The common name given to a group of amateur philosophers founded and led by William Torrey Harris (1835-1909) and Henry Conrad Brokmeyer (1828-1906). Harris, a New Englander born in Connecticut and educated at Yale, first became acquainted with idealism through the Transcendentalists, mainly from his attendance in 1857 at the Orphic Seer’s Conversations of Amos Bronson Alcott (1799-1888). The experience inspired Harris to leave Yale before obtaining a degree, and set off west to St. Louis to seek his vocation. Initially he took a position teaching shorthand in the St. Louis Public Schools, but he quickly advanced through the system, eventually becoming Superintendent of Schools, a position he held from 1867 to 1880. Brokmeyer was a Prussian immigrant who arrived in New York as a young man of sixteen. Bold and restless in temperament, he made his way westward, acquiring a small fortune by running a shoe factory in Mississippi. Desiring to further his education, he abandoned his business pursuits to enter Georgetown University in Kentucky, but his quarrelsome character led to his departure for Brown University in Providence, Rhode Island, only to leave that institution as well after a heated debate with President Wayland. The venture to New England, however, did give him an exposure to Transcendentalism, which inspired him, like Harris, once again to head west–first to the back country of Warren County Missouri, where he expended his energy in a close study of German thought, particularly Hegel, and then, in 1856, to St. Louis.
It was there that Harris and Brokmeyer met in 1858 at the St. Louis Mercantile Library, where Harris was offering a public lecture. Brokmeyer convinced Harris of the significance of Hegel’s system, and its relevance to the historical trends of American society. They immediately joined forces, attracting a number of other youthful followers with intellectual ambitions, many of whom were, like Harris, teachers in the public schools. The nascent Hegelian movement was temporarily stalled when Brokmeyer went off to serve as a Colonel in the Union Army during the Civil War, but it rebounded in full force upon his return with the formation of the St. Louis Philosophical Society in 1866, and the launching of the Journal of Speculative Philosophy, the official organ of the Society, in 1867.
Brokmeyer was the acknowledged intellectual leader of the movement. He published little, but his charismatic personality, quixotic meliorism, and extraordinary skills in argument and debate, consistently employed in the application of Hegelian dialectical logic, established his status as the framer of the ideals and aims of the movement. The manuscript of his translation of Hegel’s Logic, although never published, became the theoretical text of the group, copied and distributed not only in St. Louis, but to sympathetic thinkers in other parts of the United States. Harris was, more than any other, the movement’s public voice and organizing genius. He edited the Journal, contributing many of its articles himself. He also orchestrated a number of attempts to bring about a rapprochement between the western and New England idealists, first by inviting Alcott, Harris’s former mentor, and Ralph Waldo Emerson to St. Louis, later by his participation in the formation of the Concord School of Philosophy, a summer school headed by Alcott that merged the two groups within its faculty. (Harris taught for all nine of the sessions of the Concord School’s existence, from 1879 to 1887, and his disquisitions on Hegel became the most popular of the faculty’s offerings.) But although these efforts furthered the influence of the St. Louisians, they were not, because of philosophical differences, wholly successful.
Even though Harris and Brokmeyer were first inspired to philosophical pursuits by the Transcendentalists, the thought of the St. Louis group was distinguished from the latter by its greater concentration on philosophical understanding guided by Hegelian method, without the literary and theological concerns of the New England movement, and a greater stress on social responsibility and reform. The emerging views of the various members of the group varied somewhat in details, but they shared a common conviction in the relevance of a Hegelian social philosophy, inspired mainly by Hegel’s The Philosophy of Right and The Philosophy of History, to the problems and challenges facing the American society of their day, and the importance of education as a means of effecting necessary social change. Brokmeyer insisted on the necessity that thought issue in practical action directed to the social good, and the St. Louisians took this imperative to heart. The emphasis on education is evident in the pages of their journal, which were largely dedicated to the dissemination of European idealism, either through translations of Hegel and other German writers or summations of their work. They also shared a common enthusiasm for the prospects of their home city, divining by a clever but highly questionable use of the Hegelian dialectic what they believed to be historical forces that would propel St. Louis into an era of cultural supremacy in American society.
Gradually the group dissolved during the 1870s and 1880s as the core members of the group struck out on their own to pursue separate interests and aims. Characteristically, education and moral advancement were the themes of many of these individual pursuits. Denton Snider (1841-1925), a central figure within the movement who eventually became its historian, set upon a course of freelance teaching and lecturing as well as pursuing literary ambitions. In addition to offering lectures throughout the eastern and midwestern United States, including the Concord School, he founded or played a leading role in the operation of a number of visionary educational projects, such as the Communal University in Chicago and later St. Louis, the Chicago Kindergarten College, and the Goethe School in Milwaukee. Thomas Davidson (1840-1900), another key player in the original St. Louis movement, established the Breadwinner’s College in New York City, a school devoted to the education of the working class, and later established a summer school at his home in Glenmore, New York.
The theme is echoed in the careers of the St. Louis movement’s founders, Harris and Brokmeyer, during and after the dissipation of the movement itself. During his years as Superintendent of Schools in St. Louis, Harris was a strong proponent for the advancement of public education in Missouri. After his involvement at the Concord School he was appointed the United States Commissioner of Education in 1889. Brokmeyer entered the political arena in Missouri, and played a key role in the state’s Constitutional Convention of 1875, which established a legal guarantee of education for all between the ages of six and twenty. Brokmeyer eventually served a term as Lieutenant Governor of the state, and acting Governor during 1876 and 1877, but when his political prospects turned against him, he returned to the wilderness life in numerous sojourns to the west. For a time he lived with the Creek Indians in Oklahoma. In 1896 he settled back in St. Louis, returning to a quiet life of scholarship and reflection until his death in 1906.
Despite the fact that the members of the group produced an extraordinary output of published writing, both in their journal and independently, the movement’s ideas had little lasting influence on American philosophy, due in large part to the orthodoxy of their Hegelianism, which was soon overshadowed by the emerging naturalism of American thought during the first decades of the twentieth century. The one exception was George H. Howison (1834-1916), who came under the influence of the group while teaching mathematics at Washington University in St. Louis. Howison later settled in Berkeley, California, and developed a pluralistic form of idealism that survived as the twentieth century school of thought known as Personalism. The most significant contribution of the group to American thought was their journal, which offered a much needed vehicle for the publication of the early work of some of the most prominent figures of the next generation of American philosophy, such as John Dewey, William James, Charles Sanders Peirce, and Josiah Royce. In fact, Harris’s encouragement when a young John Dewey timidly submitted his first philosophical essay for publication was crucial in the budding philosopher’s decision to continue his studies. Although the ideas of the movement had little enduring influence, the St. Louis Hegelians represent an important chapter in the history of American philosophical thought and the developing relationship between intellectual and popular culture in the nineteenth century.
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Last updated: July 3, 2005 | Originally published: April/16/2001
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