History is the study of the past in all its forms. Philosophy of history examines the theoretical foundations of the practice, application, and social consequences of history and historiography. It is similar to other area studies – such as philosophy of science or philosophy of religion – in two respects. First, philosophy of history utilizes the best theories in the core areas of philosophy like metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics to address questions about the nature of the past and how we come to know it: whether the past proceeds in a random way or is guided by some principle of order, how best to explain or describe the events and objects of the past, how historical events can be considered causally efficacious on one another, and how to adjudicate testimony and evidence. Second, as is the case with the other area-studies, philosophy of history investigates problems that are unique to its subject matter. History examines not what things are so much as how they came to be. History focuses on the unique rather than the general. Its movers are most often people who act for a variety of inner motives rather than purely physical forces. Its objects are no longer observable directly, but must be mediated by evidence. These problems and many more that are specific to the past have been studied and debated for as long as philosophy itself has existed.
This article presents the history of philosophy of history from Ancient Greece to the present, with particular emphases on the variety of 19th century philosophy of history and on the divide between continental and Anglophone or analytic philosophy of history in the 20th century.
The attempt to derive meaning from the past is as old as culture itself. The very notion of a culture depends upon a belief in a common history that members of that culture recognize themselves as meaningfully sharing. Whether it be an interpretation of events as products of divine intervention or whether it be the secular uniting of families or of nations, history has always been a sort of glue for a culture’s fabric.
Arguably the first scientific philosophy of history—which is characterized by an attempt to be non-biased, testimony-based, comprehensive, and unencumbered by grand predictive structures— was produced by the father of history, Herodotus (c. 484-425 BCE). The word ‘history’ derives from his usage of historía to define his ‘inquiries’ or ‘researches’: “Herodotus of Halicarnassus, his inquiries are here set down to preserve the memory of the past by putting on record the marvelous achievements both of the Greek and non-Greek peoples; and more particularly, to show how the two races came into conflict” (Herodotus, Histories I.1,1). To attain his comprehensive characterization of the Greek and non-Greek worlds, Herodotus’ research depended on the often fabulous oral traditions of his predecessors. But what he sacrifices in confirmable fact he makes up for in the descriptive vividness of everyday life. All stories, however preposterous, are recorded without moral judgment since they each reflect the beliefs of a time and of a people, all of which are worth knowing.
While Greece and Rome produced a number of important historians and chroniclers, none were more comprehensive or more influential than Thucydides (c.460-c.395 BCE). Like Herodotus, Thucydides viewed history as a source of lessons about how people tended to act. And like him, too, Thucydides was concerned with how methodological considerations shaped our view of the past. However, Thucydides was critical of Herodotus for having failed to carry out a sufficiently objective account. “To hear this history told, insofar as it lacks all that is fabulous, shall perhaps not be entirely pleasing. But whoever desires to investigate the truth of things done, and which according to the character of mankind may be done again, or at least approximately, will discover enough to make it worthwhile” (Thucydides, The Peloponnesian War I, 22). To remedy Herodotus’ uncritical record, first, Thucydides restricted his inquiry to the main actors of the Peloponnesian War: the generals and governors who decided what was to be done rather than the everyday people who could only speculate about it. The lesson to be learned was not the sheer diversity of cultural behaviors but the typological character of agents and their actions, which was to serve as a sort of guide to future conduct since they were likely to repeat themselves. Second, Thucydides treated his evidence with overt skepticism. He claims to not accept hearsay or conjecture, and to admit only that which he had personally seen or else had been confirmed by multiple reliable sources. Thucydides was the first to utilize source criticism in documentary evidence. The lengthy and eloquent speeches he ascribes to various parties are preserved only under the promise that they follow as closely as possible the intention of their alleged speaker.
With the waning of classical antiquity came the decline of the scientific paradigm of history. The religious practice of sacred-history in the Judeo-Christian and Islamic worlds, though often interpreting the same key events in very different ways, share common meta-historical principles. The past is not studied for the sake of disinterested truth, but in the hope of attaining a glimpse of the bond between the divine plan and a given people’s course in the world. In that sense, many non-fundamentalist historians of each faith regard their sacred texts as meaningful documents meant for consideration in the light of the present and what its authors believe to be our common future. Under the surface chronicle of events like floods, plagues, good harvests, or benevolent rulers is seen a moral and spiritual lesson provided by god to his people, which it is the historian’s task to relate. As the Qur’an makes clear, “In their history, there is a lesson [‘ibra] for those who possess intelligence” (Qu’ran 12:111).
The most reflective of the early medieval historiographers is doubtless Augustine (354-430). In opposition to Thucydides’ aim to show the repeatability of typical elements from the past, Augustine’s emphasized the linearity of history as a part of the Christian eschatology, the necessary unfolding of God’s eternal plan within a temporally-ordered course of history. His City of God (413-26) characterizes lives and nations as a long redemption from original sin that culminates in the appearance of Christ. Since then, history has been a record of the engaged struggle between the chosen elect of the City of God and the rebellious self-lovers who dwell in the City of Men. Because time is linear, its key events are unique and inviolable: the Fall of Adam, the Birth and Death of Jesus, and the Resurrection all move history along to the Final Judgment with infallible regularity.
Sacred-history thus tends to provide an overarching narrative about the meaning of human existence, either as a tragedy or a statement of hope in a redeemed future. Besides its canonical status throughout much of the Medieval world, its influence manifestly stretches over the hermeneutical tradition as well as the teleological philosophers of history of the Nineteenth Century.
Petrarch’s (1304-1374) De secreto conflict curarum mearum (c.1347-c.1353) argued that secular intellectual pursuits, among them history, need not be spiritually hazardous. His circle of followers recovered and restored a mass of ancient texts the likes of which the previous millennium had not imagined, among them the histories of Cicero, Livy, Tacitus, and Varro. At the beginning of the 15th century, humanist universities expanded from their scholastic core to include rhetoric, poetry, and above all, history. And with their greater concern for the things and people of the natural world came an increasing focus on political history rather than grand religious narratives. Accordingly, the common focal point was not the Resurrection of Christ, but the fall of Rome. And here the lesson of history was not a consistent moral decline, but a hope that understanding Ancient models of social and political life would make room for a sort of secular golden age.
With the new focus on human affairs, there came an increased attention to written records and natural evidence. Armed with newly unlocked troves of secular literary artifacts, the works of Leonardo Bruni (c.1370-1444) and Flavio Biondo (1392-1463) contain the first forays into modern source criticism and demands for documentary evidence. And for Bruni’s History of the Florentine People (1415-39), the story to be told was neither a spiritual nor a moral one, but a natural history of the progress of political freedom in Florence.
Though less nationalistic than these, Erasmus, too, demanded that historians trace their sources back to the originals, not just in government documents but in cultural artifacts as well. And that meant investigating the religious spirit of sacred history with the tools of Renaissance humanism. His Latin and Greek translations of the New Testament are monuments of scholarly historiography, and became instrumental for the Reformation. History, for Erasmus, became a tool for critiquing modern misinterpretations and abuses of the once noble past and a means for uncovering the truth about long-misunderstood people, ideas, and events.
But although previous writers of history were reflective about their enterprise, the first to merit the name Philosopher of History is Giambattista Vico (1668-1744). He is the first to argue for a common historical process that guides the course of peoples and nations. In the Scienza Nuova, he writes:
Our Science therefore comes to describe at the same time an ideal eternal history traversed in time by the history of every nation in its rise, progress, maturity, decline, and fall. Indeed we go so far as to assert that whoever mediates this Science tells himself this ideal eternal history only so far as he makes it by that proof, ‘it had, has, and will have to be’. For the first indubitable principle above posited is that this world of nations has certainly been made by men, and its guise must therefore be found within the modifications of our own human mind. And history cannot be more certain than when he who creates the things also describes them. (Vico 1948, 104)
Vico’s philosophy of history follows from his epistemological postulate that to know something fully required understanding how it came to be. The true is precisely that which has been made, expressed in his Latin as Verum esse ipsum factum. Since natural objects were not made by the scientists who study them, their nature must remain to some degree mysterious. But human history, since its objects and its investigators are one and the same, has in principle a methodological advantage. That division between the natural sciences and human sciences was in conscious contradistinction to Descartes’ methodological universalism; and it would become crucial for 19th century Post-Kantian philosophers of history and, later, for the British Idealists.
Vico also suggests that the cultured minds of his day were of a different order than those of their primitive ancestors. Whereas his 18th century thinkers form abstract concepts and universal propositions, to the primitive individual images and sounds directly indicate the real things to which they refer. While for Post-Kantian philosophers lightning is a symbol or metaphor for Zeus, to Vico’s poetic imaginers the lightning really is Zeus. To perfectly reconstruct both their mentality and their history by the principles of rationalist science or enlightenment historiography is impossible. A new science of the imagination is required, one that can symbolically recapture past people’s forms of thoughts and re-embody their emotions.
Because of these epistemological views, Vico is the first to posit distinct epochs of history in which all nations evolve due to an overarching scheme of logic. Each stage of a nation’s development produces a newly-believed system of natural law, use of language, and institution of government. It is ‘providence’ that causes the transition in every nation from an Age of Gods, wherein people believe themselves directly governed by divine signs and spoke only in a direct object language, to an Age of Heroes wherein aristocrats hold commoners in thrall by their natural superiority and speak in metaphoric images, and then to an Age of Men, wherein people communicate with abstract generalities and assume both a general equality in their social associations and an abstract notion of justice by which they are governed. It is our fate as human beings in every nation to live out this ‘corso’ of history, this progression of mental capacities from fantasia to riflessione.
Ultimately the ideal epoch of reason and civilization is never reached. At our most civilized, history circles back upon itself in a ‘ricorso’ to a ‘second barbarism’. Here in this barbarism of reflection, aided by civil bureaucracy, deceitful language, and cunning reason, our passions are unrestrained by the manners and customs prominent in the Ages of Gods or Heroes to the point that civil society collapses upon itself before returning to a second cycle of history.
In contrast to Vico’s pessimism, the philosophy of history in the 18th century is continuous with the Enlightenment ideals of moral progress and the power of reason. Voltaire’s (1694-1778) Essay on the Customs and the Spirit of the Nations (1756), wherein the phrase ‘philosophy of history’ is supposed to have been coined, was the first attempt since Herodotus to write a comprehensive history of world culture in a non-Christian and non-teleological framework. Social and cultural history replaced military and political history with a trans-religious and trans-European tenor intended to showcase the spiritual and moral progress of humanity. To further rid Europe of what he considered Christian biases, on display especially in the modern eschatology of Jacques Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), Voltaire was the first major modern thinker to stress Arab contributions to world culture. In keeping with the Enlightenment, he believed that the best remedy for intolerance and prejudice was simply the truth, something which is best discovered by the objective historian working with original documents, never by the ideologue repeating the dicta of authorities. But for his apologies for non-biased historiography, Voltaire betrays rather clearly the ideals of his age. Differences between the Christian eschatological worldview and his own age’s rationalist science are regarded summarily as improvements, whereas the medieval destruction of the ancient clearly represents decline. The age of reason is, for Voltaire, the standard by which other eras and peoples are to be judged, though few could be said to have reached.
Antoine-Nicolas de Condorcet (1743-1794) openly embraced Enlightenment progressivism. Like Voltaire, his Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Progress of the Human Mind (published posthumously in 1795) viewed the past as a progress of reason, but was more optimistic about the inevitable progress of liberal ideals such as free speech, democratic government, and the equity of suffrage, education, and wealth. The point of history was not only a description of this progress. Because the progress is lawful and universal, history is also predictive and, what is more, articulates a duty for political institutions to work toward the sort of equalities that the march of history would bring about anyway. The historian is no mere critic of his time, but also a herald of what is to come. Widely influential on the French Revolution, Condorcet also made a significant impression on the systematizing philosophies of history of Saint-Simon, Hegel, and Marx, as well as laid the first blueprints for systematic study of social history made popular by Comte, Weber, and Durkheim.
Less revolutionary was Immanuel Kant’s (1724-1804) Idea of a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View (1784). Kant begins from the Enlightenment view of history as a progressive march of reason and freedom. But given his epistemology he could not presume, as did Voltaire and Condorcet, that the teleological progression of history was empirically discernible within the past. It is not a demonstrable fact, but a necessary condition for the meaningfulness of the past to posit teleological progress as a regulative idea that allows us to justify the many apparent evils that have sprung up within history despite the overall benevolent character of creation. The wars, famines, and natural disasters that pervade history should be seen as nature’s instruments, guiding people into the kinds of civil relationships that eventually maximize freedom and justice. History reveals human culture as the means by which nature accomplishes its state of perpetual peace in all the spiritual pursuits of mankind.
Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803) was key in the general turn from Enlightenment historiography to the romantic. His Ideas toward a Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784-91) echoes Vico’s contention that there is no single faculty of human reason for all peoples at all times, but different forms of rationality for various cultures as determined by their particular time and place in the world. Accepting Vico’s notion of necessary development, he nevertheless rejects the Enlightenment emphasis on rationality and freedom as its measures. Herder also discards the Enlightenment tendency to judge the past by the light of the present, irrespective of how rational we consider ourselves today. This results from his fundamental conviction that each national culture is of equal historical value. The same inner vitalism of nature guides all living things on the regular path from birth to death. Just as childhood and old age are essential to the development of the person, are valuable in their own right, and thus should not be judged as somehow inferior from the standpoint of adulthood, so too a nation’s character is of inviolable worth and essential to the development of the whole.
Herder not only rejected Kant’s Enlightenment universalism, but also the epistemological means by which an understanding of ancient people can be reached. It was clear that there could be no empirical proof or rationalist demonstration of the organic pattern of the development Herder finds. Nor, however, should we posit teleological progress as a merely regulative principle of reason. The sense for past people and cultures is not itself communicated whole and entire through their documents in such a way that would be open to historical analysis or source criticism. The historian only apprehends the real spirit of a people through a sympathetic understanding – what Herder calls Einfühlen— of their inner life by analogy with her own. The historian ‘feels her way into’ a people and an age, in order to try to sympathetically apprehend why they made the choices they did.
Romantic historiographers were strongly guided by Herder’s idea that the definition of a people lay more in its inner spirit than its legal borders. The fairy tales of the Grimm brothers (1812), as much as the nationalistic histories of Macaulay (1800-1859), the Wilhelm Tell (1804) saga of Friedrich Schiller (1759-1805), J.W.v. Goethe’s (1749-1832) Goetz von Berlichingen (1773), the transcription of the Beowulf epic (1818), and the surge of histories asserting the sanctity of minority Russio-slavic cultures like the Estonian Kalevipoeg (1853) or the Armenian Sasuntzi Davit (1873) each sought to revitalize and unify present culture under the banner of a shared past. The Romantics followed Herder, too, in their belief that this national character was not discernible solely by meticulous analysis of documents and archival records. The historian must have an overarching sense of the course of history of a people, just as the dramaturge reveals the unity of a character through each individual episode. Hardly a bare chronicle of disconnected facts, the narratives historians tell about the past should communicate a sense of spirit rather than objective information. And only those who ‘breathe the air of a people or an age’ have the proper sort of sympathetic understanding to interpret it correctly. The potential abuses of historiography, to which this nationalistic romanticism lends itself, had a decisive impact on the three main streams of philosophy of history in the 19th century.
The name of G.W.F. Hegel (1770-1831) is nearly synonymous with philosophy of history in two senses, both captured by his phrase, “The only thought which philosophy brings with it, in regard to history, is the simple thought of Reason—the thought that Reason rules the world, and that world history has therefore been rational in its course” (Hegel 1988, 12f). History unfolds itself according to a rational plan; and we know this precisely because the mind which examines it unfolds itself from the first inklings of sense-certainty to absolute knowing in a regular teleological pattern. The same process that governs the movement of history also governs the character of the philosophical speculation inherent in that moment of history. And at the present epoch of philosophical speculation we are capable of understanding the entire movement of history as a rational process unfolding an ever greater awareness of rational freedom. A true account of the whole of reality, which is itself the sole endeavor of philosophy, must consider everything real as real insofar as it can be comprehended by reason as it unfolds within its necessary historical course. Reason is, for Hegel, the real. Both are understood as historical.
Hegel’s lecture series on the Introduction to the Philosophy of History (published posthumously in 1837) is a sort of secular eschatology, wherein the course of reality is considered a single epochal evolution toward a providential end. This is cognized by an increasingly unfolding awareness according to that same plan. As he demotes religion to a subservient place to absolute knowing in his Phenomenology of Spirit (1807), so too does Hegel replace the sacred-history conception of grace with the phenomenological unfolding of reason.
Hegel’s view of the common structural unveiling of reason and history leads to specific consequences for his teleological historiography. Reason consists in both the awareness of contradiction and its sublimation by means of the speculative act of synthesis which results in an increased self-recognition. Analogously, the development of history consists in a progressive structure of oppositions and their necessary synthetic sublimations which leads to an ever increasing self-awareness of freedom. That necessary movement is illustrated in his account of three distinct epochs of world history. In the ancient orient, only the despot is free; his freedom consists only in the arbitrary savagery of his will. The people are held in bondage by the identity of state and religion. The opposition of the despot and his subjects is to some degree overcome by the classical Greek and Roman recognition of citizenship, under which the free individual understands himself to be bound by honor over and above the laws of the state. Still, the great many in the classical world are still un-free. It is only in the intertwining of the Christian recognition of the sanctity of life and the modern liberal definition of morality as inherently intersubjective and rational that guarantees freedom for all. “It was first the Germanic Peoples, through Christianity, who came to the awareness that every human is free by virtue of being human, and that the freedom of spirit comprises our most human nature” (Hegel 1988, 21).
The critics of Hegel have been as passionate as his disciples. Of the former we may count Thomas Carlyle (1795-1881) and the historical school at Basel: J.J. Bachofen (1815-1887), Jacob Burckhardt (1818-1897), and a younger Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900). What unites them is a shared belief that historiography should highlight rather than obscure the achievements of individuals under the banner of necessary rational progress, a general ridicule of any historical process which brings about providential ends in the face of overwhelming global suffering, an anti-statist political stance, and a disavowal of progress as coextensive with the expansion of social welfare, intellectualism, and utility. Past epochs were not merely some preparatory ground on the way to the comfortably modern Hegelian or Marxist state, but stand on their own as inherently superior cultures and healthier models of culture life. For Bachofen and Nietzsche, this meant the ancient Greeks, for Burckhardt the aristocrats of the Italian Renaissance. So too ought the remarkable individuals of these eras be seen as fully-willed heroes rather than as Hegelian ‘world-historical individuals’ who appear only when the world process requires a nudge in the direction that providence had already chosen apart from them.
Of the latter group, we may count his disciples both on the left and the right, and prominent theorists of history like Ludwig Feuerbach (1804-1872), David Friedrich Strauss (1808-1874), Eduard von Hartmann (1842-1906), Max Stirner (1806-1856), Georg Lukács (1885-1971), Arnold Toynbee (1889-1975), Herbert Marcuse (1898-1979), Alexandre Kojève (1902-1968), and Theodor Adorno (1903-1969). Most recently the general outline of Hegel’s philosophy of history has been adopted in Francis Fukuyama’s (1952—) controversial The End of History (1992).
But without question the most important philosophical engagement with Hegel’s historiography is that of Karl Marx (1818-1883), whose own account of the past is often considered a sort of ‘upside-down’ version of Hegel’s Weltprozess. Even while Marx maintains Hegel’s belief in dialectical progress and historical inevitability, he supplants his speculative method with a historical materialism that views the transitions of epochs in terms of the relationship between production and ownership. Marx’s account of the past has obviously had pervasive political and economic influences; but his philosophy of history has also won many modern and contemporary adherents among a wide number of practicing historians, who regard material conditions as opposed to motivational conditions, as sufficient for historical explanation.
Perhaps the most common complaint against the Hegelians was that their speculative systems overlooked the empirical facts of history. This explains to some degree the partition, new to the 19th century, between philosophers of history and practicing historians, who were themselves often quite reflective on the philosophical issues of their discipline. Friedrich August Wolf (1759-1824), the first to enter the ranks of the German academy as a classical philologist, was exemplary in this respect. Though more focused on religious and romantic historians, Wolf rejected teleological systems generally by his demand that interpretation be grounded in the combination of a comprehensive sense for the contextual whole of a particular epoch and rigorous attention to the details of textual evidence. Wolf’s 1795 Prolegomena zu Homer is a landmark in source criticism and the first modern attempt to treat history as a genuine science.
While the Romantic historians tried to coopt the intuitive and holistic aspects of Wolf, the influence of his methodological rigor was shared by two rival schools of thought about the possibility of knowledge in antiquity: the Sprachphilologen and the Sachphilologen. J.G.J. Hermann (1772-1848), led the Sprachphilologen in Leipzig along with his followers Karl Lachmann (1793-1851) and Moritz Haupt (1808-1874). For them, knowledge of antiquity concerns principally its verifiability conditions. Since any claim about what Plato, Euripides, or Caesar ‘meant’ requires an evidenced demonstration of their actual words, the philologist’s task should be concerned principally with affixing an as-perfect-as-possible edition of their text. In the 21st century, the legacy of Sprachphilologie can be seen in the tradition of a ‘critical edition’ of an author’s work. The Sachphilologen accepted the demand for critical rigor, but rejected that our knowledge of antiquity should be restricted to written texts. August Boeckh (1785-1867), F.G. Welcker (1784-1868), and Karl Otfried Müller (1797-1840) took seriously the critical methods of Wolf, but cast a wider net in order to incorporate the artifacts, art, and culture. If rigorous proof was sacrificed thereby, then it was repaid by a more comprehensive sense of the genuine life of antiquity. Although sometimes underappreciated by historians of historiography, this debate gave rise to two sets of pervasively influential fields: Sprachphilologie’s demand for rigorous evidence was a forerunner of ‘scientific’ historiography in the mid-19th and 20th centuries; Sachphilologie’s holism laid the groundwork for serious work in archeology, anthropology, numismatics, epigraphy, and a number of other historical disciplines.
What Wolf did for philology, Leopold von Ranke (1795-18860) did for historiography generally. Although arguably exaggerated, his famous claim that historians should not interpret the past subjectively but re-present it wie es eingentlich gewesen ist, or ‘as it really was’, became the rallying cry for practicing historians to reject both the Hegelian system building and the Romantic narratives. And where Wolf sought the scientific character of history in the demonstrability of its evidence, Ranke and propagators such as Heinrich von Sybel (1817-1895) sought it in the disinterested character of its researchers. The historian should be like a clear mirror of the past, absent the biases, political aims, and religious zealotry that distort the image of the real and genuine past. In opposition to the Hegelian and Marxist ranking of ages according to some a priori criterion, Ranke sided with Herder in believing ‘every age is next to God’. To prevent prejudice and hasty generalizations, the historian must not settle for hearsay, but work intensively with official documents and archival records.
In the 20th century, however, and by figures as diverse as E.H. Carr (1892-1982) and Walter Benjamin (1892-1940), Ranke’s hope for empirical objectivity had been characterized as naïvely realist or else as an ironic example of how Western, Christian, economically privileged, and male perspectives masquerade as objectivity. The French Annales School, led by Fernand Braudel (1902-1985), sought to meet these challenges while restoring the Rankean vision of objective historiography.
The mid-1800’s saw another group of historical theorists emerge who were concerned principally to show that the scientific character of historiography concerned its use of the same logic of explanation utilized by the natural scientists. Auguste Comte (1798-1857), founder of positivism, considered history to be a sort of ‘social physics’, which limited explanation to relations among observable phenomena. Any claims to apprehend the ‘real essences’ behind the empirical data was prohibited as a foray into speculative metaphysics. Through empirical inquiry alone we can discover the natural laws that govern historical change. Henry Thomas Buckle’s (1821-1862) History of Civilization in England (1857) made clear that these laws could neither be divined philosophically nor with theological suppositions about divine providence, but could be described statistically in keeping with the empirical methods of the natural sciences.
The most comprehensive advance in the logic of historical inquiry came at this time from John Stuart Mill (1806-1873). Even while he rejected Jeremy Bentham’s (1748-1832) overly reductive hypothesis that all humans are guided simply by pleasure and pain, he maintained the possibility of discovering behavioral laws that would allow us to deduce the meaning of particular actions and predict the future with at least some degree of certainty:
[T]he uniformities of co-existence obtaining among phenomena which are effects of causes, must (as we have so often observed) be corollaries from the laws of causation by which these phenomena are really determined. […] The fundamental problem, therefore, of the social science, is to find the laws according to which any state of society produces the states which succeeds it and takes its place. (Mill 1843, 631)
Despite constraining their explanations to the empirical, many positivists held the belief that history was progressing as a necessary lawful order in terms of both its moral and intellectual development. Comte’s “law of three stages,” for example, held that the human mind and by extension the cultural institutions that result from it follow a strict progression from a ‘theological’ view of things, to the ‘metaphysical’, and finally to the ‘scientific’. Critics have charged that Comte is in this way little better than Hegel in positing an overarching structure to events and a certain zealotry about human progress. Nevertheless, Comte’s insistence that empirical laws are deducible from and predictive of human behavior has had decisive influence in the development of sociology and social psychology, especially in the writing of Émile Durkheim (1858-1917) and Max Weber (1864-1920), as well as upon 20th century explanatory positivism.
Also in conscious opposition to the Hegelians stood the Post-Kantians Wilhem Dilthey (1833-1911), William Windelband (1848-1915), and Heinrich Rickert (1863-1936). Their shared exhortation – ‘back to Kant!’– involved the recognition, absent in both the practicing historians and in the positivists, that knowledge was necessarily mediated by the pre-given structures of the subject of knowing.
Dilthey’s lifelong and never-finalized project was to provide for the ‘human sciences’ – Geisteswissenschaften – what Kant had for metaphysics: a programmatic schemata of the possible logical forms of inquiry such that the necessarily true could be separated from both the arbitrary and the speculative. This involved his supposition that all expressed historical agency is a manifestation of one of three classes of mental states: judgments, actions, and expressions of experience. To understand the working of history is to understand how this trio – described as an inner Lebenszusammenhang – is exercised in all the empirically observable features of the human world. An advantage over the natural scientist’s explanation of physical objects, this descriptive understanding is aided by the analogies we might draw with the understanding of our own inner experiences. We have an inherent sort of sympathetic awareness of historical events since the agents involved in them are psychologically motivated in ways not wholly dissimilar to ourselves.
Windelband took up Dilthey’s suggestions about the differences between history and other sciences on the question of values to forge his own methodological distinction between erklären and verstehen, explanation and understanding. The biggest difference was not just that history involved values, but that the very means by which we come to our knowledge about the past differs from that by which we explain objects external to us. Science deals in invariable laws, in generalities, and considers its individual objects only insofar as they are instances of their classes. For the historian, however, it is the particular that requires examination: Caesar not as an instance of some general rule about how emperors behave, but as a unique, unrepeatable phenomenon distinct from Alexander, Charlemagne, and Ying Zheng. And from particulars alone general laws cannot be formed. In this way, history is ideographic and descriptive rather than nomothetic or law-positing, and as such, more concerned to describe and understand than to explain.
Heinrich Rickert accepted Windelband’s methodological distinction as well as Dilthey’s attempt to provide the outlines of a distinctively historical logic. But Rickert stressed, more than they, the psychological dimension of historiography. What an historian held as interesting, or what they choose to present of the practical infinity of possible historical inquiries, was not a matter of reason but a psychology of value. And because historiography was value-driven, any attempt to excise its subjective foundation was not only unwarranted but impossible. These practical interests do not force history to resolve into a merely relativistic narrativity, Rickert thought, since human nature was sufficiently uniform to allow for inter-subjectively compelling accounts even if there is never proof in the positivist sense.
The direct influence of post-Kantian philosophy of history is not as pronounced as the teleological or scientific. But the notion that history is a unique sort of inquiry with its own methodology, logic of explanation, and standards of adjudication has been echoed in various ways by figures from Benedetto Croce (1866-1952) and Georg Simmel (1858-1918), to R. G. Collingwood (1889-1943) and Michael Oakeshott (1901-1990); so too has Dilthey’s search for the cognitive and psychological conditions for historical inquiry been taken up by Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) and by the Frankfurt School of Critical Theory. The hermeneutics of Hans-Georg Gadamer (1900-2002) are in some respects a critical engagement with the Post-Kantian attempt to recover the past as it was apart from the ‘historically conditioned consciousness’ (wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewußtsein) that predetermines our approach to particular texts and, ultimately, the past as a whole.
As diverse as continental philosophy has been, it would not be an unwarranted generalization to say that all thinkers and schools have in one way or another been focused on history. And they have mostly been so in terms of two distinct conceptual foci: historicity and narrativity.
It was Nietzsche’s On the Uses and Disadvantages of History for Life (1874) that first called into question not just how we could obtain knowledge of the past, but whether and to what extent our attempt to know the past is itself a life-enhancing or life-enervating activity. As human beings, we are unique in the animal world insofar as we are constantly burdened with our pasts as well as our futures, unable to forget those incidents which it would be otherwise preferable to bury on the one hand, and unable to ignore what must become of us on the other. History is not just something we study objectively, but an experience through which we must live and by which we seemingly without conscious control burden ourselves for a variety of psychological reasons.
Martin Heidegger’s (1889-1976) Being and Time (1927) attempts to give a comprehensive analysis to this experience. His overarching project is to answer the question ‘what is Being?’ But in doing so, he recognizes that the truth about Being, that is, our openness to the question of Being, has been gradually covered over in the history of philosophy. From the Presocratics, when the question of the meaning of being was at its most open, to the nihilistic academic age of the 20th century, philosophical history becomes a history of the meaning of Being. The end of philosophy, wherein the specialized sciences have entirely preoccupied themselves with particular beings while summarily ignoring Being itself, beckons a new and intrinsically historical engagement. Accordingly, Heidegger’s own historiography of philosophy is a working-back from this modern dead-end in the hopes of reopening the question of Being itself.
Heidegger’s historiography is, however, more than just an academic recitation of what various other philosophers have said. Human beings, what Heidegger famously terms Dasein, are characterized above all by their ‘being there’ in the world, their ‘thrown-ness’ in existence, which entails as it did for Nietzsche their relation to Being itself in terms of both their pasts and their existential march toward the common future horizon: death. The self as Dasein is constantly engaged in the project of coming out of its past and moving into its future as the space of possibilities in which alone it can act. As such an inextricable part of the human person is its historical facticity.
The existential dimension of Heidegger’s conception of historicity had a profound influence on figures like Martin Buber (1878-1965), Karl Jaspers (1883-1969), Hannah Arendt (1906-1975), Emmanuel Levinas (1906-1995), Jan Patočka (1907-1977), and Paul Ricouer (1913-2005). Jean Paul Sartre (1905-1980), in particular, focused on the existential aspects of the past, which he conceives in terms of a blend of the Marxist material conditions for human action and a quasi psycho-analytic unfolding of the phenomenological self. Man is an historical praxis, for Sartre, a continual project that is both being produced by its past and producing its future in a way that will determine that future person’s possibilities and limits. Sartre’s well-known conception of authenticity is intrinsically historical insofar as it involves the recognition of our personal freedom in the context of the material conditions history imposes upon us. Albeit in less existential terms, the Frankfurt School also founded their view of the subject and of the world in a combination of Marxist materialist historiography and psycho-analysis.
In the latter decades of the 20th century, continental philosophy of history turned its attention to epistemological questions about historical narrative. Again Nietzsche’s reflections on history are a crucial influence, especially his contention that truth is no straightforward or objective correspondence between the world and the proposition but a historically contingent outcome of the continuous struggle between the interests of interpreters. As such, philosophy must concern itself with an historical investigation of how these truth practices function within and against the backdrop of their historical facticities.
Michel Foucault (1926-1984) characterized his own project as the historical investigation of the means of truth production. His earlier work is characterized by what he calls ‘archeology’. His History of Madness (1961) begins a series of works that denies a single fixed meaning for phenomena, but undertakes to show how meaning transmogrifies over time through a series of cultural practices. In The Order of Things (1966), archeology is characterized as a description of the transitions between cultural discourses in a way that highlights their structural and contextual meaning while undermining any substantive notion of the author of those discourses. Foucault’s later work, though he never repudiates his archeological method, is characterized as a ‘genealogy’. The effort, again roughly Nietzschean, is to understand the past in terms of the present, to show that the institutions we find today are neither the result of teleological providence nor an instantiation of rational decision making, but emerge from a power play of discourses carried over from the past. This does not mean that history should study the ‘origins’ of those practices; on the contrary it denies the notion of origin as an illegitimate abstraction from what is a continuous interaction of discourses. History should instead concern itself with those moments when the contingencies of the past emerge or descend out of the conflict of its discourses, with how the past reveals a series of disparities rather than progressive steps.
The conception of history as a play of power-seeking discursive practices was reflected back upon the practices of the historian. A row of postmodern philosophers such as Roland Barthes (1915-1980), Paul de Man (1919-1983), Jean-François Lyotard (1924-1988), Gilles Deleuze (1925-1995), Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe (1940-2007), and Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) came to view not just the events of history but also the writing of history to be necessarily colored by power-based subjectivity. This power play crystallizes in the meta-narrative structures grafted upon the world by the philosophers of history. Indeed, Lyotard’s The Postmodern Condition (1979) characterizes the entire postmodern project as “incredulity toward meta-narratives” (Lyotard 1984, xxiv). With respect to philosophy of history, this entails rejecting both the grand Hegelian ‘master discourse’ about progress and also the Enlightenment categories of generalization from which moral lessons are supposed to be derivable. Rather than a dialectical logic that would seek unity among past events, the postmodern condition drives us to see the disjointedness, dissimilarity, and diversity of events and people.
Lyotard’s rejection of traditional unities leads a contemporary postmodernist like Jean-Luc Nancy (1940-) to refocus history on smaller-scale and self-enclosed ‘immanent’ communities like brotherhoods or families rather than on society writ-large. Required for that is a new way of writing history that embraces a multiplicity of perspectives and standards of judgment, and, by extension, a willingness to embrace the plurality of moral and political lessons that can be drawn absent conviction in a single correct narrative. Postmodern theory was influential, for but one example, in the post-colonialism of Edward Said’s (1935-2003) Orientalism (1978), which became prominent for its attempt to open a discursive space for competing non-dominant narratives by the so-called ‘sub-altern’ other. Standpoint narratives, exercises in ‘cultural memory’, and oral history have lately won increasing popularity.
Like analytic philosophy generally, analytic philosophy of history is partly characterized by its Anglophone heritage and partly by a propensity to treat individual problems rather than offering comprehensive interpretations of reality. The major difference between analytic and continental philosophy of history concerns the former’s almost exclusive focus on epistemological issues of historiography and a general indifference toward questions of historicity.
Anglophone philosophy of history is also marked by its conscious self-distancing from the teleological systems of the Hegelians. There were essentially two reasons for this, one political and one epistemological, brought to eloquent expression in Karl Popper’s (1902-1994) The Open Society and Its Enemies (1945) and The Poverty of Historicism (1957). Concerning the former, Popper charged that the ideological impetus for the totalitarian regimes of the previous hundred years was their shared belief in a national or religious destiny that was both guaranteed and justified by a grand historical process. Whether Bismarck, Communism, Fascism, or Nazism, all were confident that history was inexorably marching toward a global regime that would guarantee their way of life and justify the actions taken in their name. The Anglophone tradition was inspired to deny the grand teleological narrative partly as a political aversion to this way of thinking. Epistemologically, Popper’s ‘falsifiability’ criterion of positive knowledge also targeted the teleological systems of the 19th century. Largely accepting Bertrand Russell’s (1872-1970) natural ontology, he argued that the teleologists began from non-falsifiable assumptions about metaphysical processes, which ignored the empirical facts of the past for the sake of positing what they thought the past must have been. The focus of philosophy of history in the Anglophone world after Popper turned away from attempts to provide grand narratives in order to deal with specific meta-historical problems.
One problem, carried over from the 19th century scientific philosophers of history, was the logic of historical explanation. Similar to their positivist counterparts, the earlier analytics held explanations to be justified insofar as they were able to render historical events predictable by means of deducing their particulars under a general law. The most well-known expression comes from C.G. Hempel (1905-1997). “Historical explanation, too, aims at showing that the event in question was not a ‘matter of chance’, but was to be expected in view of certain antecedent or simultaneous conditions. The expectation referred to is not prophecy or divination, but rational scientific anticipation which rests on the assumption of general laws” (Hempel 1959, 348f). The logic itself is straightforward: “The explanation of the occurrence of an event of some specific kind E at a certain place and time consists, as it is usually expressed, in indicating the causes or determining factors of E” (Ibid, 345). In this respect, the logic of historical explanation is no different from the logic of scientific explanation. And while they may be more difficult to locate, once the laws of historical change have been discovered by psychology, anthropology, economics, or sociology, the predictive force of historiography should theoretically rival that of the natural sciences.
Hempel’s confidence came under attack from those like Popper who thought that history could not offer absolute regularities and maintained that predictions were never inviolable but at best probable ‘trends’. Attack also came from R.G. Collingwood, who denied the existence of covering laws in history and accordingly the applicability of scientific explanatory mechanisms. For him, as well as for Michael Oakeshott, history is a study of the uniqueness of the past and not its generalities, and always for the sake of understanding rather than proving or predicting. In agreement with Aristotle, Oakeshott believes, “the moment historical facts are regarded as instances of general laws, history is dismissed” (Oakeshott 1933, 154). It is the particular, especially the particular person, that history studies, and as such the attempt to predict their behavior nomothetically is not only impossible but misunderstands the very reason for historical inquiry in the first place.
Contrary to Aristotle, the unscientific character of history for Collingwood and Oakeshott renders it no less-worthy a course of study. Indeed, following the Post-Kantian 19th century philosophers of history and ultimately Vico, they thought the past proves itself more intelligible precisely because the objects under investigation can be understood from the ‘inside’ rather than explained from a standpoint outside the object. The proper task of history, Collingwood thought, was not to address mere general naturalistic events but the rationality of specific actions. A mass migration can be studied by the sociologist, the geographer, or the volcanologist from the ‘outside’ as a natural event. What marks the historian, by contrast, is her interest in the actions of the migrating individuals in terms of their intentions and decisions. While this may not be recorded in any palpable evidence, Collingwood was consistent with Herder in thinking that the historian must attempt to ‘get inside the head’ of the agents being investigated under the presumption that they typically make similarly reasonable choices as she would in the same situation. Collingwood’s advocation of a sort of empathic projection into the mind of past agents has been criticized as armchair psychologism. It would be difficult to deny, however, that many working historians adopt Collingwood’s intuitivism rather than the Hempelian nomothetic deduction.
In the latter half of the 20th century, a number of explanatory theories were proposed which walk a middle line between the nomothetic and idealist proposals. W.H. Walsh (1913-1986) returned to William Whewell’s (1794-1866) conception of ‘colligation’ type explanations as a way of making the past intelligible. Here the effort is neither to demonstrate nor to predict, but to bring together various relevant events around a central unifying concept in order to make clear their interconnections:
What we want from historians is […] an account which brings out their connections and bearing on one another. And when historians are in a position to give such an account it may be said that they have succeeded in ‘making sense of’ or ‘understanding’ their material. (Walsh 1957, 299)
In this way, Walsh’s meta-theory sides neither with the ‘scientific’ philosophers of history of either the Comteian or Hempelian variety nor with the British idealists, but maintains that the explanatory force of historiography rests in its narrativity. Just as the pedagogical value of a narrative is not reducible to what it can demonstrate, so the value of history rests in its ability to make sense of various features of the lives and times of others.
William Dray (1921-2009), too, argued that historical explanation does not require the sufficient conditions for why something happened, but only the necessary conditions for describing how what did happen could possibly have happened. For example, if an historian accounts for the assassination of a king in terms of his unpopular policies and dishonest court, then this explains ‘how’ his assassination could possibly have occurred without relying on a Hempelian deduction from some suppositional law that claims all kings with unpopular policies and dishonest courts will necessarily be assassinated.
A second problem addressed by 20th century Anglophone philosophers of history concerned the nature and possibility of objectivity. While all would agree with Ranke that historiography should endeavor to expunge overt biases and prejudices, the question remains to what extent this could or even should be done. Carl Becker (1873-1945) was perhaps the first Anglophone thinker to take up Croce’s claim that all history is ‘contemporary’ in the sense of being written necessarily from the perspective of present-day interests. Along these lines Charles Beard (1874-1978) had a series of arguments against the Rankean ideal of objectivity. Historiography cannot observe its subject matter since by definition what is in the past is no longer in the present; evidence is always fragmentary and never controllable the way a scientific experiment can control its variables; historians impose structures that the events themselves do not have; and their accounts are selective in ways that betray the historians’ own interests. Nevertheless, Beard would not come to endorse the sort of relativistic narrativism of his post-modern continental counterparts.
It certainly seems true to say that historians select – insofar as a map is itself not the road – and that their selection is a matter of what they personally esteem worth discussing, whether on the level of their general topic or in terms of which causes they consider relevant within an explanation. But selectivity of itself does not imply prejudice; and a careful reader is more often than not able to distinguish overtly prejudiced accounts from one whose selections are balanced and fair. Moreover, the fact that they are selective would not serve as a prima facie principle of discernment between historians and scientists, since the latter are every bit as selective in the topics under their purview. Even if science and historiography choose their inquiries as a matter of personal interest, both operate under norms to be impartial, to use only reputable evidence, and to present ‘the whole truth’, even should it call into question their hypotheses.
Isaiah Berlin (1909-1997) considered the problem of historiographical objectivity from the perspective of the objects written about rather than exclusively the writer. While the scientist has little emotional commitment to the chemicals or atoms under examination, historians often have strong feelings about the moral consequences of their subjects. The choice between historical designations like ‘terrorist’ and ‘freedom fighter’, ‘sedition’ and ‘revolution’, or ‘ruler’ and ‘tyrant’ are normatively connotative in a way that scientific descriptions can easily avoid. Yet to write about the holocaust or slavery in a purposefully detached way misses the intensely personal character of these events and thus fails to communicate their genuine meaning, even if doing so detracts from their status as objective records in a way scientific history would disallow. Historians justifiably maintain “that minimal degree of moral or psychological evaluation which is necessarily involved in viewing human beings as creatures with purposes and motives (and not merely as causal factors in the procession of events)” (Berlin 1954, 52f). What precisely that minimal degree is, however, and how a working historian can navigate moral gray areas without falling back into inherited biases, remains difficult to account for.
Beard’s contentions about the possibility of objectivity led some philosophers of history to wonder whether the past was something that existed only in the mind of the historian, if, in other words, the past was constructed rather than discovered. For a constructivist like Leon Goldstein (1927-2002), this does not imply an ontological anti-realism wherein none but perceptible objects are considered real. For Goldstein, it would be senseless for historians to doubt that the world they study ever existed; constructivists are equally constrained by evidence as their objectivist counterparts. And for both the evidence with which the historian works concerns a genuinely past state of affairs outside their own minds. The meaningfulness of that evidence –what the evidence is evidence ‘of’— is, for the constructivist, only imbued by the mind of the historian who considers it. A Roman coin is a piece of evidence dating from a certain era and can provide evidence ‘of’ that era’s monetary policy and trade. But that coin is also evidence ‘of’ the natural environment of every single moment it was buried in the ground thereafter, providing evidence, if one were so interested, in the corrosive effects of the acidity levels near the banks of the Tiber. What that evidence is evidence ‘of’ depends upon the mind of the historian who utilizes it to construct a meaningful account in accord with her interests. Were the viewer of the coin wholly oblivious to either Rome or the natural environment, the coin would not cease to exist, of course; but it would cease to evidence either of these topics. In that sense at least, even non-postmodern Anglophone philosophers of history admit the necessarily interpretive and constructive aspects of historiography. Peter Novick (1934-) and Richard Evans (1947-) have recently taken up the limits of constructivism on behalf of professional historians.
How causes function within historical accounts was the third major question for 20th century Anglophone philosophers of history. Historians, like most people, tend to treat causal terms like ‘influenced’, ‘generated’, ‘brought about’, ‘led to’, ‘resulted in’, among others, as unproblematic diagnostics to explain how events come about. For philosophers generally and for philosophers of history specifically, causation presents a multifaceted set of problems. According to the positivist theory of explanation, an adequate causal account explicates the sum total of necessary and sufficient conditions for an event to take place. This ideal bar is acknowledged as having been set too high for practicing historians, since there is perhaps a near infinity of necessary causes for any historical event. That the assassination of Archduke Ferdinand was a cause of the First World War is clear; but necessary, too, was an indescribably myriad set of other economic, social, political, geographical, and even personal factors that led to such a wide-reaching and complex phenomenon to take place precisely as it did: had Gavrilo Princip not associated with the Young Bosnian movement, had gravity failed that day causing bullets to float harmlessly upward, had the Austro-Hungarian alliance not held the southern Slavic provinces, had Franz Ferdinand decided to stay at home on June 28th, 1914 – were any of these conditions actual, the course of history would have been altered. Thus, their contraries were necessary for having produced the exact outcome that obtained. Because it would be quite impossible, if not ridiculous, for an historian to attempt to record all of these, he must admit that his explanation fails to satisfy the positivist criterion and therefore remains only a partial one –an ‘explanation sketch’ in Hempel’s phrasing.
R.G. Collingwood was again influential in overturning the positivist view by distinguishing causes and motives. Physical causes such as properly working guns or the presence of gravity are necessary for assassination in a strictly physical sense. But no historian would bother mentioning them. Only motives, the reasons agents have for conducting their actions, are typically referenced: what motives Princip had for firing and what motives the leaders of Germany, France, and Russia had to mobilize their armies. A proper explanation, for Collingwood, involves making clear the reasons why the key actors participated in an event as they did.
While Collingwood’s theory is intuitively suggestive and matches rather well the character of most historical accounts, some philosophers have noted shortcomings. One is that Collingwood presumes a freedom of choice that relies upon an outmoded notion of cognitive agency. The same reasons that are purported to have been causally efficacious are often enough retrospective justifications supplied by agents who in reality acted without conscious deliberation. Second, even if freedom of choice is presumed, transparency about an agent’s motives cannot be. Collingwood often appeals to a particular motive as what a reasonable being would elect to do in a certain situation. Yet those standards of reasonability more often betray the historian’s own projection than anything psychologically demonstrable. The third is that, as historians themselves often note, many actions do not result from the motives of their agents but from the confluence of several motives whose outcome is unpredictable. The motive for Princip’s assassination was not to start a world-wide conflict anymore than Robert E. Lee’s capture of John Brown at Harper’s Ferry was intended to begin the American Civil War. Both actions were nevertheless crucial causes of consequences whose main actors could not have foreseen them, much less have willed.
Following the conception of causation in legal theory promulgated by H.L.A. Hart (1907-1992) and Tony Honoré (1921-), some philosophers consider a proper causal ascription in history to amount to a description of both intention and abnormality. Just as in legal cases, where conditions in history are normalized the abnormal or untypical decision or event is assigned responsibility for what results. In our example of the causes of WWI, the long history of constant political bickering between the great powers was of course part of the story, but the assassination of the Archduke is assigned responsibility since it stands so untypically out of its context.
The shift in thinking about historical causes as metaphysical entities which bring about change themselves to a set of epistemological grounds that explain why change occurred has led some recent philosophers to adopt David Lewis’s (1941-2001) notion of counterfactuals. “We think of a cause as something that makes a difference, and the difference it makes must be a difference from what would have happened without it. Had it been absent, its effects ─ some of them, at least, and usually all ─ would have been absent as well” (Lewis 1986, 161). Counterfactuals had long been employed by historians in the commonsense way that ascribes sufficient cause to that object or event whose consequence could not have happened without it, in the form ‘were it not for A, B never would have occurred’ or ‘No B without A’. To adapt our previous example, one might justifiably think the assassination of Archduke Ferdinand was the sufficient cause of WWI if and only if one thinks WWI would not have happened in its absence. Yet whereas counterfactuals are easily enough tested in science by running multiple experiments that control for the variable in question, the unrepeatability of historical events renders traditional counterfactual statements little more than interesting speculations. To ask how Rome would have developed had Caesar never crossed the Rubicon may be a fascinating thought experiment, but nothing remotely verifiable since a contrary-to-fact conditional is by definition unable to be tested given only one course of facts. Lewis would revise this traditional notion of counterfactuals to include the semantics of maximally similar possible worlds, wherein two worlds are supposed entirely identical save for one alteration which brings about the event in question. Under the previous description of the necessary conditions for WWI, Franz Ferdinand’s assassination was considered a necessary condition. Lewis’s revised version instead presents two maximally similar worlds, world ‘A’ where the assassination takes place and world ‘B’ which is identical in all respects except that the assassination does not take place. Under this model, it is at best debatable whether war would not have broken out anyway in world ‘B’ given the highly charged political atmosphere in Europe at that time. And as such we are invited to question whether assigning the assassination a causal role is justified.
Characterized by its criticism of the 20th century Anglophone attempts to epistemologically ground historical explanation, objectivity, and causation as universal functions of logic, the Postmodern legacy in philosophy of history has been taken up by three contemporary theorists in particular: Hayden White (1928-), Frank Ankersmit (1945-), and Keith Jenkins (1943-). Each maintains that the analysis of these epistemological issues wrongly circumvents questions about interpretation and meaning, and each considers the search for once-and-for-all demonstrations an attempt to avoid the relativistic character of historical truth. Hayden White inaugurated this ‘linguistic turn’ in historiography with his Meta-History: The Historical Imagination in Nineteenth-Century Europe (1979). By focusing on the structures and strategies of historical accounts, White came to see historiography and literature as fundamentally the same endeavor. Historians, like fiction writers, wrote according to a four-fold logic of emplotment, according to whether they saw their subject matter as a romance, tragedy comedy, or satire. This aim stems from their political ideology – anarchist, radical, conservative, or liberal respectively – and is worked out by means of a dominant rhetorical trope – metaphor, metonymy, synecdoche, or irony respectively. Representative philosophers – Nietzsche, Marx, Hegel, and Croce – and representative historians – Michelet, Tocqueville, Ranke, and Burckhardt – are themselves tied to these modes of emplotment. While White’s architectonic has come under criticism as being both overly reductive in its structure and a warrant for relativism, other theorists have taken up his banner.
Among these, Frank Ankersmit endorses the general outline of White’s narrativism, while stressing the constructivist aspect of our experience of the past. There is no ‘ideal narratio’ for Ankersmit, because ultimately there is no ontological structure onto which the single ‘correct’ narration can be correspondentially grafted. Alongside Gianni Vattimo (1936-), Sande Cohen (1946-), and Alan Munslow (1947-), Keith Jenkins takes White’s anti-realism in a decidedly deconstructionist fashion. Jenkins exhorts an end to historiography as customarily practiced. Since historians can never be wholly objective, and since historical judgment cannot pretend to a correspondential standard of truth, all that remains of history are the congealed power structures of a privileged class. In a statement that summarizes much of contemporary historical theory, Jenkins concludes the following:
[Historiography] now appears as a self-referential, problematic expression of ‘interests’, an ideologically-interpretive discourse without any ‘real’ access to the past as such; unable to engage in any dialogue with ‘reality’. In fact, ‘history’ now appears to be just one more ‘expression’ in a world of postmodern expressions: which of course is what it is. (Jenkins 1995, 9)
Although 21st century philosophy of history has widened the gap between practicing historians and theorists of history, and although it has lost some of the popularity it enjoyed from the early-19th to mid-20th century, it will remain a vigorous field of inquiry so long as the past itself continues to serve as a source of philosophical curiosity.
Anthony K. Jensen
City University of New York / Lehman College
U. S. A.
Last updated: February 14, 2012 | Originally published: