Huineng (Hui-neng) a seminal figure in Buddhist history. He is the famous “Sixth Patriarch” of the Chan or meditation tradition, which is better known in Japanese as “Zen”). The focus of an immense body of lore that grew over the centuries, Huineng’s life mirrors the fortunes of Chan itself – a provincial Chinese version of Buddhism that rose to become a major religious and cultural force throughout East Asia. Tradition holds that Huineng was an uncouth “barbarian” youth who, because of his innate intuitive insight, surpassed his more cultured fellow monks to earn the official “dharma seal” certifying the authoritative transmission of Buddhist enlightenment, and thereby earning a lasting place in history. He is intimately associated with the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, one of the most influential texts in all of Chinese Buddhism. Alleged to be a sermon from the lips of Huineng himself, this text provides a gripping first person account of the Master’s life. Its cryptic, yet insightful, discussion of Chan practice lays out the central concerns of Chan cultivation. Huineng’s discussion of the themes of inherent enlightenment, sudden awakening, and the non-dual nature of wisdom (Sanskrit: prajna) and meditation (Sanskrit: dhyana) resounds through later generations of Chan teachers, and continues to pose difficult philosophical challenges to this day.
It is impossible to disentangle Huineng from the story of early Chan. Indeed, it is in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra that Huineng lays out the classic story of Chan’s origins. According to this account, Chan began with the historical Buddha, Sakyamuni, and his famous “Flower Sermon.” One day the Buddha took his seat before his assembled monks and, instead of speaking, remained silent while holding a single flower aloft in his hand. Of those assembled, only one disciple Mahakashyapa (Sanskrit: “Great Kashyapa”), understood the meaning of the Buddha’s actions. The Buddha publicly recognized Mahakashyapa’s realization and he, in turn, passed the wordless teaching along to his disciples. Eventually the transmission passed to a certain Bodhidharma (c. 470-553 CE), the infamous “First Patriarch,” who, it is said, brought Chan to southern China, crossing the Yangzi (Yangtze) River on a reed. Recent scholarship has established that a mysterious figure named Bodhidharma was indeed in southern China in the fifth century proclaiming teachings based on the Lankavatara Sutra as well as a simplified but powerful form of dhyana. After his death his disciples carried on his teachings, but most of them never founded lasting lineages. Eventually these teachings were transmitted to Hongren (600-674), the Fifth Patriarch, who taught at Dongshan. Hongren had a number of disciples who spread out through China, establishing their own schools where they taught their own versions of Chan. Some died out but a few flourished, going on to record their histories to establish their particular pedigrees.
Often dubbed “the meditation school,” Chan derives its name from the Chinese term channa, an attempted transliteration of the Sanskrit term dhyana (meditation, concentration). In Japan, it is known as Zen; in Korea, as Son; and in Vietnam, as Thien. In India, dhyana encompassed a wide variety of techniques for training the mind to attain the deep insight into reality necessary for awakening. When Buddhism began making inroads into China in the first and second centuries CE, missionaries brought these techniques with them. Dhyana study proved popular in some circles – in part because of its resemblance to Daoist meditation practices – but it was just one practice alongside of others, such as sutra study, devotional rituals and the performance of charitable works. Only later did Chan become a self-conscious movement with a firm institutional base.
By the sixth century, certain monasteries in the mountainous areas of central and southwestern China became known as places reserved for intense meditation training. The masters at these centers taught methods so powerful that it was rumored that those willing to persevere could awaken in this very life. As time went on several of these meditation masters gained loyal followings and tales of them spread as their disciples established their own monasteries. It was out of this context that Chan as a distinct school (zong, “lineage”) and the legend of its most famous master arose. Modern scholars now agree that many of the stories surrounding Huineng are “mythical” reconstructions and elaborations by later generations of Chan writers. Nonetheless, this mythology tells us a lot about how Chan came to conceive itself as a distinct tradition, at once radically innovative and deeply conservative. This Chan self-conception finds its best articulation in a poem attributed to Bodhidharma, according to which Chan is “a separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and phrases, directly transmitted from mind to mind.” Such transmission can only occur within the relationship between Master and student; hence, the Master, and the connection to him, is of paramount importance in all Chan schools.
As with many legendary figures, it is difficult to sort fact from fiction when it comes to Huineng. We have many sources of information on him but most were written long after his lifetime. Most scholars of Buddhism now consider the story of Huineng’s life and his role in establishing Chan as a direct line going back to Sakyamuni (the historical Buddha, ca. 6th to 5th centuries BCE) to be little more than pious fiction. While there may be a kernel of historical truth to them, all of the accounts of Huineng’s life (particularly as recorded in the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch) show evidence of later expansion and elaboration. In fact, scholars cannot even agree on the location of Dafan, the temple in which Huineng allegedly recited the Platform Sutra.
The earliest mention of Huineng comes from an inscription for a memorial pagoda in Faxing monastery dated 676. The pagoda was said to commemorate Huineng’s meeting with master Yinzong (627-713), a devotee of the Nirvana Sutra and a renowned master of monastic discipline (vinaya), and the ceremony in which Huineng underwent monastic tonsure, that is, shaving of part of the head. Unfortunately, the actual inscription has not been preserved and so many historians deem it unreliable. The only other record dating back to Huineng’s lifetime just lists him as a student of the Chan master Hongren (Hong-jen).
Later records, of which there are many, probably bear little resemblance to real historical events, and actually contradict each other on certain details. Later traditions concerning Huineng vary tremendously. He seems to go into hiding for several years only to reappear in Nanhai at a monastery presided over by Yinzong. One day after the Master had finished a lecture, Huineng overheard two monks arguing over whether the temple flag or the wind was moving. Huineng abruptly injected himself into this discussion, declaring that in fact it was mind that was moving. Hearing of this, Yinzong sent for Huineng and, bowing to him, asked to be taught the dharma of Hongren. It was Yinzong who oversaw the giving of the tonsure to Huineng, the incident memorialized in the inscription mentioned above. Eventually most accounts of Huineng’s life have him retiring to the Baolin temple. Some traditions speak of Huineng being summoned to the imperial capital by the emperor Zhongzong or possibly the empress Wu Zhao (ca. 625-706). In any case, Huineng declined, preferring to spend his days in the mountains and forests preaching the dharma. He did, however, give the imperial envoy a dharma talk that jolted the messenger into an intense sudden realization. Returning to the capital the envoy reported his experience to the emperor who issued an edict praising Huineng and bestowing special gifts upon him.
Our major source for information on Huineng is the autobiographical portion (sections 2-11) of the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, an immensely complicated text that has undergone numerous revisions over the centuries. Purporting to be a series of sermons delivered by Huineng from a high seat in the lecture hall (the “platform” alluded to in the title) of Dafan Temple, this text remains the only Chinese Buddhist discourse to be accorded sutra (Sanskrit: “scriptural”) status. The earliest extant copy of this sutra, found in a cache of writings discovered in the Dunhuang (Tun-huang) caves in northwestern China, dates to around 850 but it is corrupt and full of errors – probably the result of being copied from an earlier version by a semiliterate scribe. The first section of the text names Fahai, a student of Huineng’s, as transcribing the sermon at the behest of the district governor. Elsewhere the text names Fahai as one of the Master’s ten disciples and “chief monk” of the community. However, Fahai does not appear anywhere else in Chan literature and his exact identity remains unknown. Some scholars suggest the sutra was actually written by a later Chan monk from a different school (possibly the Niutou or “Ox-head” school) around the year 780.
While most scholars do not put much stock in either the Platform Sutra or the other sources on Huineng’s life, we can still use them to piece together something of a biography for him. It seems his family name was Lu and his father had been a minor official who was banished to the provinces where he died when his son was only three. His mother took him to southern China and raised him in extreme poverty. Huineng worked throughout his childhood to support his family by cutting wood. One day when he was a young man, he overheard a man reciting a phrase from the Diamond Sutra and at once he experienced an initial awakening. With his mother’s permission he left home and devoted himself to religious life.
Huineng spent his next years wandering, ending up with a Buddhist nun who was devoted to the Nirvana Sutra. After reciting passages from it one day she asked him to take a turn reading it aloud only to find that he was illiterate. Incredulous, she asked how he intended to learn Buddha’s truth if he could not read the sutras. The youth replied that the nature of Buddha does not depend on words and letters so what need was there to read texts? Amazed at his insight, she suggested he take up monastic life. At this point he declined, but went on to train under a meditation master.
After three years of meditating in a mountain cave, Huineng went to Dongshan (East Mountain) monastery in Hubei, where he met Master Hongren, the “Fifth Patriarch.” Glaring at this supplicant, Hongren asked where he was from and why he was there. Huineng answered simply that he was from the south and had come to learn the dharma (Buddhist doctrine) from him. Hongren retorted that as a southerner, Huineng was a mere “barbarian,” adding, “How could you become Buddha?” Unfazed by the insult, Huineng replied, “Although my ‘barbarian’ body and yours differ, what difference is there in our buddha-nature?” Realizing at once the potential of this coarse youth, Hongren resolved to test him further. He took him in but assigned him to the threshing room, where he labored for nine months, treading the mill to separate the rice grains from their husks.
The most famous incident in Huineng’s story concerns a dharma contest. One day Hongren challenged his charges to each write a verse (gatha) distilling their understanding of their “original natures.” He promised to read them and award his robe (a symbol of dharma transmission; some versions of the story include Hongren’s begging bowl) and the title “Sixth Patriarch” to the student demonstrating true realization. The task quickly devolved onto the shoulders of the head monk, Shenxiu, who, it was assumed, would be the Master’s likely successor. Shenxiu, however, was full of doubt and spent a tortured night considering his options. Finally he stole out and wrote his verse anonymously on the wall of the new dharma hall:
The body is the bodhi tree.
The heart-mind is like a mirror.
Moment by moment wipe and polish it,
Not allowing dust to collect. (section 6)
A straightforward articulation of the necessity of diligent practice, Shenxiu hoped this verse would show the Master that his students had at least some understanding.
The next morning Hongren read the verse and praised it before the community. He burned incense before it and ordered them all to recite it before calling Shenxiu for an interview. In private he commended Shenxiu for his insight, stating that the verse showed he had reached the “gates of wisdom” but had yet to enter. He then suggested Shenxiu take a few more days to compose another verse worthy of being awarded the robe.
Meanwhile, Huineng was still working in the threshing room when a novice wandered by reciting Shenxiu’s verse. Immediately Huineng realized the author of the verse lacked full understanding. Venturing out to the dharma hall, he got someone to write his reply:
Bodhi originally has no tree.
The clear and bright mirror also has no support.
Buddha-nature is constantly purifying and clearing.
Where could there be dust? (section 8)
Very soon word of this new verse spread and eventually the news reached Hongren. The Master came to read it and immediately recognized it as the work of Huineng and that this unknown prodigy was truly enlightened. However, he knew that passing his robe to an uncouth peasant would upset the monastic hierarchy. Therefore he publicly dismissed it as “not complete understanding.” Later, under cover of darkness, Hongren summoned Huineng for a secret audience in which he gave him further teachings. Passing on his robe, the Master admonished him to flee for his life, predicting, however, that eventually he would transmit the teachings. With that, Huineng fled south. After some months, Huineng was traced to a mountain by a band of pursuers intent on killing him and stealing the robe. Most of the pursuers turned back after climbing only halfway but one, Huiming (a former general) reached him on the summit. There, rather than slay the young master, he received the teaching and became enlightened. Thus being recognized as a true Chan Master, Huineng dispatched his new disciple to the north to spread the dharma and convert the populace.
One of the most colorful episodes in Huineng lore concerns his confrontation with a dragon that lived in a pond in front of Baolin temple. The dragon was particularly large and fierce, emerging regularly from the watery depths to create havoc and instill fear in the populace. Fearlessly, the Master taunted the beast for its weakness at only being unable to appear in a large as opposed to smaller form. At once the dragon disappeared only to re-emerge in small form and so show the monk his powers. Unimpressed, the Master challenged the monster to show its courage by entering his bowl. When it did so, the Master quickly scooped the dragon up, took him into the Buddha Hall, and preached dharma to it until it shed its body and departed.
Much as with other great religious figures, so the stories of Huineng’s death are particularly dramatic. The Platform Sutra gives a confused account that may combine several different versions. In essence, however, it records that as he neared his death, the Master called his disciples for a final teaching in the form of a “dharma verse.” All the disciples broke into tears over the imminent departure of their beloved teacher except for one, Shenhui, whom the Master praised for having attained the status of awakening. Chiding the others for the foolishness of their tears, Huineng told them, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet. All of you recite it, and if you understand the meaning, you will be the same as I. If you practice with it, you will not lose the essence of the teaching.” (section 48) After this final lesson (during which he outlined the Chan lineage back to the Buddha) Huineng died at the stroke of midnight on August 28, 713. Other traditions, however, have Huineng dying in deep meditation after finishing his last meal. His passing was marked by all manner of cosmic signs: a strange perfume pervading the temple for days, mysterious bright lights, a miraculous rainbow in the sky etc. The Platform Sutra says, “Mountains crumbled, the earth trembled, and the forest trees turned white. The sun and moon ceased to shine and the wind and clouds lost their colors.” (section 54) An inscription by the poet Wang Wei (d. 759) adds “the birds and monkeys cried in anguish.”
Several posthumous stories of Huineng attest to the powerful spell he cast on later generations. Some decades after his passing the emperor sent an envoy to ask for his robe and bowl so that the court might pay them homage. These were sent back with great ceremony a few years later by the succeeding emperor, who purportedly dreamt Huineng asked that they be returned. Later, in 816, Huineng was awarded the official title “Dhyana Master Dajian” (Great Mirror). To this day there is a mummy reputed to be Huineng in the Nanhua monastery located in Caoxi. For centuries it was the focus of intense devotion, and at times was brought to the nearby city of Shanzhou to promote prosperity or ward off plagues and droughts. The mummy was also threatened several times and at least one time was nearly decapitated by rival monks seeking to gain power through possession of the Sixth Patriarch’s head.
Historical complexities aside, however, it is the mythic dimensions of Huineng’s story that most excite the imagination. Certainly the traditional account is replete with symbolism and allusion. As a boy Huineng is the quintessential simpleton (cf. the Daoist notion of pu, “simplicity” or “the uncarved block” spoken of in Daode jing 15, 19, 28, 32, 37, 57), an illiterate peasant who, pure and unspoiled by the sophistication of his more educated fellows, serves as the perfect vessel for receiving the sacred wisdom that, in turn, flows through him to posterity. Aside from the allusions to Daode jing just noted, Huineng epitomizes the ideal found in Daode jing 70, “The sage goes about with a coarse cloth on top yet carries jade in his bosom.” We find similar themes in stories of other Buddhist figures (for example, Dao’an, 312-385) as well as the Prophet Muhammad. The tradition of Huineng’s being orphaned and cared for by his mother echoes the biography of Mencius (ca. 385-312 BCE), one of the most revered and mystical of Confucian sages.
Huineng’s potential is recognized by the truly wise (for example, Hongren) but he must first be tested to prove his worth. His assignment to hard labor for nine months in seclusion suggests a type of spiritual gestation. Moreover, Huineng’s attaining official recognition under cover of darkness, symbolized in the passing on of Bodhidharma’s robe and bowl (sacred relics imbued with the Patriarch’s charisma), underscores the drama of this moment and the immense value of his precious wisdom. The tradition that these were buried with him indicates something else of importance: Huineng’s successors would no longer rely on India; Chan would henceforth be a homegrown Chinese tradition. Huineng’s turning down the imperial summons recalls the similar story involving Zhuangzi wherein the Daoist sage prefers to live as a turtle, “dragging his tail in the mud” (Zhuangzi, chapter 17). Finally, the accounts of Huineng’s death clearly echo the earthly passing (parinirvana) of Sakyamuni Buddha. Symbolically, Chan tradition, by drawing such a wide assortment of sacred figures into Huineng’s own story, has effectively absorbed these holy personages’ collective mana. As such, Chan is then empowered to project this “new” sacred aura down through its own lineage.
We can also understand the traditional story of Huineng’s life as an example of the apparently universal “Hero Myth.” He starts off as an unpromising youth living in obscurity who embarks on a great quest. Along the way he is aided by various helpers (the anonymous man who recited the Diamond Sutra, the nun devoted to the Nirvana Sutra, his first meditation teacher). After various adventures he meets a true mentor, the Wise Old Man (Hongren), who recognizes his worth and proceeds to train and test him until he is ready. Then the Wise Old Man passes on the secret knowledge he will need to face all obstacles. The climactic story of Huineng’s flight, pursuit, confrontation on mountain top, and his victory all fit in broad outline the structure of such tales the world over. His encounter with the dragon, of course, is the stereotypical battle with the monster (cf. St. George and the Dragon, Beowulf and Grendel) through which the Hero saves society from the threat of evil and chaos, while his refusal of imperial status demonstrates his humility and desire to avoid self-glorification. In this light, the master’s death marks his apotheosis and rise to divine status, for which he is revered by later generations.
When assessing the life of Huineng and his place in Chan lore, it is vital to bear in mind the centrality of lineage in Chinese culture. Lineage is a primary marker of group identity and solidarity, as well as social recognition. Chan, like other Chinese religious/philosophical traditions, is organized as a system of lineages in which teachings are passed down from Master (Patriarch) to disciple, much as family heritage passes down from father to son. The concern for lineage is most evident in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra, where Huineng traces the transmission of his teachings back through various masters to Bodhidharma. In Huineng’s Chan genealogy, Bodhidharma, in turn, received the teachings via a series of Indian masters going back to Sakyamuni. Such an impressive pedigree no doubt brought much prestige to those within the Chan line. The importance of lineage continued through the succeeding generations and was carried over when Chan went to Japan. To this day, Chan teachers trace their lineage back to Huineng. Essentially, Huineng has become the Primary Ancestor of the Chan line, receiving the reverence and devotion typical of ancestral cults throughout East Asia. Metaphorically speaking, Huineng is Chan, and remains so even today.
Such critical analysis of the Platform Sutra and the body of lore surrounding Huineng is not intended to dismiss Chan tradition (particularly in regards to the matter of lineage) as fraudulent. Rather, it helps us understand the concerns of early Chan and the vital role that a charismatic hero such as Huineng plays in rhetorically establishing a distinctive Chan identity. For an analogy we can look to the way in which the great Song scholar Zhu Xi (1130-1200) constructs a lineage for his school of Neo-Confucianism, with Confucius taking the place of Huineng and Master Zhu serving as the Confucian version of Shenhui.
Although Huineng’s mythic biography is fascinating, the Platform Sutra mainly consists of an extended series of dharma talks offering what is at times some rather cryptic advice on Chan cultivation. Like most sermons, the Sutra is not a systematic presentation of defined doctrines and arguments but is an address to the faithful, exhorting them to see into their “original nature” and awaken here and now. Huineng explicitly says that his teachings do not originate with him but are, “handed down from the sages of the past” (section 12). Nonetheless, Huineng does introduce several important ideas and initiates the peculiar style of teaching that comes to be enshrined in later Chan tradition. These teachings tend to overlap and interlock with each other, thereby suggesting the unity-cum-diversity that is one of the hallmarks of Chan thought.
The teaching of “inherent” or “original” enlightenment is a major theme in Huineng’s sermon, and the theoretical basis for most of what he says regarding practice. Its roots go back to Indian teachings concerning the tathagata-garbha (“womb/embryo of Buddha”). Although a complex notion, essentially this teaching comes down to a positive articulation of basic Buddhist views on emptiness (shunyata) and the thoroughly interrelated nature of existence. According to tathagata-garbha teachings, although all beings are mired in ignorance and suffering, our true natures are always pure and luminous – defilements are merely adventitious. Awakening occurs when we pierce through the defilements and allow our original purity to shine forth. While at first glance, the assertion of a seemingly permanent “nature” would seem to contradict the fundamental Buddhist doctrine of anatman (“no [permanent] self”), in fact it does not. The tathagata-garbha is not a substantive essence but an indication of the innate positive tendency towards awakening that is always directly at hand.
Tathagata-garbha teachings had strong appeal for the Chinese, most likely due to their resonance with Confucian ideas of “propriety” (yi, the appropriate manner of acting in a given situation) and humanity’s innate “goodness,” as well as Daoist views of the Way (dao), in which each thing uniquely contributes to the all-encompassing system of the cosmos. These notions also dovetail with the traditional Chinese concern with one’s “nature” (xing, the inborn organic pattern guiding a thing’s development). Together such ideas sketch out a distinctive worldview of dynamic, interactive relationships that unfold in the natural course of things. In this perspective, one can obstruct one’s inherent tendencies or open conscientiously into a more free and responsive way of engagement. In general, the latter is the truer, more proper (or “natural”) way of being. Chinese Buddhists speak of this potential for realization as one’s “Buddha-nature” (fo xing). For Chinese Buddhists, awakening is the natural result of activating or “seeing into” this innate but hidden potential and manifesting it here and now.
Nearly everything Huineng says is predicated on the “Buddha-nature.” We see this clearly in his youthful exchanges with both the nameless Buddhist nun and Master Hongren. Huineng drives this point home in a number of places, often quite explicitly. As he proclaims, “Since Buddha is made by your own nature, do not look for him outside your body. If you are deluded in your own nature, Buddha is then a sentient being; if you are awakened in your own natures, sentient beings are then Buddhas.” (section 35) In this understanding of Buddhahood, one may have an initial awakening (Japanese satori) but this is only a hurried glimpse, yet it provides a vague understanding that spurs one on further – something we clearly see in Huineng’s own life with his first awakening at hearing a passage from the Diamond Sutra.
By rhetorically taking his stand on this inherent enlightenment, Huineng challenges his audience to understand this truth and realize their original natures where they are at this very moment. This is something they can and must do: “Despite heterodox views, passions, ignorance, and delusions, in your own physical bodies you have in yourselves the attributes of inherent enlightenment, so that with correct views you can be saved.” (section 21) It is on this basis that he speaks of such things as the unity of meditation (dhyana) and wisdom (prajna), and the “samadhi of oneness. By realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” one naturally moves beyond habitual “selfish” actions and joining with things in an appropriate and compassionate way.
Another important theme that Huineng preaches concerns the fundamentally “non-dual” nature of existence. This, too, is prone to be misunderstood. Huineng never espouses a mushy notion that “All is One” so much as challenge the assumption that a person stands apart from her/his immediate situation. His target is the self-conscious sense of separation that tends to arise out of deliberative thinking and living. Thus, his focus is not so much theoretical as practical; one must not get caught up in speculative thought but realize (make real) Buddha, one’s true nature, and act accordingly. This fundamental unity comes through in his famous dharma verse through which he won Hongren’s robe. By countering Shenxiu’s verse and its assumptions of duality, Huineng graphically tells us that we must not think of our minds as something distinct that “we” must polish to reflect truth. Rather, we are truth, immediately and directly.
The vision Huineng seeks to impart is one of integrity within our larger context. It is an evocation of wholeness, interrelatedness and participation rather than separation and distinction. One of Huineng’s most provocative presentations of this idea comes in his discussion of meditation. For Huineng, meditation is not a separate “thing” from wisdom, nor do you attain the latter by way of the former. As he says, “Never under any circumstances say mistakenly that meditation and wisdom are different; they are a unity, not two things. Meditation itself is the substance of wisdom; wisdom itself is the function of meditation” (section 13). Later, the Patriarch explains their relationship through the analogy of a lamp and its light: just as the lamp and its illuminating are essentially one, so meditation and wisdom are one.
Huineng also challenges assumptions of separation by advocating the “samadhi of oneness,” or concentrated attention to the present situation: “The samadhi of oneness is straightforward mind at all times, walking, staying, sitting, and lying.” This constitutes an intriguing practice of mindful, meditative action performed with attentive detachment. There are obvious echoes between this practice and the Daoist notion of wei wuwei (“acting without acting”) as well as path of karma yoga outlined by Krishna in the Bhagavad-Gita, and Chan communities to this day seek to instill such an approach to life throughout their daily regimen.
This fundamental unity of existence that one manifests by realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” also informs Huineng’s view of the Pure Land (the “Western Paradise”) which, following the Vimalakirti Sutra (where the Buddha shows his disciples that this world is the Pure Land for those with Pure Mind), he refuses to allow us to conceive the Pure Land as something separate from our current existence. It is, rather, the straightforward mind of the “samadhi of oneness.” In attaining this state of true purity, one finds no obstructions. Or, as Huineng puts it, “If inside and outside are clear, this will be no different from the Western Land” (section 35).
Huineng speaks from the standpoint of Ultimate Truth (the inherent “Buddha-nature”) the non-dual reality lying beyond our everyday unenlightened experience of separation and division. To awaken to this Truth, Huineng emphasizes “non-clinging” to any verbal teachings, which only present obstacles to True Awakening. Instead, Huineng stresses the perspective of “no-thought” (wu nian), an open, non-conceptual state of mind that allows one to experience reality directly, as it truly is. As he states, “No thought is not to think even when involved in thought. . . To be unstained in all environments is called no-thought. If on the basis of your own thoughts you separate from environment, then, in regard to things, thoughts are not produced. If you stop thinking of the myriad things, and cast aside all thoughts, as soon as one instant of thought is cut off, you will be reborn in another realm.” (section 13)
Note that Huineng explicitly says “no-thought” is not a state of insentiency, nor is it a way of valorizing irrational, “thoughtless” behavior. Rather, “no-thought” is a highly attentive yet unentangled way of being — seemingly the only genuine freedom available. Those who act from the perspective of “no-thought” respond compassionately in all situations, untouched by suffering, much the same way the Mahayana scriptures speak of bodhisattvas (enlightened beings who selflessly seek to aid others) who “course in the Perfection of Wisdom.”
Few ideas are so closely associated with Huineng’s Chan than “sudden awakening” (dun wu). Rooted in earlier Buddhist and Daoist teachings, it primarily referred to statements of truth a sage made in relationship to specific audiences. Those that were direct and profound were given to those ready for such a “sudden” dose of reality whereas those that were more indirect and metaphorical were provided for those who needed to be led “gradually.” The difference, thus, lies in those who receive the teachings rather than the actual content of the teachings. Some are, as it were, closer to their “Buddha-nature.” According to later Chan tradition, Huineng advocated the (superior) way of “sudden awakening” in contrast to Shenxiu, whose dharma verse clearly points to the (inferior) way of “gradual awakening.”
This polemical distinction, however, does not capture Huineng’s full meaning. The term dun, typically translated as “sudden,” might better be rendered as “poised” or “ready” for some great undertaking Those who experience such “sudden awakening” are those who are “keen” and “fast,” ready to awaken in action, poised to break through to fuller, wise and compassionate living. By contrast, those who are “dull” are “slow,” not quite as prepared or attentive to respond in so wise a fashion. Equally as important, moreover, is Huineng’s insistence that from the standpoint of the “Buddha-nature,” there is no “sudden” or “gradual.” Thus he notes, “The dharma itself is the same, but in seeing it there is a slow way and a fast way. Seen slowly, it is the gradual; seen fast it is the sudden [teaching]. Dharma is without sudden or gradual, but some people are keen and others dull; hence the names ‘sudden’ and ‘gradual.’” (section 39)
In many respects the necessity of practice may be the single most important refrain in Huineng’s sermons. Huineng repeatedly emphasizes that Chan life, awakening, is not attained through study or careful deliberation but live action. One of the best instances comes immediately after he explains what seated meditation (zuochan; Japanese zazen) is: “Good friends, see for yourselves the purity of your own natures, practice and accomplish for yourselves. Your own nature is the Dharmakaya [“Body of the Teaching,” the Ultimate Truth] and self-practice is the practice of Buddha; by self-accomplishment you may achieve the Buddha Way for yourselves.” (section 19)
To achieve Buddhahood one must be Buddha, that which, paradoxically, one always already is. Such awakened living cannot be adequately explained through words so much as demonstrated and acted upon. In this sense, one learns it directly by conforming to an already established pattern, internalizing it, and then acting this out in any given situation. An analogy might be learning to play a musical instrument or another activity such as riding a bicycle. Chan practice is Chan doing, something that can only be learned through careful imitation of a living example – one’s Master. It is this type of first-hand learning to which Bodhidharma refers in his famous verse: “A special transmission outside the scriptures; not dependent on words and letters.”
Ironically, despite his constant injunctions to wise action, Huineng provides little detail on the specifics of practice. As a result, scholars are unsure what sorts of actual practices were taught in early Chan communities. This silence on specifics, however, turned out to be a point in Huineng’s favor, as his injunctions could readily be applied to a wide variety of Chan styles through the ages.
Huineng’s presentation in the Platform Sutra pioneered Chan’s distinct teaching style that makes use of paradox and cryptic statements aimed at jolting students out of their habitual discursive reasoning. By no means, of course, is Huineng the inventor of such discourse (it is very common in Buddhist and Daoist texts) but in the Platform Sutra Huineng uses it with uncanny skill. As such, it warrants close examination.
One of the most significant features of Huineng’s discourse is its overwhelmingly dialogical character. Although it has its share of lectures, this “sermon” is more often a series of exchanges between Huineng and various interlocutors. Such a literary form calls for one to shift perspective back and forth. Like normal conversation, so a dialogue also tends to lead one beyond the immediate horizon, inviting listeners (and readers) to come along. Dialogue is a common form in Western philosophy (most notably in Plato’s dialogues) yet there is also ample precedent in both Buddhist and Chinese literature. The Perfection of Wisdom Sutras, the primary scriptures of Mahayana Buddhism, are all extended dialogues between the Buddha and his disciples, while most of the Analects and the Zhuangzi are dialogues as well. The dialogue is a powerful rhetorical form, dramatic and challenging, one that demands a response from its audience.
One of the more common rhetorical forms in Buddhism is paradox, and Huineng certainly makes use of this in his teaching. Thus, for instance, he admonishes his students, “Do not depart from deceptions and errors; for they of themselves are the nature of True Reality” (section 27). Later when on the point of death, he takes his closest disciples to task for their ignorance by saying, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet.” (section 48) There is something very tricky in such sayings, as they are seemingly contradictory if not absurd. The point of a paradox, of course, is that such absurdity is only apparent for the paradox masks a higher truth that we must divine ourselves. As such, paradox is a highly suggestive form of rhetoric, one that presents us with a basic tension, leaving it for us to resolve.
Huineng also engages in a great deal of polemics in the Platform Sutra. For example, he continually contrasts the “wise” with the “deluded.” He also draws a sharp contrast between his teachings and those of the “Northern school” (secs. 37, 39, 48-49), criticizes a student whose “practice” consists of only reciting the Lotus Sutra (sec. 42), and even converts a “spy” who seems to have come to discredit him (secs. 40-41). While a polemical style may have negative connotations it also serves several rhetorical purposes. To begin, it sets the Master and his audience apart from others, thereby emphasizing that this teaching is different or special. It also underscores the challenging nature of the teaching, and no doubt directly counters various preconceived ideas in the audience. Indeed, it may even put his disciples and audience on the defensive, thus setting them up psychologically for a deeper breakthrough.
All in all, Huineng’s teaching style is quite challenging. At times it is highly provocative, even maddening. He does not lay his subjects out neatly so that his audience can absorb what he says with ease but jars his listeners to elicit a reaction from them. His words, thus, are inherently unstable and elusive, pouring forth quixotically. They resist final definition and closure, similar to Zhuangzi’s “goblet words” (zhi yan, cf. Zhuangzi chapter 27) or what the fifth century Buddhist thinker Sengzhao terms “wild words” (kuan yan, cf. his essay “Panruo Wuzhi”). Such stylistic considerations, in the end, suggest that the ultimate message of Huineng’s sermon may not be so much what he says as how he says it and how we take up his words in our response.
As noted above, Huineng himself claims that nothing in his teachings originates with him, much as Confucius does in Analects 15.28. Clearly, what he iterates in the Platform Sutra derives from earlier works and there are many times when he makes explicit references to other texts, notably the Diamond, Vimalakirti, and Lotus Sutras. In addition, we should also mention the Nirvana Sutra, a text promoting the universality of the “Buddha-nature” that had a profound influence on Chinese Buddhism as a whole. The influences, however, go far beyond this short list. Huineng demonstrates knowledge of the great body of Prajna-paramita (Perfection of Wisdom) literature (of which the Diamond Sutra is one rather late example), as well as the techniques of the Madhyamika school – notably in the negation of set positions, dialectic play between “conventional” and “Ultimate” truth, and the constant challenge to any attempts at a final articulation of Buddhist truth. In addition, at certain points he reveals a basic familiarity with Pure Land doctrine (sec. 35) and some rather technical aspects of Abhidharma and Yogacara philosophy (sec. 45)
Moreover, Huineng’s teachings and style of presentation also owe a great deal to indigenous Chinese sources. This is most obvious when it comes to Daoism, as Huineng’s character and actions so often epitomize teachings found in both the Daode jing and the Zhuangzi. As for Confucian tradition, Huineng makes an obvious bow to Confucius in presenting himself as a transmitter, while his adherence to the positive power of “Buddha nature” owes at least something to the Mencian idea of “inherent goodness” of human nature, a perennial theme in Chinese philosophy that finds one of its most popular articulations in the Zhongyong (“Doctrine of the Mean”). Other scholars have even suggested that portions of the Platform Sutra may have been compiled under the influence of the Yijing.
The fact that Huineng quotes passages from such a large body of works and that scholars can so-easily discern other literary influences and allusions constitutes further proof that the tradition of Huineng’s illiteracy should not be taken literally. In the Platform Sutra Huineng proves rather erudite, if not bookish. His familiarity with so much of his Buddhist and Chinese heritage challenges stereotypes of Chan as denigrating and even ignoring written texts. Indeed, scholars of Buddhism often point out the ironic fact that Chan, so often known for its dismissal of texts, has the largest body of written work of any East Asian Buddhist tradition. Furthermore, many great Chan masters (for example, Dogen, 1200-1253) were brilliant scholars and original thinkers. This paradoxical aspect of Chan, rather than being the product of centuries of institutionalization as some might claim, seems to have been there from the very beginning.
Although the Platform Sutra is most unusual for a “philosophical” text, both in terms of style and content it raises a number of issues that are of particular philosophic import.
Chan has a reputation for irrationality, allegedly insisting that practitioners cut off thinking entirely. There is some basis for such views, and in Chan history we do find examples where this seems to have been encouraged, as, for example, in the case of the Baotang school of Chan that developed in Sichuan during eighth century. Huineng and most Chan masters, however, do not advocate a disorderly or irrational lifestyle. Their concern, instead, seems to be on the predominance of ratio (deliberative, analytic thinking) and the discursive reasoning that severs aspects of reality into discrete bits, usually from an egocentric standpoint. From a Chan perspective, this mode of understanding is the result of a highly artificial process that cuts one off from full participation in one’s immediate context and inevitably leads to suffering. Such an approach cannot be countered with rational, objective arguments because such reasoning is itself a product of such a mode of understanding. By breaking the grip of such processes on humanity, Huineng and his later followers seek to free us for a fuller, more natural life, and hence a truer life.
Much of the difficulty surrounding this subject stems from Chan’s distinctive rhetorical style, of which Huineng is a true master. In particular the notion of “no-thought” seems to suggest a sort of mindless, purely instinctual response or perhaps even unconsciousness. Certainly, “no-thought” is not rational in the sense of bare objectivity. In fact, as we have seen, “no-thought” is not this at all but more like an attitude of carefully attentiveness to the situation at hand. If “no-thought” is lacking in anything it would be the self-consciousness that typically arises out of the dualism inherent in subject-object thinking. Most assuredly “no-thought” should not be equated with becoming insentient, that is, an “object” among others.
Is there a place for reason in all this? Not in the ordinary sense. However, Chan would seem to be less “irrational” than “a rational,” although such labels themselves are designations arising within discursive reasoning. In the end, it may be helpful to view Huineng as espousing a type of “philosophy as propaganda,” much like Nagarjuna or the later Wittgenstein. The aim is not to argue but to change one’s way of thinking in favor of a more immediate and direct way of being.
Much has been made of this notion in Chan scholarship and, indeed, Chan tradition often presents the as a conflict of “Northern Chan Gradualism” and “Southern Chan Subitism” – an alleged conflict from which the latter emerged victorious. In reality it is not really so simple, but the contrast points to an instable dynamic that lies at the heart of Buddhism and perhaps all spiritual practice. If “sudden awakening” refers to an instantaneous experience of enlightenment at which point nothing more needs to be done, then why did someone like Huineng continue to sit in meditation through his later years and exhort his students to do the same even after his death (section 53)?
In fact, what Huineng says about the contrast between “sudden” and “gradual” is anything but clear: “Good friends, in the dharma there is no sudden or gradual, but among people some are keen and others dull. The deluded recommend the gradual method, the enlightened practice the sudden teaching. . . Once enlightened, there is from the outset no distinction between these two methods; those who are not enlightened with for long kalpas be caught in the cycle of transmigration” (section 16). In part it appears that the distinction between “sudden” and “gradual” is a provisional one made from the unawakened standpoint that applies to Chan practitioners rather than the actual event of awakening itself. Yet can one move from delusion to enlightenment, from gradual to sudden? It also seems that the difference between “sudden” and “gradual” cannot refer to a temporal distinction, for even a “sudden awakening” certainly cannot be attained easily or without much practice; Huineng had several “sudden awakenings” but devoted himself to a lifetime of Chan practice.
Later Chan thinkers such as Zongmi (a.k.a. Guifeng, 780-841) were deeply concerned about these notions and sought to clarify them by speaking of “sudden awakening followed by gradual cultivation.” While intriguing, such a solution essentially erases any ultimate meaning to the sudden/gradual distinction. It also implies that claims to “sudden awakening” by Huineng and his followers line were rhetorical rather than genuine.
The reputation of Chan as eschewing textual study has long been a source of controversy and great appeal. We can see this even in the “Chan motto” attributed to Bodhidharma in which the dharma is said to be a “separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and letters.” There can be no arguing that Chan presents a basic distrust of scholasticism that seems to have characterized the Chinese doctrinal schools such as Tiantai and Huayan. But does this mean that texts have no place? This would hardly seem to be warranted given what we find in the Platform Sutra. In the autobiographical portions of the Sutra Huineng has his initial awakening from hearing a text (the Diamond Sutra), demonstrates his worth through his own “dharma verse,” and received official dharma transmission through verbal teachings from Hongren. Moreover, Huineng’s sermon is full of instances in which he unfolds the various meanings in a number of Buddhist texts. In addition, there are several passages in which Huineng draws attention to the text of his sermon itself, stating “If others are able to encounter the Platform Sutra, it will be as if they received the teaching personally from me” (section 47). The text goes on to note that Huineng’s closest disciples received his teaching, made copies of the Platform Sutra and entrusted them to later generations, all of whom were led through it to see into their own true natures.
An important clue for our understanding can be found when Huineng is preparing to give his “death verse.” Before launching into his final teaching he tells his disciples, “if you understand its meaning, you will be the same as I” (section 48). Like Sakyamuni before his passing, Huineng promises that that the master will remain with his students in the form of his teachings. These teachings, compiled in textual form, will have the power to lead hearers and readers to realization of their True natures once they grasp the teachings’ true import. In this reading, the Master’s role is open up the teachings via his own words (or actions) and so manifest their meaning; the crucial point is that these are transmitted by the Master and taken up by the students – a process that can only happen “outside the scriptures” themselves. There is an interesting parallel here to the view of the Neo-Confucian master Zhu Xi, who, in outlining the regimen of study for his disciples, emphasizes the importance of texts as a coming into the very presence of the Sages themselves.
The conclusion seems to be that Huineng does not denigrate texts per se, for they were instrumental in his own awakening and play a central role in his sermons. Instead, he (and later Chan tradition) attacks the tendency to treat them objectively, as material to be mastered rather than dharma gates leading to awakening. Ego, cutting off from full involvement in the world. Taking texts truly as “scripture,” however, is another matter. The words of dharma are Buddha in that they allow us to perceive truth. In this view, then, those passages in the Platform Sutra calling attention to the text itself emphasize its way of connecting one with Huineng’s wisdom offered for our awakening. What we see then is that through Huineng, Chan celebrates the centrality of text, but as “live word” internalized and acted upon rather than mere marks on the page. Such an existential engagement, however, is not typically found in the modern study of philosophy and so raises questions about what “philosophy” may actually be.
The centrality of practice is a major refrain in Huineng’s discourse. Despite his often-cryptic comments, the Master shares the decidedly practical focus that runs through much of Chinese philosophic culture. Time and time again, Huineng exhorts us to a life of Chan action and practice, a life of Buddhahood, rather than quietistic withdrawal. Although clearly there is some sort of “theory” informing Huineng (a sinified version of tathagatha-garbha teachings), this never takes precedence over practical application. In fact, Huineng (and Chan in general) refuses to distinguish between these two concepts, arguing essentially that true knowing is practical action. Thus, from this perspective nothing can be “true in theory” if it is not borne out in practice.
The priority of praxis is underscored by the fact that Chan is often regarded first and foremost as a “practice school.” In contrast to the doctrinal concerns of the Tiantai and Huayan, Chan emphasizes practices such as “no-thought” while maintaining that getting tangled up in mistaken ideas inevitably leads one astray. Since we are already Buddha, we must realize this through Buddha living. Only then are we awakened to the truth of our original (Buddha) nature.
There are some interesting analogies to Huineng’s perspective that provide much food for thought. Socrates, for example, famously argues that “to know the good is to do the good,” implying that true understanding is always attested in actual life. In a different vein, there is also Martin Heidegger’s existential analysis of dasein in which he focuses on our unreflective “being-in-the-world” as demonstrating a prior unthematized Understanding, that is, our actual (as opposed to theoretical) knowledge of things. Perhaps the most obvious analogy, however, can be found in the work of Wang Yangming (Wang Shouren, 1472-1529). Among his teachings, Wang maintained that knowing and acting formed an essential original unity that people often separate through their own selfish desires. In fact, Wang explained to one of his greatest disciples, “There have never been people who know but do not act. Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not know.”
This matter has received little attention until recently but is an outgrowth of the general Chinese focus on practice. We have already seen that in the Platform Sutra Huineng constantly preaches to his charges to act upon his teachings, putting them into practice. This preaching, of course, is itself a type of Chan practice and, in fact, occurs within a ritual context and in a temple setting. Giving and listening to a “dharma talk” are both highly ritualized activities that follow their own specified rules. Furthermore, Huineng repeatedly enjoins his followers to chant certain vows aloud and to take various types of precepts. Thus the entire discourse is pervaded by a strong sense of ritual, or li. There is a strong, albeit implicit message here that Huineng is calling for participation in specific activities from all those in his audience, that is, all who hear or read the Platform Sutra.
Adherence to li, of course, has been a primary focus of Chinese culture from the very earliest times, and philosophical discussion of li plays a central role in Chinese thought since at least the time of Confucius. Moreover, li by their very nature are a form of highly regulated activity that require repeated engagement to learn. One learns the li by doing the li. Huineng and the text of the Platform Sutra thus underscore the highly ritualized nature of Chan life, a fact that several scholars have noted and which provides yet another strong contrast to popular (mis)understandings of Chan. Rather than being an incitement to egocentric spontaneity (which would result in utter chaos, and hence more delusion and suffering), the “sudden awakening” espoused by Huineng can only occur within a ritual context in which all parties are actively engaged. Those involved are not “doing their own thing” but participating in a shared activity in which all energies are marshaled in concert. It is just for this reason that Huineng stresses the “samadhi of oneness” and Chan monastic training involves meditation training not just during periods of actual physical sitting but throughout all daily activities.
Huineng’s impact on Chan is without parallel. Not only did he articulate the major themes that came to dominate Chan discourse and practice, he provided the model of the ideal Master. By the late eighth century, two main branches of Chan existed: the “Northern” and “Southern” schools. Claiming to have studied under Huineng, Shenhui (684-758) launched an attack on the legitimacy of “Northern” Chan, which enjoyed imperial patronage during the Tang dynasty (618-907) under the leadership of Master Shenxiu (ca. 606-706) and his heir, Puji (651-739). Alleging that his teacher was the true recipient of dharma transmission and ridiculing the latter’s “gradualist” approach to awakening, Shenhui insisted that Huineng was the real Sixth Patriarch and claimed the title of Seventh Patriarch for himself. Shenhui’s claims carried the day and by the ninth century, the “Southern” school with its teaching of “sudden awakening” was accepted as the official line. Ironically, both the “Northern” and “Southern” schools eventually died out as direct lineages. It was only later that, having survived the imperial persecutions of 841-845, other Chan schools reasserted their connection(s) to Huineng and so enshrined the tale of unilinear dharma transmission.
The Platform Sutra became wildly popular in China, perhaps because of its paradoxical “Daoist” air, and numerous copies circulated. The traditional version, printed some five hundred years after the oldest version, is almost twice the size of the original due to later additions and expansions. Huineng’s idiosyncratic way of discussing the sutras, less of a strict exegesis and more a performance of their message, a practice known as tichang (Japanese teisho) set the standard for a Chan “dharma talk.” Stories of Huineng are scattered throughout the various gong’an (Japanese koan) collections. Perhaps the most famous of these allegedly comes from Huineng’s confrontation with Huiming, the fierce former general who came to kill him on the mountaintop. As the Huiming approached, the Master asked, “Not thinking of good, not thinking of evil, just at this moment, what is our original face before your mother and father were born?” Huiming at once became enlightened. This koan is still one of the first given to beginning students in Japanese Zen monasteries.
By inaugurating a powerful new approach to the dharma, however, Huineng had impact far beyond Buddhism and Chan. Philosophically, the strongest effect was on Neo-Confucianism, a major response of Confucian tradition to the challenges offered by Buddhism, particularly Chan. Each of the “Five Great Masters” (Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai, Cheng Yi, Cheng Hao, Zhu Xi) studied Chan at some point in their youth, and the records of their discussions with students as well as the anecdotes concerning their lives (collected in such works as Reflections on Things at Hand) strongly resemble later Chan collections such as the Wumen guan (The Gateless Gate). Chan influence on Wang Yangming is so great as to scarcely need comment.
As for Daoism, the most obvious impact Chan had was on the formation of the Quanzhen (“Complete Perfection”) school, a monastic sect that originated in the twelfth century. The Quanzhen sect shows blatant Chan influence, from its code of regulations, meditation techniques, and even the layout of its monastic compounds. The school’s founder, Wang Chongyang (1112-1170), with his cryptic teaching style and insistence on diligent practice at all times, could even be one of Huineng’s disciples.
The portrait of Huineng emerging from Chan tradition and the Platform Sutra in particular is quite compelling. The Master is portrayed as brilliant despite (or because of) his humble beginnings and takes on a truly heroic stature through his trials and eventual triumph. In his statements, Huineng comes across as immensely charismatic. He is by turns insightful, iconoclastic and humorous. Throughout his discourse he challenges his audience to leave behind intellectual preconceptions while undercutting all attempts to grasp his meaning by rational means. Ironically, during this lengthy verbal discourse he proclaims, “the practice of self-awakening does not lie in verbal arguments.” (section 38) This despite offering long harangues against Chan practitioners who have “false views.” Huineng, thus, is the archetypal Chan Master, a model for all later Chan practitioners. We can even see traces of Huineng in the character of Yoda, the great Jedi master from the Star Wars film series. At one point in Episode V: The Empire Strikes Back, Yoda famously tells his disciple Luke Skywalker, “Do, or do not — there is no ‘try’!” — a line that could be straight from the Platform Sutra. Truly, Huineng lives on.
John M. Thompson
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 15, 2006 | Originally published: