Shadworth Hodgson’s life was an example of rare devotion to philosophy. He had no profession and filled no public office, but spent his time in systematic reflection and writing; and his long life gave him the opportunity of reviewing, confirming, and improving upon his first thoughts. There were two periods in his activity. In the former of these he published three books: Time and Space in 1865, The Theory of Practice in 1870, and The Philosophy of Reflection in 1878. Shortly thereafter he was instrumental in founding ‘the Aristotelian Society for the systematic study of philosophy,’ and he remained its president for fourteen years. This led to contact with other minds who looked at the same subjects from different points of view. He read many papers to the society, which were published in pamphlet form and in its Proceedings, and he built up his own system afresh in the light of familiar criticism. It took final form in The Metaphysic of Experience, a work of four volumes published in 1898.
As an analysis of experience, Hodgson’s philosophy falls into line with a characteristic English tradition. It agrees with this tradition also in taking the simple feeling as the ultimate datum of experience. But, even here, and wherever there is experience, there is a distinction to be drawn–not the traditional distinction between subject and object, but that between consciousness and its object. There are always two aspects in any bit of experience–that of the object itself or the objective aspect, and that of the awareness of it or the subjective aspect; and these two are connected by the relation of knowledge. The sciences are concerned with the objective aspect only; philosophy has to deal with the subjective aspect, or the conscious process which is fundamental and common to all the various objects. Beyond this conscious reference there is nothing. The mirage of absolute existence, wholly apart from knowledge, is a common-sense prejudice. Consciousness is commensurate with being; all existence has a subjective aspect. But this doctrine, he holds, is misinterpreted when mind and body are supposed to interact or when mental and bodily facts are regarded as parallel aspects of the same substance. In psychology Hodgson may be called a materialist, unfit as that name would be to describe his final philosophical attitude. Ideas do not determine one another, nor does desire cause volition; the only real condition known to us is matter. And yet matter itself is a composite existence; it can be analyzed into empirical precepts; and therefore it is itself conditioned by something which is not material: the very term existence implies relativity to some sort of consciousness or other. This is the conclusion of the general analysis of experience. Of the unseen world which lies beyond the material part of the world we cannot, he contends, have any speculative knowledge. But the ethical judgment and our own moral nature bring us into practical relation with that unseen world and thus permit a positive, although not a speculative, knowledge of it. In this way, in the final issue of his philosophy as well as in its fundamental positions, Hodgson regards himself as correcting and completing the work of Kant.
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Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: