as meaning postulates). They are statements in which observational and theoretical terms occur. Theoretical terms thus gain a partial interpretation by means of observational terms. Hempel raises two objections to this theory. First, he asserts that observational concepts do not exist. When a scientific theory introduces new theoretical terms, they are linked with other old theoretical terms that usually belong to another already consolidated scientific theory. Therefore, the interpretation of new theoretical terms is not based on observational terms but it is given by other theoretical terms that, in a sense, are more familiar than the new ones. The second objection is about the conventional nature of rules of correspondence. A meaning postulate defines the meaning of a concept and therefore, from a logical point of view, it must be true. But every statement in a scientific theory is falsifiable, and thus there is no scientific statement which is beyond the jurisdiction of experience. So, a meaning postulate can be false as well; hence, it is not conventional and thus it does not define the meaning of a concept but it is a genuine physical hypothesis. Meaning postulates do not exist.
“Provisoes: A Problem concerning the Inferential Function of Scientific Theories,” published in Erkenntnis (1988), criticizes another aspect of logical positivism’s theory of science: the deductive nature of scientific theories. It is very interesting that a philosopher who is famous for his deductive model of scientific explanation criticized the deductive model of science. At least this fact shows the open views of Hempel. He argues that it is impossible to derive observational statements from a scientific theory. For example, Newton’s theory of gravitation cannot determine the position of planets, even if the initial conditions are known, for Newton’s theory deals with the gravitational force, and thus the theory cannot forecast the influences exerted by other kinds of force. In other words, Newton’s theory requires an explicit assumption—a provisoe, according to Hempel—which assures that the planets are subjected only to the gravitational force. Without such hypothesis, it is impossible to apply the theory to the study of planetary motion. But this assumption does not belong to the theory. Therefore, the position of planets is not determined by the theory, but it is implied by the theory plus appropriate assumptions. Accordingly, not only observational statements are not entailed by the theory, but also there are no deductive links between observational statements. Hence, it is impossible that an observational statement is a logical consequence of a theory (unless the statement is logically true). This fact has very important consequences.
One of them is that the empirical content of a theory does not exist. Neopositivists defined it as the class of observational statements implied by the theory; but this class is an empty set.
Another consequence is that theoretical terms are not removable from a scientific theory. Known methods employed to accomplish this task assert that, for every theory T, it is possible to find a theory T* without theoretical terms so that an observational statement O is a consequence of T* if and only if it is a consequence of T. Thus, it is possible to eliminate theoretical terms from T without loss of deductive power. But—Hempel argues—no observational statement O is derivable from T, so that T* lacks empirical consequence.
Suppose T is a falsifiable theory; therefore, there is an observational statement O so that ~O → ~T. Hence, T → ~O; so T entails an observational statement ~O. But no observational statement is a consequence of T. Thus, the theory T is not falsifiable. The consequence is that every theory is not falsifiable. (Note: Hempel’s argument is evidently wrong, for according to Popper the negation of an observational statement usually is not an observational statement).
Finally, the interpretation of science due to instrumentalism is not tenable. According to such interpretation, scientific theories are rules of inference, that is, they are prescriptions according to which observational statements are derived. Hempel’s analysis shows that these alleged rules of inference are indeed void.
Last updated: August 19, 2008 | Originally published: