Hippocrates of Cos was said to have lived sometime between 450 BCE to 380 BCE. He was a physician, and the writings of the Corpus Hippocraticum provide a wealth of information on biomedical methodology and offer one of the first reflective codes of professional ethics. Though Plato (a contemporary) makes reference to Hippocrates (Phaedrus 270a and elsewhere), it is generally believed that most of the writings in the Corpus Hippocraticum are actually the work of a number of different writers. By convention of time, place and general approach a common name of ‘Hippocrates’ was assigned to the lot (without distinguishing those of the historical Hippocrates). Hippocrates and the other associated writers provide the modern student with a number of different sorts of insights.
On the biomedical methodology side, these writings provide the most detailed biomedical observations to date in the Western world. They also offer causal speculations that can be knitted together to form a theoretical framework for diagnosis and treatment. On the ethical side, their code of professional ethics is so well structured that it continues to stand as a model for other professions.
One way to parse the groups of Hippocratic writers revolves around their geographical origins: Cos vs. Cnidos. Though this classification is controversial, it is useful (whether one accepts the literal geographical demarcation) to mark some clear distinctions in the Hippocratic body of writing. It appears to be the case that the Cos writers sought to create general biomedical “laws” that for the most part would give the explanation for why someone was sick. Any physician might make reference to these “laws” and thereby have an etiology for the disease, and by extension a strategy for treatment.
The most historically prominent theoretical scheme of the Coan writers was the doctrine of the four humors of the body: blood, phlegm, black bile, and yellow bile (or sometimes serum). Health was defined as the balance of the four humors. Disease was defined as the imbalance of the humors. When imbalance occurred, then the physician might intervene by making a correction to bring the body back into balance. For example, if the individual were too full of phlegm (making her phlegmatic or lethargic), then the phlegm must be countered. Citrus fruit was thought to be a counter-acting agent. Thus, if one feels lethargic, increasing one’s citrus intake will re-create balance. The treatment is, in fact, generally effective. Moderns might describe the therapy differently by ascribing the effect to vitamin-C, phosphorus, and natural sugar. This example illustrates the scope of the Hippocratic physician in this context: something like a cross between the modern roles of an herbalist dietician and a personal trainer. Nonetheless, the cures that were dictated by the four humor theory seemed to work well enough for this theory to extend to the nineteenth century (in various guises).
Other biomedical writers–some say from Cnidos–held that strict empirical principles did not allow scientists to go far beyond the data. It was a better methodology for the biomedical practitioner to stay as close as possible to the data that were before him. This meant that each patient would be seen in her particularity. Such a method required careful trial and error observation and only slight manipulation of the patient in the form of treatment.
There was a great conflict in the ancient world concerning the status of observational conclusions (the empirically concrete). Should they be given in their specificity and remain as disparate, individual accounts, or should they be grouped and more general principles drawn from them? In this instance it was very much in dispute whether it was better to set out individual reports of particular illnesses (case studies) or to try to draw general rules from the particulars.
Take, for example Epidemics III:
THE MORTIFICATION OF THE GANGRENE. If the gangrene mortifies itself there is a head pain and frequently a scratchy throat; the sick limb loses sensation, a feeling of cold comes to the head and the affected limb sweats. He suddenly loses his speech and blows blood from his nose as he becomes pale. If the disease takes hold of the patient with a weak force, he recovers the discharged blood. If the disease takes him with a strong force, he dies promptly. In this case one induces sneezing by pleasant substances; one evacuates by the upper and lower. Alternatively those odors will be a little active. The soup will be light and hot. Wine is absolutely forbidden. (Epidemics III, Littré 7, p. 123)
In this passage one is left merely with symptoms and treatment. But when one practices medicine in this way there are severe restrictions. For the disease is seen as a collection of symptoms. The cure can only be guessed at unless it has been previously written down in a manual. When a physician is confronted with a novel disease he must find a similar set of symptoms and use that treatment. This aspect of the “trial and error” method brought harsh rebuke from Galen.
The point is that they [the Cnidians] looked at the varieties of symptoms which change for many reasons and failed to consider the specificity of the dispositions, as did Hippocrates, who used for their discovery a method only by using which, one can find the number of diseases . . . . Hippocrates censures the Cnidian physicians for their ignorance of the genera and species of diseases, and he points out the divisions by which what seems to be one becomes many by being divided. (Corpus Medicorum Graecorum 5.9.1, pp. 121-22; Claudii Galeni De Placitis Hippocratis et Platonis, ed. I. Mueller (Lipsiae, 1874), p. 776)
What was it that made the Cnidians different from the Coan writers? This can be found by examining the two steps in any medical practice: Prognosis and Treatment. In the Coan work, On Prognosis, the writer suggests that prognosis consists in knowing the patient’s condition in the past, present, and the future. Now how could a physician know this? Well, this could also have been part of a handbook catalogued through similar case studies. The practitioner could memorize each individual description. Next, the practitioner could add to this his own experience. But the problem is that each case is individual. It possesses “nature” only in the sense of possessing a unique set of properties. The practitioner would not be in a good position to treat novel cases. When confronted with a novel case, the practitioner is left with seeking similar cases. The implied premise is that similar cases call for similar remedies. The more the experience, the more refined the practitioner can be in balancing similar cases with the remedies.
Obviously, much rides on the word, ‘similar.’ Is a rich body of knowledge enough? Is it not also requisite to have a classification procedure, which itself implies rules of classification. And how does one select and justify such rules? It would seem that we are pressed backwards toward archai, starting points for some axiomatic system (à la Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, I, i-ii).
Such an alternative to the empiricist program aims at establishing a theory of causes that underlie individual cases. These causes such as the “hot,” “cold,” “wet,” and “dry” or “the four humors” are more general because they seek to describe a different sense of the nature of disease. ‘Nature’ in this context refers to the sort of condition that comes from observations based upon the individuality of actual patients. For here we are interested in the genera and species of the disease in question. Such an exercise creates a classification of types of diseases.
But for this classification not to be based upon accidental characteristics, it is requisite that it include the causal factors that operate to bring about the disease in the first place. This is really the foundational or causal network that is responsible for the disease’s very existence. Such an understanding of “nature” moves away from individuals and their “similarities” toward the theoretical. Understood in this way, the nature of disease is a regulating factor upon the prognosis of the physician. This nature must be understood in order to offer treatment. In this sense, nature is the overarching principles that give an account of the mechanism of the disease. What made the Coan writers so attractive to Galen was that they investigated various senses of nature while the Cnidians confined themselves only to the data as they presented themselves.
The Hippocratic writings were influential in the development of later biomedical practitioners. The three principal Hellenistic schools: Dogmatists, Methodists, and the Empirics all hearken back in various ways to the Hippocratic writings. Many debates in the Hippocratic writings (such as the “preformation” vs. “epigenesis” debate) are picked-up again and given a twist according to the predilections of the Hellenistic schools. Galen, himself, often cites Hippocrates, aka “the Hippocratic writers,” as the point of departure for his own theory building. Thus, it would be fair to say that not only were the Hippocratic writers the first systematic biomedical writers in the Western tradition, but also the most influential to later writers.
In the time of Hippocrates (and the other associated writers) there were many who wanted to pass themselves off as physicians. These individuals had not gone through an apprenticeship and thus had no specialized (professional) knowledge. Because of this, these con men went about fleecing customers. This created a problem for those who entered the study of medicine the traditional way. These more careful practitioners had to distinguish themselves from the charlatans. The way most professions try to deal with this sort of problem and the legitimate problems that arise during practice is to create codes of conduct and structures of accreditation. The most famous of these in the biomedical tradition is: The Oath of Hippocrates.
By Apollo (the physician), by Asclepius (god of healing), by Hygeia (god of health), by Panacea (god of remedy), and all the gods and goddesses, together as witnesses, I hereby swear that I will carry out, inasmuch as I am able and true to my considered judgment, this oath and the ensuing duties:
Now if I carry out this oath and not break its injunctions, may I enjoy a good life and may my reputation be pure and honored for all generations. But if I fail and break this oath, then may the opposite befall me.
Within this oath are both a moral code for the profession of medicine and the outlines of a system of accreditation for new physicians via an apprenticeship. These two functions went a long way to establishing medicine as a profession that ordinary people could trust.
In the modern world there are many professional codes of conduct. One could look at the American Medical Association Code, the American Bar Association Code, et al. However, the Hippocratic Oath set the standard of what a professional code is. A few key features that will tell why one should accept or reject such codes as solutions to the problems that have been outlined.
It is this author’s opinion that among professional codes, the Hippocratic Oath is a good one. It balances between very specific prohibitions such as not administering poison or not having sexual relations with one’s patients, to more general principles such as “I will concern myself with the well being of the sick.” and “do no harm.” These general principles are very useful because they govern a larger domain than simply prohibiting a particular action. These principles are not set out without context. Instead they are put into the context medicine’s mission.
Beginning in #1 the tone is set that medicine is an art that is “given by the gods.” It is an esoteric art that is to be reserved for those who are willing to commit to the provisions of the code. Thus, it is not open to everyone. This fulfills the condition of specialized knowledge mentioned earlier. It is for the sake of doing good to others and always avoiding harm. This fulfills the condition of providing a service for others.
Thirdly, the code ties itself to the larger moral tradition, “I will commit no intentional misdeeds.” Whereas “harm” has a direct link to manner in which medicine is practiced, “misdeeds” links the physician to the larger moral tradition. There is no possible hiding in the shared community perspective alone.
These three factors are the basis of any good professional code.
A Good Professional Code Should Contain
Where codes of professional ethics fail is in overemphasizing one of these elements too highly or in ignoring an element entirely. If codes of ethics exist in order to remedy the “inward perspective” problem described above, then they must create links to more general “shared worldviews.” This would put them in the realm of common morality.
This is the most important point from my perspective. So often the “practice” of the profession defines its excellence in an introspective way such that the achievement of these functional requirements is all that matters-divorced from any other visions, namely, moral visions.
In the modern arena, many professional codes have evolved from a legal perspective. The practitioners of the profession do not want to go to jail or to be sued. Thus, they create certain codes that will make this possible situation less probable. These sorts of codes are defensive in nature and stand at the opposite end of the spectrum from the Hippocratic Oath. Their mission is not to set internal standards and link to common morality, rather they seek to “shave” as close as possible to maximizing an egoistic bottom line at the expense of the pillars of professionalism: one’s specialized education and one’s mission to serve others.
Any code that takes as its basis merely a negative approach designed to protect the practitioner from going to jail or being sued is fundamentally inadequate. This is not where one should set her sights. Rather, we should dream about what the profession may be-in the best of all possible worlds. The Oath of Hippocrates thus properly sets the mission that should drive all codes of ethics.
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Last updated: July 5, 2005 | Originally published: