John Hick is arguably one of the most important and influential philosophers of religion of the second half of the twentieth century. As a British philosopher in the anglo-analytic tradition, Hick did groundbreaking work in religious epistemology, philosophical theology, and religious pluralism.
As a young law student, Hick underwent a strong religious experience that led him to accept evangelical Christianity and to change his career direction to theology and philosophy. This experience would prove not only life-altering but also important for his subsequent philosophical views. Early in his career, Hick argued that Christian faith is based not on propositional evidence but on religious experience. He thus defended Christian faith against the evidentialist criticisms of the then dominant logical positivists. During this stage Hick also developed his Irenaean “soul-making” theodicy in which he argued that God allows evil and suffering in the world in order to develop humans into virtuous creatures capable of following his will.
In the late 1960s, Hick had another set of experiences that dramatically affected his life and work. While working on civil rights issues in Birmingham, he found himself working and worshiping alongside people of other faiths. During this time he began to believe that sincere adherents of other faiths experience the Transcendent just as Christians do, though with variances due to cultural, historical, and doctrinal factors. These experiences led him to develop his pluralistic hypothesis, which, relying heavily on Kant’s phenomenal/noumenal distinction, states that adherents of the major religious faiths experience the ineffable Real through their varying culturally shaped lenses. Hick’s pluralistic considerations then led him to adjust his theological positions, and he subsequently developed interpretations of Christian doctrines, such as the incarnation, atonement, and trinity, not as metaphysical claims but as metaphorical or mythological ones. However, despite Hick’s changes theologically, many of his underlying philosophical positions remained largely intact over the course of his long career.
Hick’s most influential works include Faith and Knowledge, Evil and the God of Love, Death and Eternal Life, The Myth of God Incarnate (ed.), and An Interpretation of Religion. Other of his significant works include Arguments for the Existence of God, God Has Many Names, The Metaphor of God Incarnate, A Christian Theology of Religions, The New Frontier of Religion and Science, and his widely used textbook, Philosophy of Religion.
John Harwood Hick was born in January 1922 to Mark and Aileen Hick in Scarborough, England. The Hick family history involves a Scarborough shipping trade that can be traced back at least as far as the mid-eighteenth century. Hick was a middle child, whose older brother Pentland became an entrepreneur and younger sister Shirley had a successful career in social work. Hick grew up in a working middle-class family in Scarborough, where as a shy boy he had an unfavorable time at the nearby preparatory school, Lisvane. After briefly studying at home with a private tutor, Hick spent two more favorable years (1937-38) at a Quaker boarding school, Bootham, in York. After Bootham, Hick returned to Scarborough to work as an articled clerk for his father’s small law firm, Hick & Hands.
By the age of seventeen, Hick was reading many of the major works of Western philosophy, finding especially fascinating Kant, who would shape his later philosophical pursuits. Hick’s family was not known for academics, despite two notable exceptions from his mother’s side: Benjamin Cocker, who taught philosophy at the University of Michigan in the late nineteenth century, and Hick’s great uncle, Edward Wales Hirst, who taught Christian Ethics at Manchester University and elsewhere. Hirst encouraged Hick to pursue academic philosophy and continued to correspond with him after he decided instead to study law. While still working at Hick & Hands, Hick began commuting twice a week to University College, Hull, to attend law lectures. This was shortly before the outbreak of World War II and the bombing of Britain, and by his second term Hick had moved to a hostel closer to campus in order to study full-time.
Hick’s family was not particularly religious, though his mother and grandmother had both experimented widely in a variety of religious practices, which helped develop in him a keen religious interest from a young age. He had a penchant for leftist, anti-Christian literature of the likes of George Bernard Shaw, H. G. Wells, Bertrand Russell, and others; yet in the midst of the turmoil at the outbreak of the war, Hick found himself turning to evangelical Christianity under the influence of his college friends from the Inter-Varsity Fellowship. Hick writes of his experience:
As a law student at University College, Hull, at the age of eighteen, I underwent a powerful evangelical conversion under the impact of the New Testament figure of Jesus. For several days I was in a state of intense mental and emotional turmoil, during which I became increasingly aware of a higher truth and greater reality pressing in upon me and claiming my recognition and response. At first this was highly unwelcome, a disturbing and challenging demand for nothing less than a revolution in personal identity. But then the disturbing claim became a liberating invitation. The reality that was pressing in upon me was not only awesomely demanding…. but also irresistibly attractive, and I entered with great joy and excitement into the world of Christian faith…. An experience of this kind which I cannot forget, even though it happened forty-two years ago [from 1982], occurred—of all places—on the top deck of a bus in the middle of the city of Hull…. As everyone will be very conscious who can themselves remember such a moment, all descriptions are inadequate. But it was as though the skies opened up and light poured down and filled me with a sense of overflowing joy, in response to an immense transcendent goodness and love. I remember that I couldn’t help smiling broadly—smiling back, as it were, at God – though if any of the other passengers were looking they must have thought that I was a lunatic, grinning at nothing. (Autobiography, 33-34)
Though Hick now views his subsequent evangelical years as something of an anomaly on the span of his intellectual biography, at the time it had a dramatic, life-changing impact. He immediately left law to study for Christian ministry, at first still at Hull but shortly thereafter at Edinburgh. While at Edinburgh he studied philosophy under Norman Kemp Smith, who left an indelible impression on the young Hick.
Hick’s time at Edinburgh was interrupted, however, by World War II. As a conscientious objector—much to the dismay of his father—Hick declined the draft and instead served with the Friends Ambulance Unit in Egypt, Italy and Greece. Upon returning from the war, he resumed at Edinburgh, where he graduated in 1948 before going to Oriel College, Oxford, to earn his doctorate in philosophy. At Oxford Hick studied under H. H. Price, and Hick’s thesis became the basis for his first book, Faith and Knowledge.
Hick then went to Westminster College, Cambridge, in 1950, where for the next three years he studied for the Presbyterian ministry, primarily under theologian H. H. Farmer. At Westminster Hick met his soon-to-be wife, Hazel. After graduating from Westminster, he was inducted as minister of Belford Presbyterian church in the small town of Belford, Northumberland, in August 1953. Later that month he and Hazel were married in the church, where Hick served as minister for two and a half years and where the Hicks had their first daughter, Eleanor, in June 1955.
Hick left Belford for the U.S., where in the spring semester of 1956 he began an assistant professorship in philosophy at Cornell University in Ithaca, New York. The following year he published Faith and Knowledge with Cornell University Press. At the time Cornell’s philosophy faculty included Max Black, Norman Malcolm, and John Rawls, among others, and was known as a center for Wittgensteinian thought. Hick taught at Cornell for three and a half years, but not being himself Wittgensteinian, he looked elsewhere for a teaching position. While at Cornell the Hicks had two sons: Mark, born in 1957, and Peter, born toward the end of their time in Ithaca.
In the fall of 1959, Hick moved from Cornell to the Stuart chair of Christian philosophy at Princeton Theological Seminary. While at Princeton he became the center of controversy with the Presbyterian synod of New Jersey for not affirming—though not necessarily denying—the virgin birth of Christ. The case received national attention and was eventually decided in Hick’s favor, allowing him to remain in his professorship.
In 1963 Hick received the Guggenheim Fellowship as well as a one year S. A. Cooke Bye-Fellowship at Gonville and Caius College, Cambridge, where for the following year he worked on what would become his second monograph, Evil and the God of Love. During his sabbatical at Cambridge, a lectureship in philosophy of religion opened there, to which Hick was appointed. He taught one last semester at Princeton Seminary before moving to Cambridge.
During Hick’s third year at Cambridge, the H. G. Wood chair of philosophy of religion at Birmingham—previously held by Ninian Smart—opened, and Hick received the appointment. It was at Birmingham that Hick’s pluralistic outlook began to take shape, as he spent much of his time outside of class with multi-faith groups working on race issues in and around the city. He writes of his experiences:
As I spent time in mosques, synagogues, gurudwaras and temples as well as churches something very important dawned on me. On the one hand all the externals were different…. And not only the externals, but also the languages, the concepts, the scriptures, the traditions are all different and distinctive. But at a deeper level it seemed evident to me that essentially the same thing was going on in all these different places of worship, namely men and women were coming together under the auspices of some ancient, highly developed tradition which enables them to open their minds and hearts “upwards” toward a higher divine reality which makes a claim on the living of their lives. (Autobiography, 160)
Hick subsequently became heavily involved with the group All Faiths for One Race, working on civil rights issues in and around Birmingham. He also began studying Eastern religions, traveling to India to study Hinduism, Punjab to study Sikhism, and Sri Lanka to study Buddhism. The fruit of this study would be his extensive work, Death and Eternal Life, in which he explores various Eastern and Western conceptions of the afterlife and develops an afterlife hypothesis combining elements from Eastern and Western traditions.
In 1977 Hick became embroiled in further controversy after the publication of his edited work, The Myth of God Incarnate. Hick admits that the title was intentionally provocative as an attempt to open the ideas of the book to a larger audience. In this he succeeded, as the book sold thirty-thousand copies in the first six months and was translated into various languages. During their time at Birmingham, the Hicks also had their youngest son, Mike, who at the age of twenty-four would be killed in a tragic climbing accident in the French Alps.
In 1978 Hick gave a lecture at Claremont Graduate University near Los Angeles and was subsequently offered the position of Danforth professor of philosophy of religion. For his first three years, he split his year between Claremont and Birmingham—even spending the summer of 1980 teaching in South Africa, where he met Desmond Tutu, who would become a life-long friend—but beginning in 1982 Hick moved full-time to Claremont. He spent the next ten years at Claremont teaching, organizing conferences in philosophy of religion, and developing his pluralistic hypothesis, which he would present as his Gifford Lectures in 1986-87 and publish as An Interpretation of Religion in 1989 to much critical praise, including the prestigious Grawemeyer Award. During his time at Claremont, Hick’s pluralism took a less theistic turn, due in large measure to his interaction with Buddhist philosophers in the U.S. and Japan, including his Claremont colleague, Masao Abe.
In 1992, at the age of seventy, Hick retired from Claremont and moved back to Birmingham. In 1996 his wife Hazel died of a sudden massive stroke while Hick was recovering from spinal surgery. Throughout the 1990s he continued to travel often to the U.S. and elsewhere for conferences and lectures. Throughout the 2000s, he became less mobile but still managed to continue academic work, continuing a close relationship with Birmingham University as a Fellow of its Institute for Advanced Research in Arts and Social Sciences and publishing a number of books, including The New Frontier of Religion and Science: Religion, Neuroscience and the Transcendent in 2006, Who or What is God? And Other Investigations in 2008, and Beyond Faith and Doubt: Dialogues on Religion and Reason in 2010. In 2011 the University of Birmingham launched the John Hick Centre for Philosophy of Religion and later the same year awarded him an honorary doctorate of divinity, at which time he gave his last public speech. John Hick died on February 9, 2012, just weeks after celebrating his ninetieth birthday.
Though Hick’s religious views changed significantly throughout his career, most of the themes of his mature religious epistemology are already present in his first work, Faith and Knowledge. Indeed, it would be difficult to overestimate the importance of this work for contemporary religious epistemology. Instead of describing faith as propositional assent to certain beliefs, Hick describes faith as the interpretive element in religious experience or “experiencing-as”—experiencing the world as not only natural and ethical but as the sphere of the religious as well. While Faith and Knowledge can be read as an apologetic for Christian faith, Hick’s explicit aims are more modest. Rather than demonstrating that God does in fact exist, Hick’s aim is to describe how God is known to humans, if God does exist, and how such knowledge relates to other forms of human knowledge. According to Hick, the difference between faith and other forms of knowledge is not one of kind but of the level of reality known. Just as ethical knowledge supervenes on natural knowledge, so too religious knowledge supervenes on both ethical and natural knowledge.
In arguing for his experience-based understanding of faith, Hick discusses prior understandings of faith, rejecting some elements while retaining others. Hick challenges the traditional Christian definitions of faith as a form of propositional belief, either in the Thomist-Catholic form as a matter of a voluntaristic or fideistic intellectual assent to a certain set of divinely revealed doctrinal propositions, or in the modern voluntarist views, represented by Pascal’s wager and the pragmatism of James. Hick is more ambivalent about Kant’s understanding of faith as a postulate from moral judgment. He approvingly cites Hume and Kant’s attacks on natural theology, holding that there are no compelling arguments for God’s existence. However, according to Kant, even though we cannot offer a logical demonstration for belief in God, nevertheless, “For the practical reason, pursuing the summum bonum, must assume that its attainment is possible, and must therefore postulate a Good Will powerful enough to ensure a final apportionment of happiness to virtue” (Faith and Knowledge, 2d ed. [FK], 61). For Kant, faith is thus not a matter of theoretical rationality based on naturally or divinely revealed propositions, but is a matter of practical rationality based on our moral judgments. Hick discusses this line of reasoning in response to a contemporary advocate, Donald Baillie, before ultimately rejecting the conclusion that our moral intuitions can be used as a proof for God’s existence. However, while Hick rejects the inference from our moral intuitions to the existence of God as a proof, he integrates a similar strand from Baillie into his own view, in which “our apprehension of the divine [is] mediated through our apprehension of values” (FK, 68). Building on this insight, Hick discusses Cardinal Newman’s understanding of faith as an “illative sense,” which Hick defines as “the acquired capacity to respond to indefinable indications in a given field and to marshal a mass of apparently unrelated evidences and divine their trend” (FK, 91). While Hick approvingly discusses Newman’s view that faith consists of a “global impression” or “interpretation,” he takes Newman’s view a step further and raises the even more fundamental question of “whether faith, in its primary sense, is rightly regarded as a propositional attitude at all” (FK, 91). It is the view of faith as a propositional attitude—in any of the forms discussed above—that Hick ultimately rejects.
Instead, Hick argues that for the ordinary believer, religious knowledge is gained by experiencing God for oneself. Religious knowledge, then, is mediated through our experience of the world, in much the same way that the rest of the knowledge we have about the world is gained. Hick calls this aspect of our human experience of the world “significance,” which he further defines as “that fundamental and all pervasive characteristic of our conscious experience which de facto constitutes it for us the experience of a ‘world’ and not merely empty void or churning chaos” (FK, 98). Hick then posits the notion of “interpretation” as the “correlative mental activity by which [significance] is apprehended,” stating,
We shall find that interpretation takes place in relation to each of the three main types of existence…. recognized by human thought—the natural, the human, and the divine; and that in order to relate ourselves appropriately to each, a primary and unevidenceable act of interpretation is required which, when directed toward God, has traditionally been termed “faith.” Thus I shall try to show that while the object of religious knowledge is unique, its basic epistemological pattern is that of all our knowing. (FK, 96-97)
Religious interpretation is thus a perception of significance rather than an inference from or to certain propositions. As Hick further explains,
the primary religious perception, or basic act of religious interpretation, is not to be described as either a reasoned conclusion or an unreasoned hunch that there is a God. It is, putatively, an apprehension of the divine presence within the believer’s human experience. It is not an inference to a general truth, but a “divine-human encounter,” a mediated meeting with the living God. (FK, 115)
Religious interpretation, however, is no worse off than any other kind of perception about the world, since, as Hick argues, “we must accept the Kantian thesis that we can be aware only of that which enters into a certain framework of basic relations which is correlated with the structure of our own consciousness” (FK, 98). In other words, once the Kantian paradigm is accepted, it becomes evident that every experience of the world—natural, ethical, and religious—involves an act of interpreting significance. Religious interpretation is simply the highest order of experiencing the world, not something of a different epistemological kind.
Though Hick wrote Faith and Knowledge just as logical positivism was beginning to wane, the logical positivists’ attack upon metaphysics, and theism more specifically, still had enormous residual influence. According to the logical positivists’ verification criterion of cognitive meaning, non-empirical claims are such that they cannot in principle be true or false. Only those claims that can in principle be empirically verified have cognitive meaning. In response to this attack on religious claims, Hick posits the notion of eschatological verification. Eschatological verification is intended to respond to the logical positivists on their own terms by providing a possible scenario in which verification conditions for certain Christian claims obtain, and thus such claims are shown to be cognitively meaningful. So, for the sake of argument, Hick accepts the verification criterion. He then argues that the content of Christian faith can be verified in the afterlife if it is true, though if it is false it cannot be falsified, since there would be no afterlife in which to falsify one’s beliefs. To illustrate his principle of eschatological verification, he offers a parable of two men traveling along a road that one believes leads to a Celestial City and the other believes leads to nowhere. Though they each have the same experiences along the road, the first interprets the experiences as trials to prepare him for the Celestial City, while the other finds the experiences to have no larger meaning. Of the experiences of the travelers in his parable, Hick describes:
During the course of the journey the issue between them is not an experimental one. They do not entertain different expectations about the coming details of the road, but only about its ultimate destination. And yet when they do turn the last corner it will be apparent that one of them has been right all the time and the other wrong. Thus, although the issue between them has not been experimental, it has nevertheless from the start been a real issue. They have not merely felt differently about the road; for one was feeling appropriately and the other inappropriately in relation to the actual state of affairs. Their opposed interpretations of the road constituted genuinely rival assertions, though assertions whose status has the peculiar characteristic of being guaranteed retrospectively by a future crux. (FK, 177-78)
In the same way, Hick argues that the eschatological expectations of the Christian believer provide “an experientially verifiable claim, in virtue of which the belief-system as a whole is established as being factually true-or-false” (FK, 195). He thus argues—contra most logical positivists and Christian believers at the time—that Christian belief is compatible with the logical positivists’ criterion of verification. Though for Hick the world is sufficiently ambiguous to be interpreted theistically or atheistically, nevertheless, “the theistic assertion is indeed—whether true or false—a genuinely factual assertion” (FK, 195).
Whereas logical positivism provided a formidable objection to religious belief in the twentieth century, neuroscience offers a possible objection to religious belief in the twenty-first century. Instead of judging religious language to be meaningless, as logical positivism had done, the objection from neuroscience is that religious experience is delusory. However, just as Hick found the objection of the logical positivists to be unfounded, so too in his more recent work, The New Frontier of Religion and Science, he finds the objection from neuroscience wanting. He protests that neuroscientists themselves often do not have the philosophical acumen necessary to interpret their research and that many philosophers of mind only give token attention to the findings from neuroscience, assuming a naturalistic worldview from the outset. The result is that it is practically taken as fact that neuroscience has proven a materialist view of persons, when in fact the evidence is ambiguous.
Hick concedes that for every mental event there is a corresponding physical event in the brain, but he argues that proving a brain/mind correlation is a far cry from proving brain/mind identity. He further concedes that brain stimulation through drugs, epileptic seizures, and brain surgery may produce non-veridical religious experiences, but he argues that the ability to cause religious hallucinations does nothing to rule out the possibility of authentic religious experiences.
In response to the naturalist objection from neuroscience, Hick takes a brief foray into the philosophy of mind. He argues first that mind/brain identity is extremely implausible. As he states, “The basic problem [with mind/brain identity] is that not even the most complete account of brain function reaches the actual conscious experience with which it is associated” (The New Frontier of Religion and Science [NFRS], 85). Because many philosophers of mind presuppose a materialist view of persons, they simply beg the question by assuming that mental events are identical to brain events. But for Hick this is simply “an article of naturalistic faith” (NFRS, 91). Despite the ingenuity of naturalist philosophers of mind, consciousness continues to elude a strictly materialist description. Hick next argues that the varieties of epiphenomenalism—in which consciousness is a non-causal byproduct of brain function—fare no better than identity views. If epiphenomenalism is true, then consciousness serves no biological role, and “its emergence would be inexplicable” (NFRS, 103). He argues that developments in artificial intelligence, which are often used to support materialism, actually provide an argument against materialism. For if it is possible to program computers to perform complex functions akin to human behavior without being conscious, then again “consciousness becomes functionless and inexplicable” (NFRS, 101). Assuming that it is more likely that consciousness would emerge if it offered an evolutionary advantage of some kind, he judges epiphenomenalism to be nearly as implausible as mind/brain identity.
After rejecting materialist views of the mind, Hick posits a “non-Cartesian dualism” in which the mind “exists as a non-physical reality in continual interaction with the brain” (NFRS, 111). He believes that this kind of dualism better accounts for nondeterministic or libertarian free will, which he finds entirely more philosophically defensible than compatibilist freedom—the latter of which Hick considers to be self-defeating at best and “an example of philosophical spin doctoring” at worst (NFRS, 112).
Hick summarizes his argument for the possibility of religious experience, stating, “The human person is more than a physical organism, and it cannot be excluded a priori that there may be a non-physical supra-natural reality, perhaps of the limitless significance that the religions claim, and also an answering non-physical aspect of our own nature” (NFRS, 123). He thus invokes the principle of critical trust, in which we take our experiences to be veridical unless and until there is reason to reject their veridicality. He notes that we all live by the principle of critical trust in our everyday experience of the natural world. And since he has argued that there is no a priori reason to rule out the possibility of a supra-natural reality, he concludes that we should apply the same principle of critical trust to our religious experience. One who has a religious experience can take that religious experience to be veridical unless and until there is reason for rejecting its veridicality.
One of Hick’s most important contributions to philosophical theology is his “soul-making” theodicy, first presented in his work, Evil and the God of Love. He spends much of this work interacting with what he calls the traditional Augustinian type of theodicy, in which finitely perfect human beings at a remote time in history fell from perfection by using their free will to turn away from God—an act of rebellion that precipitated evil and suffering in the world. Hick finds this response to be inadequate due to its basis in a narrowly literal reading of the account of the fall found in Genesis chapter three. According to Hick, it is very difficult to take the story of Adam and Eve’s fall literally in light of the scientific evidence for evolution. Moreover, he finds the traditional view incapable of making sense of “finitely perfect creatures who fall out of the full glory and blessedness of God’s Kingdom” (Evil and the God of Love, 2d. ed. [EGL], 280). For if such a creature lived “face to face with infinite plenitude of being, limitlessly dynamic life and power, and unfathomable goodness and love, there seems to be an absurdity in the idea of his seeing rebellion as a possibility” (EGL, 278). However, if instead such a creature “does not exist in such closeness to God, but rather in a human (or angelic) world in which the divine reality is not unambiguously manifest to him,” then it seems that the circumstances are “weighted against the creature,” and sinning “is now rather more than a bare possibility” (EGL, 279). According to Hick’s understanding of the traditional Augustinian view, then, “The creature’s fall is either impossible, or else so very possible as to be excusable” (EGL, 280).
Rather than utilizing a traditional free-will defense that includes the concept of a literal fall, Hick takes an evolutionary approach to speak of humanity’s developing moral education. In contrast to the Augustinian type of theodicy that looks backward to a remote point of perfection in human history, Hick’s theodicy is decidedly eschatological—looking forward to future perfection in God’s heavenly Kingdom. Though Hick concedes that the Augustinian type has been the dominant one throughout Christian history—with advocates in the Catholic as well as the Protestant tradition—Hick finds another minority type first advocated by the Hellenistic or Eastern Fathers and then re-emerging in the nineteenth century liberal Protestant thought of Schleiermacher. Hick calls this view the Irenaean type of theodicy after the Eastern Father Irenaeus in whom Hick finds the germ of his theodicy. According to the Irenaean type, humans were not created in a perfected state in an idyllic environment but are rather in a continuous process of creation or development from morally immature creatures to morally perfected ones. God thus created the world—with all its potential evil and suffering—to serve as a “vale of soul-making.” Hick states that “it is an ethically reasonable judgment…. that human goodness slowly built up through personal histories of moral effort has a value in the eyes of the Creator which justifies even the long travail of the soul-making process” (EGL, 256). He argues further,
Men are not to be thought of on the analogy of animal pets, whose life is to be made as agreeable as possible, but rather on the analogy of human children, who are to grow to adulthood in an environment whose primary and overriding purpose is not immediate pleasure but the realizing of the most valuable potentialities of human personality. (EGL, 258)
According to Hick, the story of the human fall is a mythological way of describing the present human situation. Humans are given a certain level of autonomy from their creator in virtue of being created at an “epistemic distance” from God. It is possible for humans to know God, but they can only do so by freely exercising a faith-response, which for Hick consists “in an uncompelled interpretive activity whereby we experience the world as mediating the divine presence” (EGL, 281). Humans are cognitively free to live as if the natural world is all that is, but those who interpret the world religiously by responding to God in faith can be slowly developed into the likeness of God.
Hick acknowledges a number of comparisons between the Augustinian type of theodicy and his Irenaean soul-making type of theodicy, such as God’s share in the responsibility for the existence of evil, but he finds the Irenaean type more plausible and theologically satisfying. According to Hick, the Augustinian type is often too impersonal and is undermined by its view of the destiny of humanity divided between the pleasures of heaven and the torments of hell. In contrast, the Irenaean type of theodicy offers the hope “that God will eventually succeed in His purpose of winning all men to Himself in faith and love” (EGL, 342).
Later developments in Hick’s theology and philosophy of religion caused him to back away from taking his soul-making view as an explanation of the design of a loving personal God seeking fellowship with his creatures. Thus, as Marilyn Adams notes in the forward to the 2007 reissue of Evil and the God of Love, Hick shifts from a soul-making theodicy to a soul-making soteriology. In later works, such as his Death and Eternal Life, he continues to make use of the soul-making view, but he develops it in a way that can be utilized to fit his pluralistic orientation to religions, including concepts such as reincarnation and post-mortem moral development.
In one of Hick’s most important and controversial essays, “Jesus and the World Religions,” Hick calls for a reinterpretation of Jesus’s divinity in light of modern biblical criticism and our growing awareness of religious diversity. According to Hick, “the Nicene definition of God-the-Son-incarnate is only one way of conceptualizing the lordship of Jesus, the way taken by the Graeco-Roman world of which we are the heirs;” however, “in the new age of world ecumenism which we are entering it is proper for Christians to become conscious of both the optional and the mythological character of this traditional language” (“Jesus and the World Religions” [JWR], in The Myth of God Incarnate, 168). Hick argues that the earliest understanding of Jesus expressed by his first disciples and to a large extent portrayed in the synoptic Gospels and the book of Acts is that of a man “intensely and overwhelmingly conscious of the reality of God” (JWR, 172). Because of Jesus’s intimate relationship with God, he possessed a stunning spiritual authority that included the ability to forgive sins, heal diseases, and speak on behalf of God. Jesus was thus given honorific titles by his followers, such as Messiah, Lord, and Son of God. Over time these poetic images attributed to Jesus took on more than the symbolic or metaphorical value in which they were originally intended and instead became metaphysical statements. Hick finds this development already in the Gospel of John and finally formalized in the two-natures Christology of Nicea and Chalcedon.
According to Hick, the two-natures view of Jesus as fully human and fully divine is deficient in at least three ways. First, it misreads the original poetic intent of Jesus’s divine titles, transposing “a metaphorical son of God to a metaphysical God the Son” (JWR, 176). Second, Hick argues that the two-natures view is itself unintelligible. In a now famous quote, he states, “For to say, without explanation, that the historical Jesus of Nazareth was also God is as devoid of meaning as to say that this circle drawn with a pencil on paper is also a square” (JWR, 178). Finally, he argues that a literal understanding of Jesus as the Son of God requires a restrictive view of the authentic religious life as contained exclusively within the Christian tradition. In contrast, by understanding Christological language as mythological, we can affirm that the Logos of God was working in the person of Jesus of Nazareth just as it has worked “in various ways within the Indian, the semitic, the Chinese, the African…. forms of life” (JWR, 181). Hick believes that such an understanding of Jesus will not diminish but will increase his importance in the global religious life.
Hick’s Death and Eternal Life stands as one of the few substantial constructive works in pluralistic philosophy of religion or what he calls “global theology.” His expansive treatment of the topic includes discussion of historical views, contemporary philosophical views, humanist views, the contributions of biology, psychology, and parapsychology, and Western and Eastern religious views, including Catholic, Protestant, Vedantic Hindu, and Buddhist thought. Hick argues that there is no good reason to rule out the existence of an afterlife a priori. He rejects naturalistic views of the human person, including mind/brain identity and epiphenomenal views, and argues that the evidence from parapsychology—which he believes is more formidable than is often acknowledged—points to “the independent reality of mind and brain, as mutually interacting entities or processes” and “considerably decreases the a priori improbability of the survival of the mind after the death of the body” (Death and Eternal Life [DEL], 126).
Hick takes a decidedly empirical stance toward views of the afterlife from the various world religions. He invokes the principle of openness to all data, attempting to withhold any bias for or against any particular view. What results is a philosophical evaluation of the Western idea of the survival of a disembodied mind or soul, the semitic/Western idea of bodily resurrection, and the Eastern concepts of reincarnation and rebirth. Hick argues for the possibility of each of these views and examines each for internal consistency and explanatory value. For example, he argues that the popular conception of reincarnation or rebirth in which an individual person literally inhabits a number of successive human bodies “has limited support from the alleged memories of former lives…. but tends to be unconvincing to those outside these cultures, and indeed seems to be slowly losing its hold even within them” (DEL, 392). On the other hand, the more sophisticated understanding of reincarnation, in which a “higher self” or karmic package produces a series of persons, may be true but “lacks the moral and practical significance of the more popular pictures of reincarnation” (DEL, 392).
To argue for the logical possibility of a post-mortem bodily resurrection, Hick offers what he calls the “replica” theory. He explains this theory with a thought experiment that proceeds in three stages. In the first stage a person suddenly disappears in London and an exact “replica” of him reappears in New York. Hick argues that after examining the person in New York, we would find that “there is everything that would lead us to identify the one who appeared with the one who disappeared, except continuous occupancy in space” (DEL, 280). In the second stage of the thought experiment, a person in London suddenly dies and an exact “replica” appears in New York. Hick argues that even if we had the corpse of the person who died in London, we would still eventually conclude—after interaction with the person in New York—that the person who appeared in New York is the same person as the one who died in London. Finally, in the third stage of the thought experiment, the person dies in London and an exact “replica” appears “in a different world altogether, a resurrection world inhabited by resurrected ‘replicas’ – this world occupying its own space distinct from the space with which we are familiar” (DEL, 285). Again, Hick argues that the “replica” in the other world would be considered the same person as the person who died in London. In order to avoid confusion, he uses the term “replica” in quotes to indicate his special use of the term. The point of the quote marks around “replica” is that these are not ordinary replicas, of which there can be many of the same individual, but “replicas” of which there can by definition only be one of each individual. He concludes that as bizarre as these cases may be, they support the logical possibility of bodily resurrection. He does not necessarily endorse the “replica” view but uses it as a helpful way of understanding the idea of post-mortem bodily resurrection expressed in Jewish and Christian thought.
Hick’s primary constructive contribution to the philosophical discussion of the afterlife is his distinction between eschatologies, which describe the final state, and pareschatologies, which describe the state between death and the eschaton. By making such a distinction, he is able to combine multiple religious and philosophical conceptions of the afterlife into his afterlife hypothesis. According to his hypothesis, which he posits tentatively, the state immediately upon death “is subjective and dream-like” and thus can take the form of the expectation of the deceased person (DEL, 416). Since the immediate post-mortem state is shaped partly by the person’s expectations, the devoted Christian may find herself before the throne of final judgment, while the secularist might have a dream-like experience largely continuous with her earthly life. However, because Hick believes that life is a continuous soul-making process and that most of us have not completed that process at death, he hypothesizes that our earthly life may be “the first of a series of limited phases of existence, each bounded by its own ‘death’” (DEL, 408). Unlike traditional reincarnation views, though, Hick believes that each new life will be lived in a new world with its own unique opportunities to continue in the soul-making process toward one’s ultimate perfection.
Finally, Hick proposes very tentatively that the final state, or eschaton, will include all of humanity in a perfected state of unity with each other and with the Transcendent Reality. Hick considers this view to be expressive of the “point towards which the more eastern aspects of traditional western thought seem to converge with the more western aspects of traditional eastern thought” (DEL, 459). In contrast to traditional Western religious views, Hick rejects the notion of the immortal ego. But in contrast to traditional Eastern religious views, he also rejects the idea of complete personal extinction or absorption. Rather,
What Christians call the Mystical Body of Christ within the life of God, and Hindus the universal Atman which we all are, and Mahayana Buddhists the self-transcending unity in the Dharma Body of the Buddha, consists of the wholeness of ultimately perfected humanity beyond the existence of separate egos. (DEL, 464)
Thus, at the completion of the long soul-making process, each person will maintain her individual identity which will be completely void of any “ego-aspect,” having been filled instead with “the unselfish love which the New Testament calls agape” (DEL, 464).
Hick’s pluralistic hypothesis is based on the notion that the world is religiously ambiguous, such that it can be experienced either religiously or non-religiously, with no compelling proofs for or against any one religious or nonreligious interpretation of the world. Hick first introduced the notion of religious ambiguity in Faith and Knowledge, though at that time he applied it solely to the ambiguity between theistic and atheistic interpretations of the world rather than drawing out its fuller implications for religious pluralism. Nevertheless, the epistemological ideas in Faith and Knowledge such as “experiencing-as” and “religious interpretation” become the foundation for his pluralistic hypothesis, which he develops most fully in An Interpretation of Religion, based on his 1986-87 Gifford Lectures. There he argues not only that the world is sufficiently ambiguous to allow it to be interpreted religiously in different ways but also that there is parity among each of the major world religions regarding their soteriological and ethical efficacy. As far as can be judged by human observation, no one religion stands out above the rest in terms of its ability to transform lives. Moreover, no one religion can lay claim to being the only context for authentic religious experiences. Once one accepts Hick’s epistemological justification for one’s own religious experience, one must be willing to grant the same epistemological justification for those who form their own quite different religious beliefs based on their religious experiences. Thus Hick proposes his pluralistic hypothesis in which each world faith is viewed as a separate culturally conditioned way in which the Ultimate Reality can be experienced. As he states, “These traditions are accordingly to be regarded as alternative soteriological ‘spaces’ within which, or ‘ways’ along which, men and women can find salvation/liberation/ultimate fulfilment” (An Interpretation of Religion, 2d. ed. [IR], 240).
In developing his pluralistic hypothesis, Hick relies heavily on Kant’s distinction between the phenomenal and the noumenal, where the former is the world as humanly experienced and the latter is the world an sich, as it is in itself. Hick applies this model directly to the religious Ultimate, distinguishing between the Real as humanly experienced and the Real an sich. For Hick, the personal gods described by the various religions, such as Yahweh, the Trinity, Allah, Shiva and Vishnu are experienced at the phenomenal level, as are the non-personal depictions of the religious ultimate which are characteristic of Eastern religions, such as the Absolute, Brahman and Dharmakaya. The concepts of personae and impersonae are based on our phenomenological experiences of the Real; however, such descriptions cannot be literally applied to the Real an sich, which is transcategorial or ineffable. As Hick states, the Real an sich “cannot be said to be one or many, person or thing, substance or process, good or evil, purposive or non-purposive” (IR, 246). Only purely formal categories can be applied to the Real an sich, such as, for example, that it is the ground of our religious experience. In order for religious experiences to be veridical—which Hick argues for at length—he posits the Real an sich as “the necessary postulate of the pluralistic religious life of humanity” (IR, 249). In other words, in order to avoid the extremes of religious exclusivism, where only one religion accurately describes the Real, and religious non-realism, where all religious experience is based on human projection, Hick posits the transcategorial Real as the ground for all authentic religious experience, though the Real in itself is not describable by any one religion.
Hick argues that the primary function or goal of each of the major world religions in their various ways is “the transformation of human existence from self-centredness to Reality-centeredness” (IR, 300). According to his pluralistic hypothesis, human salvation is defined by this very transformation. Thus, in order to evaluate the various religions, one must examine their respective abilities to bring about this transformation. By Hick’s estimation, each of the major world religions has produced its own share of saints who exemplify the transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness. Moreover, “what has happened to a striking extent in the saints has also been happening in lesser degrees to innumerable others within the same traditions” (IR, 307). Therefore, the major world religions should all be judged as authentic soteriological paths. Hick argues further that such transformation is not coincidental but attests to the ethical core of the major world religions, encompassed in the Golden Rule. He finds similarly stated ethical principles in the scriptures and teachings of each of the major world religions but also points to aspects of the various religions that deviate from this ethical core. As he states, “Taking the great world traditions as totalities, then, we can only say that each is an unique mixture of good and evil” (IR, 337). Therefore, as a practical outworking of his pluralistic hypothesis, Hick argues that those doctrines and dogmas of the various religions that do not cohere with the common ethical ideal should be purified from the religions by their respective adherents.
Since Hick holds that the Real is ultimately transcategorial, ineffable, or mysterious, he posits that all religious language, or language about the Real, is mythological rather than literal. Such mythological language is language that “is not literally true but nevertheless tends to evoke an appropriate dispositional attitude” toward the Real (IR, 348). His application of this mythological language to Christology is perhaps the most well known and controversial, but Hick also proposes similar applications to theological doctrines of each of the various religions, and indeed, to his own theodicy.
Because Hick was such a highly original thinker, whose work fits into neither the established orthodoxies of conservative Christianity nor of philosophical naturalism, his work has been both widely influential and widely criticized. Hick writes in his Autobiography that he has been “attacked from different quarters as anti-Christian, as too narrowly Christian, as an atheist, a polytheist, a postmodernist, and as not postmodernist enough!” (321). While virtually all the ideas he has proposed, including eschatological verification, “replica” theory, epistemic distance, and soul-making have been subject to scrutiny in countless articles and sometimes books, it is his pluralistic hypothesis and its resulting implications for Christian theology which have received the heaviest criticisms by far. Many of these criticisms have been largely theological, but there have been a number of substantial philosophical criticisms as well. For example, William Rowe, Alvin Plantinga, Keith Yandell, George Mavrodes, and others have argued that Hick’s Kantian distinction—as well as his related notion of transcategoriality or ineffability—is philosophically untenable. Mavrodes takes Hick’s phenomenal/noumenal distinction at face value and asks why this does not amount to polytheism, since “all the gods [of the various world religions] are real in the same sense that cantaloupes are real on the Kantian view” (“Polytheism,” in The Philosophical Challenge of Religious Diversity, 147, italics original). Rowe and Plantinga each argue that for every set of contradictory properties, one of them must literally apply to the Real. So, for example, Plantinga argues that between the logically contradictory properties of being or not being a tricycle, the latter is literally true of the Real. Likewise, Plantinga and Yandell each argue that if the Real is in fact ineffable, then it could not serve as the explanatory ground for religious experience. If it is beyond the distinction between good and evil, why believe that it is the ground of moral development rather than moral degradation? Hick has responded to these and other criticisms in his introduction to the second edition of An Interpretation of Religion and has published the back and forth conversations with a number of his critics in his Dialogues in the Philosophy of Religion.
Though Hick’s work has faced some of the strongest criticisms from more traditionally orthodox Christians, he also had a strong influence among this group. Many of his former students are now established Christian philosophers in their own right, including Steven T. Davis, William Lane Craig, and Harold A. Netland. Moreover, his more orthodox contemporary, William Alston, has credited Hick’s Faith and Knowledge as a major influence on his widely influential epistemology of religious experience. However, Hick’s most indelible influence comes not in the form of individual scholars or schools of thought but in the fruit of his efforts to revive philosophy of religion as an academically viable field at a time when it had all but died. The renaissance of philosophy of religion today owes a great debt to Hick’s work in the 1950s-70s, when theism was still very much on the defensive due to the legacy of logical positivism and the impact of the later work of Wittgenstein. It was within this hostile environment that Hick took the tools of analytic philosophy and aggressively defended the rationality of religious practices. Moreover, at a time when philosophy of religion was still dominated by Western theistic discussions, Hick introduced religious diversity as a serious philosophical topic. Today no serious discussion of religious language, religious epistemology, the problem of evil, Christology, or religious pluralism can ignore Hick’s influence.
David C. Cramer
U. S. A.
Last updated: November 4, 2009 | Originally published: