Hipparchia is notable for being one of the few women philosophers of Ancient Greece. Drawn to the doctrines and the self-imposed hardships of the Cynic lifestyle, Hipparchia lived in poverty with her husband, Crates the Cynic. While no existing writings are directly attributed to Hipparchia, recorded anecdotal accounts emphasize both her direct, Cynic rhetoric and her nonconformity to traditional gendered roles. Entering into marriage is a traditional social role that Cynics would normally reject; yet with her marriage to Crates, Hipparchia raised Greek cultural expectations regarding the role of women in marriage, as well as the Cynic doctrine itself. With her husband, Hipparchia publicly embodied fundamental Cynic principles, specifically that the path toward virtue was the result of rational actors living in accordance with a natural law that eschewed conventional materialism and embraced both self-sufficiency and mental asperity. Written accounts of Hipparchia's life reference in particular both her belief in human shamelessness or anaideia, and her rhetorical acuity at Greek symposiums traditionally attended only by men. Along with Crates, Hipparchia is considered a direct influence on the later school of Stoicism.
Hipparchia was a Cynic philosopher from Maroneia in Thrace, who flourished around 300 B.C.E. She became famous for her marriage to Crates the Cynic, and infamous for supposedly consummating the marriage in public. Hipparchia was likely born between 340 and 330 B.C.E., and was probably in her mid-teens when she decided to adopt the Cynic mantle. She may have been introduced to philosophy by her brother, Metrocles, who was a pupil in Aristotle’s Lyceum and later began to follow Crates. Most of our knowledge about Hipparchia comes from anecdotes and sayings repeated by later authors. Diogenes Laertius reports that she wrote some letters, jokes and philosophical refutations, which are now lost (see Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1925, reprint 1995, VI.96-98). He adds that myriad stories were told about “the female philosopher”.
Diogenes Laertius claims that Hipparchia was so eager to marry Crates that she threatened to kill herself rather than live in any other way. (DL VI.96.7-8) Although Crates was by this time an old man, she rejected her other youthful suitors because she had fallen in love with “both the discourses and the life” of Crates, and was said to be “captured” by the logos of the Cynics. (VI.96.1 and 4-5) At the request of her parents, Crates tried to talk Hipparchia out of the marriage. (VI.96.9-10) When he failed in this task, he disrobed in front of her and said, “this is the groom, and these are his possessions; choose accordingly.” (VI.96.11-15) This tale should be taken with the proverbial grain of salt, given that Diogenes Laertius is writing centuries later, and that his account may include ‘apt’ stories that are technically false, but which arose and were transmitted because they were taken to be revealing illustrations. Given the interest and controversy generated by the female Cynic, it is easy to imagine stories of this kind being told about her. In any event, we know that Hipparchia chose to marry Crates and share his philosophical pursuits.
Hipparchia’s decision to become a Cynic was surprising, on account of both the Cynic disregard for conventional institutions and the extreme hardship of the lifestyle. Cynics attempted to live “according to nature” by rejecting artificial social conventions and refusing all luxuries, including any items not absolutely required for survival. They gave up their possessions, carrying what few they needed in a wallet. They wore only a simple mantle or cloak, and begged to obtain their basic needs. Crates’ willingness to marry was also unusual, considering that marriage is a social institution of the sort normally rejected by Cynics, and earlier Cynics like Diogenes and Antisthenes had maintained that the philosopher would never marry. A few centuries later, while arguing that marriage is generally unsuitable for the Cynic (or Stoic) philosopher, Epictetus allows for exceptions specifically because of the philosophical marriage of Hipparchia and Crates (Epictetus, Discourses, tr. C. H. Oldfather, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1928). By marrying a Cynic and becoming one herself, Hipparchia thus performed the characteristically Cynic feat of “changing the currency,” both of her culture and the Cynic tradition itself. The Cynic motto of “change the currency” (parakrattein to nomismata), first adopted by Diogenes of Sinope, implied rejection of the prevailing social and political order in favor of an unconventional, self-sufficient life as a “citizen of the universe” (kosmopolites). (It had been said, perhaps falsely, that Diogenes or his father had been driven from Sinope when found guilty of literally defacing the coins and changing their values, but it is also likely that the counterfeiting story arose after he adopted the metaphorical motto.)
Some later authors, such as Apuleius and Augustine, report that Hipparchia and Crates consummated their marriage by having sex on a public porch. Whether the tale is accurate or not, they were known to conduct themselves in all respects according to the Cynic value of anaideia, or shamelessness. The story of Hipparchia’s Cynic marriage quickly became the premiere example of that virtue, which is based on the Cynic belief that any actions virtuous enough to be done in private are no less virtuous when performed in public. As exemplars of anaideia, Hipparchia and Crates influenced their pupil Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism. His Republic advocates the equality of the sexes, co-ed public exercise and training, and a version of “free love” wherein those wishing to have sex will simply satisfy their desires wherever they happen to be at the moment, even in public. Stoic ethics were generally influenced by Cynic values, such as self-sufficiency, the importance of practice in achieving virtue, and the rejection of the conventional values attached to pleasure and pain. The Stoics also advocated living according to nature in the sense of conforming one’s own reason to the dictates of the rational natural law.
Eratosthenes reports that Hipparchia and Crates had a son named Pasicles, and Diogenes Laertius’ account of the life of Crates also refers to their son. The Cynic Letters, a collection of pseudographic letters attributed to various Cynic figures and probably written by a several different authors a few centuries after Hipparchia lived, mention that she bore and raised children according to her Cynic values. Whatever the actual details of her practices might have been, her example influenced later Cynic attitudes towards pregnancy and child-rearing. For example, one of the letters attributed to Crates suggests that Hipparchia has given birth “without trouble” because she believes that her usual “labor is the cause of not laboring” during the birth itself (33.14-15). The birth was easier because she continued to work “like an athlete” during her pregnancy (33.17), which the author notes is unusual. The letters also mention Hipparchia’s use of a tortoise shell cradle, cold water for the baby’s bath, and continued adherence to an austere diet.
Hipparchia is also famous for an exchange with Theodorus the Atheist, a Cyrenaic philosopher, who had challenged the legitimacy of her presence at a symposium. She was reported to have regularly attended such functions with Crates. According to Diogenes Laertius, Theodorus quoted a verse from Euripides’ Bacchae, asking if this is she “abandoning the warp and woof and the shuttle” (like Agave returning home from the “hunt” with the head of her son Pentheus). (VI.98.2) Hipparchia affirms that yes, it is she, but asks Theodorus whether she has had the wrong understanding of herself, if she spent her time on education rather than wasting it on the loom. (VI.98.3-6) In the ancient Greek cultural context, women of her social class typically would have been occupied with weaving and organizing the household servants, and Hipparchia’s rejection of the conventional expectations for women was quite radical.
Diogenes Laertius also reports the syllogism that Hipparchia used to put down Theodorus during the same symposium mentioned above: Premise 1: “Any action which would not be called wrong if done by Theodorus, would not be called wrong if done by Hipparchia.” Premise 2: “Now Theodorus does no wrong when he strikes himself”. Conclusion: “therefore neither does Hipparchia do wrong when she strikes Theodorus.” (VI.97.6-9) This is a classic example of the Cynic rhetorical trope of spoudogeloion: a deliberately comic syllogism which nevertheless makes a serious point. Diogenes Laertius says that since Theodorus “had no reply wherefore to meet the argument,” he “tried to strip her of her cloak. But Hipparchia showed no sign of alarm or of the perturbation natural in a woman” (VI.97), as befitted her Cynic commitment to anaideia.
Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks (Cambridge: Harvard University Press) 1925 (reprint 1995), VI.96-98.
Abraham J. Malherbe, The Cynic Epistles (Atlanta: Scholar’s Press) 1997, 78-83.
Discussions in the modern period of Hipparchia’s encounter with Theodorus are found in Bayle’s Historical and Critical Dictionary and in Menage’s History of Women Philosophers. See Pierre Bayle, Historical and Critical Dictionary: Selections, ed. Richard H. Popkin and Craig Bush (Indianapolis: Hackett) 1991, 102-103, and Gilles Menage, The History of Women Philosophers, tr. Beatrice H. Zedler (Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1984), 103.
For further information about Cynic philosophy, see Diogenes Laertius Book VI, as well as D. R. Dudley, A History of Cynicism: From Diogenes to the Sixth Century AD (London) 1937 (reprint Ares Publishing, 1980), and R. Bracht Branham and Marie Odile Goulet-Caze, eds., The Cynics: The Cynic Movement in Antiquity and its Legacy (Berkeley: University of California Press) 2000.
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