Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Johann Christian Friedrich Hölderlin (1770-1843)

HolderlinAlthough J. C. F. Hölderlin has, since the beginning of the twentieth century, enjoyed the reputation of being one of Germany’s greatest poets, his recognition as an important philosophical figure is more recent. The revival of an interest in German Idealism, and the philosophical developments from Kant’s critical period to Hegel’s mature thought, have ensured that Hölderlin is given his due for his important philosophical insights. Hölderlin’s life was marked by theological training, together with Hegel and Schelling, followed by a period of simultaneous philosophical and poetic activity. Eventually, Hölderlin concentrated on poetry as a superior form of access to the truth. His theoretical philosophy is marked by an anti-foundationalist rebuttal of Fichte’s first principle. The key idea is that nothing can be said about what grounds the possibility of the subject-object relation, a primordial unity which Hölderlin calls Absolute Being. This central idea was crucial to the development of Schelling’s thought. Hölderlin’s ethical views emphasize an understanding of life as torn between two principles: a hankering after this original unity and freedom’s desire to constantly assert itself. His novel Hyperion illustrates this struggle and how the integration of these two principles is set as a goal for life. The superiority of poetry over philosophy in pointing to the truth is suggested through this novel plus several poems, and this theme was of particular interest for Heidegger’s later thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview
  2. Life and Philosophical Background
  3. Unity and Freedom
  4. The Self and Human Life
  5. Hölderlin’s Influence
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Overview

Johann Christian Friedrich Hölderlin is well known as a key figure of German romantic poetry. This recognition was, however, late to come, and it is chiefly in the first half of the twentieth century that he acquires his status as one of Germany’s greatest poets, and, in particular, became a key figure in Heidegger’s later thought. Hölderlin’s own contribution to philosophy, both in theoretical and literary form, has taken much longer to be acknowledged. It is of great importance, however, both for an understanding of the development of German Idealism and in relation to contemporary philosophical issues. Although Hölderlin left little published material of direct philosophical relevance, his personal acquaintance with Schiller, Novalis, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel ensured the dissemination of his ideas among his immediate contemporaries. In the second half of the twentieth century, two factors have been decisive in the renewed interest in Hölderlin as a philosopher. On the one hand, there has been a striking growth of scholarship in the philosophy that marks the transition from Kant to Hegel, chiefly through philosophers such as Dieter Henrich and Manfred Frank. On the other, a short philosophical text came to light in 1961, which for the first time presented key central tenets of Hölderlin’s thought in a concise form.

2. Life and Philosophical Background

Hölderlin was born in 1770 in Swabia in South-Western Germany. He studied theology and was originally destined for a career in the Lutheran church. His studies eventually took him, at the age of eighteen, to the famous Tübingen seminary where he studied with Hegel, as well as with his old school friend Schelling. Hölderlin came to Jena in 1794, after Fichte had taken over the chair of philosophy from Reinhold. During that period, Hölderlin was a staunch supporter of the French Revolution, which was seen by many German intellectuals as a source of hope for the future. Hölderlin found a position as a private tutor and fell passionately in love with his pupils’ mother, Susette Gontard. She was to be the inspiration behind the Diotima of his novel Hyperion. The emotional upheaval caused by the end of the impossible liaison with Susette had a detrimental effect on his health. In 1800, after his disillusionment with philosophy that led him to abandon any plans to find an academic position, he spent a year recovering in Switzerland and decided to devote the rest of his life to writing poetry. In 1802, the news of Susette’s death, however, drove him to near insanity. Treatment enabled him to continue writing at intervals while working as a librarian in Homburg until 1807 when he became insane (though harmless). In 1805, he was one of a group of Jacobin militants, led by his friend Isaac von Sinclair, involved in a conspiracy against the Elector of Württemberg. Hölderlin was accused of high treason, but thereafter was released on grounds of diminished mental capacity. He was taken to Tübingen where he lived until his death in 1843. Some form of poetic output continued in Tübingen, although these later poems are significantly marked by Hölderlin’s mental illness.

Hölderlin’s original philosophical thought emerged before his move to Jena: the main poetic work of philosophical interest, Hyperion, was started in Tübingen in 1792, and after the publication of a fragment in Schiller’s review Thalia, the full work was later published in two volumes in Jena. It is, however, in Jena that Hölderlin’s philosophical ideas took their definitive form, partly as a result of its bustling intellectual climate.

The philosophical background to his philosophical ideas can be traced back to Reinhold’s lectures and publications on Kant’s philosophy in the late 1780’s and early 1790’s. Reinhold, who was one of the main expositors of Kantian critical thought of that period, developed a philosophical system essentially aimed at providing Kant’s critical philosophy with a first principle. The need to underpin Kant’s system with such a ground was to prove a fundamental, but contentious, issue for the philosophical developments of the 1790’s in Germany.

Fichte echoed some of the criticisms that were to be addressed in the specifics of Reinhold’s first principle, the principle of consciousness (e.g. in Schulze’s Aenesidemus, see Giovanni and Harris, 2000), but agreed with the need for such a grounding and set out to provide his own first principle instead. The resulting system, the Wissenschaftslehre (Doctrine of science), first published in 1794, was Fichte’s attempt to develop a philosophical doctrine that would respect the spirit, if not the letter, of Kant’s critical philosophy. The first principle of this philosophy expressed a relation of the I to itself: “The I posits its own being unconditionally” (Fichte, 1994). Against any such grounding attempts, the circle of Jena philosophers around Niethammer claimed, in line with earlier criticism of Kant by Jacobi, that such an enterprise was flawed in principle; since any principle requires justification beyond itself, an infinite regress ensues. As a result, philosophy, for Niethammer’s circle, is an unending enterprise that approaches the truth but can never reach it.

This anti-foundationalist line became Hölderlin’s when he rejected Fichte’s philosophy in the mid-1790s, but the philosophical ideas that Hölderlin developed during this period were also motivated by other concerns. To understand these, we must turn to moral philosophy. Kant’s ethics had a profound influence on many writers of the time, and Schiller’s response is particularly important. In 1793, Schiller showed enthusiasm for Kant’s ethics of duty while querying the rigorism which some Kantian statements strongly suggest. Hence, Schiller’s famous joke that it seems Kant prefers the agent who would do his duty with displeasure, to one whose inclinations are in line with the commands of the moral law. Schiller claimed that a harmony of duty and inclination represented the highest ideal of morality, while Kant found inclinations to be worthless. In his letters, “On the Aesthetic Education of Man” (Schiller, 1982), he argues for the moral value of the aesthetic ideal of grace (Anmut). For Schiller, “grace” describes the moral beauty of an agent whose emotions have been educated by reason. Given Schiller’s endorsement of the basic tenets of Kant’s ethics, this notion of the “beautiful soul” is problematic. Indeed, it implies a purported reconciliation between the sublimity that attaches to the dutiful agent who, in his freedom, places the moral law above all inclinations, and the beauty of a harmony of inclinations and duty. Since the moral law, however, requires that the agent act out of duty regardless of what inclines her, this is hardly compatible with an ideal of harmony between duty and inclinations. As a result of the tension between the freedom of the moral agent and this ideal of harmony, the cogency of the proposed moral value of the beautiful soul becomes questionable.

3. Unity and Freedom

Hölderlin, in fact, sees these two aspects of human life, the “all-desiring, all-subjugating dangerous side of man,” i.e. freedom, and the “most beautiful condition he can achieve,” i.e. unity (preface to Hyperion in Thalia, 1794) as representing the essence of the human condition. This accounts for his understanding of human life as man’s “eccentric path”: an unreflective unity constitutes the core of our existence, but we cannot remain within it. Rather, it becomes something we strive towards with our freedom.

With this bi-polarity in mind, we can now appreciate Hölderlin’s contribution to the theoretical debate around Fichte’s attempts to find a foundational principle for philosophy. Fichte had proposed to ground philosophy on the pure relation of the I to itself. In Über Urtheil und Seyn (On Judgment and Being), a short manuscript that was only first published in 1961 (Hölderlin, 1972), Hölderlin points out that subjectivity cannot provide the first principle of philosophy since the I is always defined in relation to an object of judgment. This criticism of Fichte’s system may appear unfair as, in the 1797 edition of the Doctrine of Knowledge, he does discuss the fact that there must be a pre-reflective form of self-awareness. However, Fichte does not draw all the consequences from this observation. Hölderlin’s point is that such self-consciousness cannot be accounted for in terms of the I of judgment. The ground for the I’s reflective self-consciousness must, thus, be sought beyond the division between the subject ‘I’ and an object which this presupposes. Such a ground, Hölderlin calls “absolute Being. This is, moreover, the ground for all judgments in which the subject ‘I’ is distinguished from an object.

An original unity of subject and object in Being is what underpins their separation in judgment. Hölderlin, thus, defines Being as follows: “Where Subject and Object are absolutely, not just partially united…there and not otherwise can we talk of an absolute Being, as is the case in intellectual intuition (ibid., p. 515).” He understands judgment as the original cleavage of object from subject: “Judgment: is in the highest and strictest sense the original sundering of Subject and Object most intimately united in intellectual intuition, the very sundering which first makes Object and Subject possible (ibid., p.516).” Of Being, no further knowledge is possible. It is only known as the original unity that underpins all judgments. It, therefore, functions as a postulated ground rather than as a first principle.

4. The Self and Human Life

In terms of the understanding of the self, there are two types of self-awareness. In one sense, when I reflect upon myself, I am distinct from the object of my awareness. In another, I must understand myself as belonging to an original pre-reflective unity. The first provides the ground for the freedom of the I to raise itself above anything that is given in the empirical world. The second provides the self with an ideal of unity characterised by a belonging to Being. The “eccentric path” of life is, therefore, torn between these two poles of unity and freedom. The latter takes us away from the original unity while being grounded in it. The task of integrating the two poles in one’s life is that of bringing freedom to recognize the greater unity of Being, but this can only be a progressive and never-ending enterprise.

The novel Hyperion presents different practical approaches to dealing with the bi-polarity of the “eccentric path.” This novel is a collection of letters, mostly written by the novel’s modern Greek hero, Hyperion, to his German friend, Bellarmin, in which he recounts his adventures, states of mind, and longings. The original unity which Hyperion was, from the outset, keen to recapture, is understood in different ways by Hyperion at different stages of his life. Ultimately, he will realize that none of these is satisfactory, but that they represented ways of approaching that which is the underlying unity, i.e. Being, throughout the course of his life.

These different representations of unity are of ancient Greece (also reflected in childhood), of modern Greece liberated from Turkish rule, and of aesthetic beauty. This trilogy is not random but corresponds to different temporal understandings of the idea of the fundamental unity of Being. It is first grasped as belonging to the past (Childhood/Ancient Greece), then the future (liberated Greece), and finally the present (immediacy of aesthetic beauty). Each way of life is exemplified by a character with whom Hyperion is connected, respectively through a master-pupil relationship (Adamas), friendship (Alabanda) and love (Diotima).

In each case, Hyperion attempts to fully adopt the corresponding way of being only to find its limitations and be confronted with the need to move on. Thus, with Adamas, Hyperion feels compelled to leave his master and seek another way of life because of man’s lack of contentment and constant desire to go beyond his current condition: “We delight in flinging ourselves into the night of the unknown, into the cold strangeness of any other world, and, if we could, we would leave the realm of the sun and rush headlong beyond the comet’s track” (Hölderlin, 1990, p. 10) [“Wir haben unsre Lust daran, uns in die Nacht des Unbekannten, in die kalte Fremde irgend einer andern Welt zu stürzen, und wär’ es möglich, wir verlieβen der Sonne Gebiet und stürmten über des Irrsterns Grenzen hinaus” (Hölderlin, 1999, p.492)]. After leaving home and learning about the world, his encounter with Alabanda is that of a soul-mate who has fought his way to freedom. Together, they plan noble and heroic deeds, but Hyperion’s world crumbles when he realizes the dark side of such purported moral ambition. Alabanda’s friends are ruthless revolutionaries who seek to overthrow the present powers by violent means: “The cold sword is forged from hot metal” (ibid., p.26) [“Aus heiβem Metalle wird das kalte Schwert geschmieden” (ibid., p. 510)]. Through this experience, Hyperion grasps something of the conflictual nature of human life: “If the life of the world consists in an alteration between opening and closing, between going forth and returning, why is it not even so with the heart of man” (ibid., p.29) [“Bestehet ja das Leben der Welt im Wechsel des Entfaltens und Vershlieβens, in Ausflug und in Rückkehr zu sich selbst, warum nicht auch das Herz des Menschen” (ibid., p.514)]? However, it is by encountering beauty in the person and life of Diotima (Book II of Volume I) that Hyperion believes he has found what he is looking for, i.e. the Unity he is after: “I have seen it once, the one thing that my soul sought, and the perfection that we put somewhere far away above the stars, that we put off until the end of time – I have felt it in its living presence” (ibid., p.41) [“Ich habe es Einmal gesehen, das Einzige, das meine Seele suchte, und die Vollendung die wir über die Sterne hinauf entfernen, die wir hinausscheben bis ans Ende der Zeit, die hab’ ich gegenwärtig gefühlt” (ibid., p.529)]. A period of bliss ensues, but Diotima understands that Hyperion is “born for higher things” (ibid., p.72) [“zu höhern Dingen geboren” (ibid., p.566)], that the simple harmony of her life is not for him. He must go out and bring beauty to those places where it is lacking. Having grasped this (Book I of Volume II), Hyperion answers Alabanda’s call to join him in battle to free Greece.

Hyperion’s departure for battle is followed by several letters addressed to Diotima and a couple of her replies. After initial success in the fight against the Turks, Hyperion’s men are delayed by the long siege of Mistra. Nonetheless, as they finally enter the town, they go on a]rampage, pillaging and killing indiscriminately. Rather than face the enemy, Hyperion’s army disperses once its lust for plunder is satisfied. This leads to the death of forty Russian soldiers who stood alone fighting the common foe. Hyperion takes his army’s dishonour to make him unworthy, in his eyes, for Diotima’s love: “I must advise you to give me up, my Diotima” (ibid., p.98) [“ich muβ dir raten, daβ du mich verlässest, meine Diotima” (ibid., p.597)]. In letters to Bellarmin, we discover more details of the battles fought by Hyperion and Alabanda. Their friendship flourished again, but Alabanda’s lust for battle eventually came to an end, thus pointing once more to the limits of his way of life. In a letter from Diotima that arrives later, it emerges that she lost her will to live as her lover did not return, and she finally let herself die. In a development which reflects Hölderlin’s understanding of human life, the effortless harmony of Diotima’s world of beauty, once disturbed by the fire of Hyperion’s free aspiration to noble deeds, could not simply return to its original form. Rather, it became something to aim for, something Diotima thought Hyperion could achieve for her: “You drew my life away from the Earth, but you would also have had power to bind me to the Earth” (ibid., p.122) [“Du entzogst main Leben der Erde, du hättest auch Macht gehabt, mich an die Erde zu fesseln” (ibid., p.626)]. It is, thus, through its very destruction, that Diotima’s way of life ceases to represent that which Hyperion could have sought to take refuge in. Diotima’s words illustrate the whole problem of life as an “eccentric path,” but her death, apparently, only leaves Hyperion confused: “as I am now, I have no names for things and all before me is uncertainty” (ibid., p.126) [“wie ich jetzt bin, hab ich keinen Namen für die Dinge, und es ist mir alles ungewiβ” (ibid., p.632)]. At the end of the novel, however, the beauty of Nature once again fills Hyperion with joy, and this poetic sense of oneness reaches beyond separation and death to Alabanda and Diotima. Somehow, he has made some sense of his experiences. Thus, after all these tragedies, an overall feeling of unity prevails: “You springs of earth! you flowers! and you woods and you eagles and you brotherly light! how old and new is our love!- We are free, we are not narrowly alike in outward semblance; how should the Mode of life not vary? yet we love the ether, all of us, and in the inmost of our inmost selves we are alike” (ibid., p.133) [“Ihr Quellen der Erd! Ihr Blumen! Und ihr Wälder und ihr Adler und du brüderliches Licht! Wie alt und neu ist unsere Liebe! – Frei sind wir, gleichen uns nicht ängstig von auβen; wie sollte nicht wechseln die Weise des Lebens? Wir lieben den Äther doch all und innigst im Innersten gleichen wir uns” (ibid., p.639-640)]. However, the last words of the novel suggest an open ending: “So I thought. More soon” (ibid., p.133) [“So dacht’ ich. Nächstens mehr” (ibid., p.640)]. Thus, after all the ordeals that he has worked through in these letters, Hyperion’s life goes on. This seems to point to new experiences and the possibility of revisiting his interpretation of his life thus far.

The poetic contemplation of our oneness with Nature, which is prominent in the novel’s final letter, points to an understanding which philosophy cannot reach. Hyperion hints at this when he complains about the Germans: “Is not the air that you drink in better than your chatter? Are not the sun’s rays nobler than all of you in your cleverness” (ibid., p.129) [“Ist besser, denn euer Geschwätz, die Luft nicht, die ihr trinkt? Der Sonne Strahlen, sind sie edler nicht, denn all’ ihr Klugen” (ibid., p.635)]? Hölderlin’s life confirms his endorsement of the superiority of poetry. After the Jena period, he finally followed the advice his friend Schiller had given him in 1796 and never returned to philosophical argumentation, rather seeking to show something of the greater unity of Being in poetic form.

In line with his understanding of Being as lying beyond our ken, Hölderlin developed a theory of tonal modulations (Wechseltonlehre) that is illustrated in much of his poetic output. According to this theory, there are three fundamental poetic tones: the naïve, the heroic and the ideal. A tone, however, cannot be expressed in its pure form but only through a tension with its medium, a tension created by the work of art. Thus, the poem becomes what Hölderlin calls an “extended metaphor” of what cannot be said directly (Hölderlin, 1990).

5. Hölderlin’s Influence

Because of his small philosophical output, it is important to indicate in what way Hölderlin’s ideas have influenced his contemporaries and later thinkers. It was Hölderlin whose ideas showed Hegel that he could not continue to work on the applications of philosophy to politics without first addressing certain theoretical issues. In 1801, this led Hegel to move to Jena where he was to write the Phenomenology of Spirit. It could be argued, however, that Hegel’s (1977) view of poetry as belonging to the past and his dismissal of the Romantic movement, show a lack of a grasp of the kind of point Hölderlin was making.

Schelling’s early work amounts to a development of Hölderlin’s concept of Being in terms of a notion of a prior identity of thought and object in his Philosophy of Identity (Schelling, 1994). This philosophy apparently makes knowledge of the Absolute (i.e. the absolute ground) impossible, and Schelling wrestles with the possibility of articulating how the Absolute amounts to knowledge of itself in Hegelian fashion. However, his later philosophy clearly distinguishes itself from Hegel’s in that it claims that the ground of the understanding contained in a philosophical system such as Hegel’s is “what is above all understanding” and can, therefore, “never become comprehensible” (ibid., p.162). This endorsement of a claim related to Hölderlin’s about the unknowability of the ultimate ground of conceptual discourse draws to a close the efforts of German Idealism to grasp the whole of reality in conceptual terms. Finally, we must note that Heidegger saw in Hölderlin a prophetic figure, but it was Hölderlin the poet, not the philosopher, whom Heidegger had in mind. In Being and Time, Heidegger first introduces his key idea of the forgetting of the question of Being. His later thought develops this idea which leads to the thought that poetry announces a new clearing of Being. This echoes Hölderlin’s privileging of poetry with respect to conceptual thought. For Heidegger, poetry cannot name the unnameable, but it can keep open the space for it (Heidegger, 1996, 2000). However, Heidegger understands Hölderlin as showing the way to a future clearing of Being. We note that Heidegger’s interpretation is controversial and has been criticised, in particular by Henrich (1992, 1997), for whom Hölderlin is a “recollective” poet. For Henrich, Hölderlin’s work is turned to the past, and to our longings, both for a sense of original unity and for the freedom of the self.

6. Conclusion

Hölderlin’s philosophically relevant output, although very small, is central to a proper understanding of the development of German Idealism from its source in the task of providing a ground for Kant’s critical system to its later attempts to give an all-encompassing philosophical account of reality. Hölderlin’s insights in his theoretical text On Judgment and Being can be seen as relevant to this development. The consequent privileging of poetry over philosophy, of which Hölderlin’s career provides a striking illustration, resonates into the twentieth century in Heidegger’s later thought, but central to Hölderlin’s philosophical contribution is also the practical correlate of his theoretical thought: his novel Hyperion provides a profound insight into his understanding of life’s “eccentric path” as a struggle between the harmony of a lost, original unity and the drive of human beings’ free spirit always to seek the overcoming of any given limits.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, T.W. (1992) Parataxis: On Hölderlin’s late poetry, in Adorno, Notes to Literature Vol. 2, transl. S.W.Nicholsen, Columbia University Press, New York, pp. 109-149.
  • Ameriks, K. (ed.) (2000) The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Constantine, D. (1988) Hölderlin, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Donelan, J.H. (2002) Hölderlin’s poetic self-consciousness, Philosophy and Literature, 26, 125-142.
  • Fichte, J.G. (1994) Introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre and Other Writings (1797-1800), ed. and transl. D. Breazeale, Hackett, Indianapolis/Cambridge.
  • Förster, E. (1995) ‘To lend wings to physics once again’: Hölderlin and the ‘Oldest System Program of German Idealism’, European Journal of Philosophy, 3(2), 174-198.
  • di Giovanni, G. and Harris, H.S., editors, (2000) Between Kant and
    Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post- Kantian Idealism, Hackett, Indianapolis.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. (1977) Phenomenology of Spirit, transl. A.V.Miller, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Heidegger, M. (2000) Elucidations of Hölderlin’s poetry, transl. K.Hoeller, Humanity Books, New York.
  • Heidegger, M. (1996) Holderlin’s Hymn “the Ister”, Indiana University Press, Indianapolis.
  • Henrich, D. (1992) Der Grund im Bewuβtsein: Untersuchungen zu Hölderlin’s Denken, 1794-1795, Klett-Cotta, Stuttgart.
  • Henrich, D. (1997) The Course of Remembrance and Other Essays on Hölderlin, ed. E. Förster, Stanford University Press, Stanford.
  • Hölderlin, F. (1972) Über Urtheil und Seyn (On Judgment and Being), in H.S. Harris: ‘Hegel’s Development: Toward the Sunlight 1770-1801’, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Hölderlin, F. (1990) Hyperion and selected poems, ed. Eric L. Santner, Continuum, New York.
  • Hölderlin, F. (1999) Sämtliche Gedichte und Hyperion, Insel Verlag, Frankfurt-am-Main.
  • Ryan, L. (1960) Hölderlin’s Lehre vom Wechsel der Töne, Klett-Cotta, Stuttgart.
  • Schelling, F.W.J. (1994) On the History of Modern Philosophy, transl. A. Bowie, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Schiller, F. (1982) On the Aesthetic Education of Man in a series of letters, ed. & transl. E.M.Wilkinson & L.A. Willoughby, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Waibel, V. (2000) Hölderlin und Fichte: 1794-1800, Paderborn.

Author Information

Christian J. Onof
University of London
United Kingdom

Last updated: October 9, 2004 | Originally published: