Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Edward Herbert of Cherbury (1583-1648)


Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Truth
  4. Deism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Edward Herbert, was born at Eyton in Shropshire on March 3, 1583. He is the representative of a branch of the noble Welsh family of that name, and the elder brother of George Herbert the poet. He matriculated at University College, Oxford, in 1595, married in 1599, and continued to reside at Oxford till about 1600, when he removed to London. He was made a Knight of the Bath soon after the accession of King James. From 1608 to 1618 he spent most of his time on the continent as a soldier of fortune, occasionally seeking the company of scholars in the intervals of his campaigns, chases, or duels. In 1619 he was appointed ambassador at Paris; after his recall in 1624 King James rewarded him with an Irish peerage. He was created an English peer as Baron Herbert of Cherbury in 1629. The civil war found him unprepared for decision; but he ultimately saved his property by siding with the parliament. He died in London on 20 August 1648.

2. Writings

His works were historical, literary, and philosophical. His account of the Duke of Buckingham’s expedition an his history of Henry VIII were written with a view to royal favor. The latter was published in 1649; a Latin version of the former appeared in 1658, the English original not till 1860. His literary works — poems and autobiography — are of higher merit. His poems were published by his son in 1665, and his autobiography was first printed by Horace Walpole in 1764. His philosophical works give him a distinct place in the history of thought. His greatest work, De Veritate, was, he tells us, begun in England and “formed there in all its principal parts..” Hugo Grotius, to whom he submitted the manuscript, advised its publication; but it was not till this advice had been sanctioned (as he thought) by a sign from heaven that he had the work printed (Paris, 1624). To the third edition (London, 1645) he added a short treatise De Causis Errorum, a dissertation entitled Religio Laici, and an Appendix ad Sacerdotes. In 1663 appeared his De Religione Gentilium — a treatise on what is now called comparative religion. A popular account of his views on religion was published in 1768 under the title; although the external evidence is incomplete, it may have been from his pen.

3. Truth

Herbert does not stand in the front rank of speculative thinkers; but his claims as a philosopher are worthy of note. Like Francis Bacon he was occupied with the question of method; and his inquiry went deeper, though it was less effective upon philosophical opinion. Bacon investigated the criteria and canons of evidence, whereas Herbert sought to determine the nature and standard of truth. Descartes soon afterwards referred to the question and put it aside, saying of Herbert: “he examines what truth is; for myself, I have never doubted about it, as it seems to me to be a notion so transcendentally clear that it is impossible to ignore it” (letter of Oct. 16, 1639). The problem which Herbert put before himself concerned the conditions of knowledge; and it has bearing upon later thought, though it arises out of traditional views. In the end of the following century Kant said that his own new point of view was due to discarding the belief that “all our cognitions must conform to objects,” which had been “hitherto assumed.” This was, indeed the prevailing doctrine. Perception was held to be a “passio mentis” produced by the activity of the object which impressed its image (or, to use the term which Descartes and Locke made familiar, an idea) upon the mind. this view was rejected by Herbert as decidedly as by Kant, though he did not anticipate the Kantian revolution by assuming that “objects must conform to our cognition.”

The distinction between mind and body had not yet been sharpened and turned into antagonism by the Cartesian dualism. Man is a complex of mind and body, and, according to Herbert, all that is passive in him is body (De Veritate, 3rd ed., p. 72). — though body itself is not purely passive. Mind, however, is never passive. It acts but is not acted upon (ibid. p. 95). Things do not act upon it but are put within the sphere of its operation (ibid. p. 95). Nevertheless, it requires an occasion, or the presence of objects, to awaken its activity, even in its highest operations (ibid. p. 91). Herbert’s expressions are not quite consistent, for this awakening of mental activity is itself an effect upon mind; but perhaps he might have defended his doctrine by appealing to the harmony which exists between faculty and object. For in this lies his fundamental conception — different alike from the traditional view that cognition must conform to objects, and from the Kantian view that objects must conform to cognition. the mental faculty supplies a form analogous to the object as it exists (ibid. p. 97); the object, again,, neither undergoes an alteration of nature nor produces one, but only enters, as it were, into the faculty’s range of view. The whole process is only intelligible on the supposition of a harmony between the world and the human mind. In this harmony the human body, fashioned out of the material of the external world and containing the sense-apparatus which lead to the “inner court” of consciousness, forms the bond of union.

Herbert’s doctrine of the nature of truth rests on this conception of harmony. “Truth,” he says, “is a certain harmony between objects and their analogous faculties” (ibid. p. 68). Four kinds or degrees of truth are distinguished by him: truth of the thing; truth of appearance; truth of concept; and truth of intellect. These seem to be arranged in an ascending scale. The first does not exclude the others; the last includes all the preceding, being the ‘conformity’ of the several ‘conformities’ they involve. The conditions of truth are also made to explain the possibility of error, for the causes of error lie in the intermediate stages between the thing and the intellect. The root of all error is in confusion — in the inappropriate connection of faculty and object — and it is for the intellect to expose the inappropriate connection and so to dissipate the error.

The doctrine arrived at is summed up in seven propositions (ibid. pp. 8-12); and all these hinge upon the postulate that mind corresponds with things not only in their general nature but in all their differences of kind, generic and specific. Every object is cognate to some mental power or faculty, and to every difference in the object there corresponds a different faculty. Herbert attempts no account of nature, and his psychology is only introduced in the interests of his doctrine of truth; but it is clear that there cannot be fewer faculties than there are differences of things. A faculty is defined as any internal force which unfolds a different mode of apprehension (sensus) to a different object (ibid. p. 30); and faculties are spoken of as radii animae, which perceive objects, or rather the image given out by objects, in accordance with mutual analogy. These images may be conveyed by the same sense-apparatus and yet be apprehended by different faculties, as is the case with figure and motion (ibid. p. 78). Hence countless faculties; but their very multiplicity suggests that Herbert cannot have attributed to them the same degree of independence as did the ‘faculty-pschologists’ of a recent generation. They may be said to be simply modes of mental operation; and mind operates differently as different kinds of objects are brought before it, showing always an aspect of its cognitive power analogous to the object.

Reflecting upon the various modes of mental activity, we may arrange these faculties into four classes: natural instinct, internal sense, external sense, and discourse or reasoning. These are not separate powers; and, although Herbert may have sometimes spoken of them as such, another doctrine may be found in his writings. According to this doctrine all mental faculty is regarded as informed in less or greater measure by the intellect, which is itself a manifestation in humans of the universal divine providence. “Our mind,” he says, “is the highest image and type of the divinity, and hence whatever is true or good in us exists in supreme degree in God. Following out this opinion, we believe that the divine image has also communicated itself to the body. but, as in the propagation of light there is growing loss of distinctness as it gets farther from its source, so that divine image, which shines clearly in our living and free unity, first communicates itself to natural instinct or the common reason of its providence, then extends to the numberless internal and external faculties (analogous to particular objects), closes into shade and body, and sometimes seems as it were to retreat into matter itself” (ibid. p. 78).

The name ‘natural instinct’ is badly chosen; but it is not difficult to see what Herbert means by it. In particular, it is the home of those ‘common notions’ (as he calls them) which may be said to underlie all experience and to belong to the nature of intelligence itself. Some of these common notions are formed without any assistance from discourse or the ratiocinative faculty; others are only perfected by the aid of discourse. The former class is distinguished by certain tests or marks. Some of these tests are logical (such as independence, certainty, and necessity); others are psychological (such as priority in time and universality). but it is the last-named mark or “universal consent” that is made by him “the highest rule of natural instinct (ibid. p. 60), and “the highest criterion of truth” (ibid. p. 39).

This appeal to universal consent makes Herbert a precursor of the philosophy of Common Sense, and lays him open to the criticism urged by Locke that there are no truths which can satisfy the test, there being nothing so certain or so generally known that it has not been ignored or denied by some. Herbert made little if any use of the tests by which he might have shown that certain common notions are presupposed in the constitution of experience, and thus failed to carry out the theory of knowledge of which at times he had a clear view.

4. Deism

The common notions are practical as well as theoretical — yield the first principles of morals as well as those of science. but he attempted no complete account of them and limited his investigation o the common notions of religion. To this portion of his work his direct influence as a thinker is chiefly due, for it determined the scope and character of the English Deistical movement. The common notions of religion are, he holds, the following: (1) that there is a supreme Deity; (2) that this Deity ought to be worshipped; (3) that virtue combined with piety is the chief part of divine worship; (4) that men should repent of their sins and turn from them; (5) that reward and punishment follow from the goodness and justice of God, both in this life and after it. These five articles contain the whole doctrine of the true catholic church, that is to say, of the religion of reason. They also formed the primitive religion before the people “gave ear to the covetous and crafty sacerdotal order.” What is contrary to the ‘five points’ is contrary to reason and therefore false; what is beyond reason but not contrary to it may be revealed: but the record of a revelation is not itself revelation but tradition; and the truth of a tradition depends upon the narrator and can never be more than probable.

A separate work — De Religione Gentilium — was devoted to the verification of these results on the field of what is now called comparative religion. In respect of this work the claim may be justly made for Herbert that he was one of the first — if not the first — to make a systematic effort after a comparative study of religions. but he had no idea of the historical development of belief, and he looked upon all actual religions — in so far as they went beyond his five articles — as simply corruptions of the pure and primitive rational worship.

5. References and Further Reading

  • De Veritate, Prout distinguitur a Revelatione, a Verisimili, a Possibili, et a Falso (1633)
  • De Causis Errorum, De Religione Laici, Appendix ad Sacerdotes (1645)
  • Expeditio in ream Insulam (1656)
  • De Religione Gentilium Errorumque apud Eos Causis (1663)
  • A Dialogue between a Tutor and his Pupil (1768)
  • The Life of Edward Lord Herbert of Cherbury, Written by Himself (1764)

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Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: