A Greek sophist of Elis and a contemporary of Socrates. He taught in the towns of Greece, especially at Athens. He had the advantage of a prodigious memory, and was deeply versed in all the learning of his day. He attempted literature in every form which was then extant. He also made the first attempt in the composition of dialogues. In the two Platonic dialogues named after him (Hippias Major and Hippias Minor), he is represented as excessively vain and arrogant.
Hippias is chiefly memorable for his efforts in the direction of universality. He was the enemy of all specialization, and appeared at Olympia gorgeously attired in a costume entirely of his own making down to the ring on his finger. He was prepared to lecture to anyone on anything, from astronomy to ancient history. Such a man had need of a good memory, and we know that he invented a system of mnemonics. There was a more serious side to his character, however. This was the age when people were still optimistic of squaring the circle by a geometrical construction. The lunules of Hippocrates of Chios belong to it, and Hippias, the universal genius, could not be left behind here. He invented the curve still known as the quadratix, which would solve the problem if it could be mechanically described. Hippias appears to have originated the idea of natural law as the foundation of morality, distinguishing nature from the arbitrary conventions or fashions, differing according to the different times or regions in which they arise, imposed by arbitrary human enactment, and often unwillingly obeyed. He held that there is an element of right common to the laws of all countries and constituting their essential basis. He held also that the good and wise of all countries are naturally akin and should regard one another as citizens of a single state. This idea was subsequently developed by the Cynic and still more by the Stoic schools, passing from the latter to the jurists, in whose hands it became the great instrument for converting Roman law into a legislation for a people.
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Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: April/16/2001
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