Human Rights

Human rights are certain moral guarantees. This article examines the philosophical basis and content of the doctrine of human rights. The analysis consists of five sections and a conclusion. Section one assesses the contemporary significance of human rights, and argues that the doctrine of human rights has become the dominant moral doctrine for evaluating the moral status of the contemporary geo-political order. Section two proceeds to chart the historical development of the concept of human rights, beginning with a discussion of the earliest philosophical origins of the philosophical bases of human rights and culminating in some of most recent developments in the codification of human rights. Section three considers the philosophical concept of a human right and analyses the formal and substantive distinctions philosophers have drawn between various forms and categories of rights. Section four addresses the question of how philosophers have sought to justify the claims of human rights and specifically charts the arguments presented by the two presently dominant approaches in this field: interest theory and will theory. Section five then proceeds to discuss some of the main criticisms currently levelled at the doctrine of human rights and highlights some of the main arguments of those who have challenged the universalist and objectivist bases of human rights. Finally, a brief conclusion is presented, summarising the main themes addressed.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights
  2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights
  3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights
    1. Moral vs. Legal Rights
    2. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights
    3. Substantive categories of human rights
    4. Scope of human rights duties
  4. Philosophical justifications of human rights
    1. Do human rights require philosophical justification?
    2. The interests theory approach
    3. The Will Theory Approach
  5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights
    1. Moral relativism
    2. Epistemological criticisms of human rights
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: the contemporary significance of human rights

Human rights have been defined as

basic moral guarantees that people in all countries and cultures allegedly have simply because they are people. Calling these guarantees “rights” suggests that they attach to particular individuals who can invoke them, that they are of high priority, and that compliance with them is mandatory rather than discretionary. Human rights are frequently held to be universal in the sense that all people have and should enjoy them, and to be independent in the sense that they exist and are available as standards of justification and criticism whether or not they are recognized and implemented by the legal system or officials of a country. (Nickel, 1992:561-2)

The moral doctrine of human rights aims at identifying the fundamental prerequisites for each human being leading a minimally good life. Human rights aim to identify both the necessary negative and positive prerequisites for leading a minimally good life, such as rights against torture and rights to health care. This aspiration has been enshrined in various declarations and legal conventions issued during the past fifty years, initiated by the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) and perpetuated by, most importantly, the European Convention on Human Rights (1954) and the International Covenant on Civil and Economic Rights (1966). Together these three documents form the centrepiece of a moral doctrine that many consider to be capable of providing the contemporary geo-political order with what amounts to an international bill of rights. However, the doctrine of human rights does not aim to be a fully comprehensive moral doctrine. An appeal to human rights does not provide us with a fully comprehensive account of morality per se. Human rights do not, for example, provide us with criteria for answering such questions as whether telling lies is inherently immoral, or what the extent of one’s moral obligations to friends and lovers ought to be? What human rights do primarily aim to identify is the basis for determining the shape, content, and scope of fundamental, public moral norms. As James Nickel states, human rights aim to secure for individuals the necessary conditions for leading a minimally good life. Public authorities, both national and international, are identified as typically best placed to secure these conditions and so, the doctrine of human rights has become, for many, a first port of moral call for determining the basic moral guarantees all of us have a right to expect, both of one another but also, primarily, of those national and international institutions capable of directly affecting our most important interests. The doctrine of human rights aspires to provide the contemporary, allegedly post-ideological, geo-political order with a common framework for determining the basic economic, political, and social conditions required for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. While the practical efficacy of promoting and protecting human rights is significantly aided by individual nation-states’ legally recognising the doctrine, the ultimate validity of human rights is characteristically thought of as not conditional upon such recognition. The moral justification of human rights is thought to precede considerations of strict national sovereignty. An underlying aspiration of the doctrine of human rights is to provide a set of legitimate criteria to which all nation-states should adhere. Appeals to national sovereignty should not provide a legitimate means for nation-states to permanently opt out of their fundamental human rights-based commitments. Thus, the doctrine of human rights is ideally placed to provide individuals with a powerful means for morally auditing the legitimacy of those contemporary national and international forms of political and economic authority which confront us and which claim jurisdiction over us. This is no small measure of the contemporary moral and political significance of the doctrine of human rights. For many of its most strident supporters, the doctrine of human rights aims to provide a fundamentally legitimate moral basis for regulating the contemporary geo-political order.

2. Historical origins and development of the theory and practice of human rights

The doctrine of human rights rests upon a particularly fundamental philosophical claim: that there exists a rationally identifiable moral order, an order whose legitimacy precedes contingent social and historical conditions and applies to all human beings everywhere and at all times. On this view, moral beliefs and concepts are capable of being objectively validated as fundamentally and universally true. The contemporary doctrine of human rights is one of a number of universalist moral perspectives. The origins and development of the theory of human rights is inextricably tied to the development of moral universalism. The history of the philosophical development of human rights is punctuated by a number of specific moral doctrines which, though not themselves full and adequate expressions of human rights, have nevertheless provided a number of philosophical prerequisites for the contemporary doctrine. These include a view of morality and justice as emanating from some pre-social domain, the identification of which provides the basis for distinguishing between ‘true’ and merely ‘conventional’ moral principles and beliefs. The essential prerequisites for a defence of human rights also include a conception of the individual as the bearer of certain ‘natural’ rights and a particular view of the inherent and equal moral worth of each rational individual. I shall discuss each in turn.

Human rights rest upon moral universalism and the belief in the existence of a truly universal moral community comprising all human beings. Moral universalism posits the existence of rationally identifiable trans-cultural and trans-historical moral truths. The origins of moral universalism within Europe are typically associated with the writings of Aristotle and the Stoics. Thus, in his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle unambiguously expounds an argument in support of the existence of a natural moral order. This natural order ought to provide the basis for all truly rational systems of justice. An appeal to the natural order provides a set of comprehensive and potentially universal criteria for evaluating the legitimacy of actual ‘man-made’ legal systems. In distinguishing between ‘natural justice’ and ‘legal justice’, Aristotle writes, ‘the natural is that which has the same validity everywhere and does not depend upon acceptance.’ (Nicomachean Ethics, 189) Thus, the criteria for determining a truly rational system of justice pre-exist social and historical conventions. ‘Natural justice’ pre-exists specific social and political configurations. The means for determining the form and content of natural justice is the exercise of reason free from the distorting effects of mere prejudice or desire. This basic idea was similarly expressed by the Roman Stoics, such as Cicero and Seneca, who argued that morality originated in the rational will of God and the existence of a cosmic city from which one could discern a natural, moral law whose authority transcended all local legal codes. The Stoics’ argued that this ethically universal code imposed upon all of us a duty to obey the will of god. The Stoics thereby posited the existence of a universal moral community effected through our shared relationship with god. The belief in the existence of a universal moral community was maintained in Europe by Christianity over the ensuing centuries. While some have discerned intimations towards the notion of rights in the writings of Aristotle, the Stoics, and Christian theologians, a concept of rights approximating that of the contemporary idea of human rights most clearly emerges during the 17th. And 18th. Centuries in Europe and the so-called doctrine of natural law.

The basis of the doctrine of natural law is the belief in the existence of a natural moral code based upon the identification of certain fundamental and objectively verifiable human goods. Our enjoyment of these basic goods is to be secured by our possession of equally fundamental and objectively verifiable natural rights. Natural law was deemed to pre-exist actual social and political systems. Natural rights were thereby similarly presented as rights individuals possessed independently of society or polity. Natural rights were thereby presented as ultimately valid irrespective of whether they had achieved the recognition of any given political ruler or assembly. The quintessential exponent of this position was the 17th. Century philosopher John Locke and, in particular, the argument he outlined in his Two Treatises of Government (1688). At the centre of Locke’s argument is the claim that individuals possess natural rights, independently of the political recognition granted them by the state. These natural rights are possessed independently of, and prior to, the formation of any political community. Locke argued that natural rights flowed from natural law. Natural law originated from God. Accurately discerning the will of God provided us with an ultimately authoritative moral code. At root, each of us owes a duty of self-preservation to God. In order to successfully discharge this duty of self-preservation each individual had to be free from threats to life and liberty, whilst also requiring what Locke presented as the basic, positive means for self-preservation: personal property. Our duty of self-preservation to god entailed the necessary existence of basic natural rights to life, liberty, and property. Locke proceeded to argue that the principal purpose of the investiture of political authority in a sovereign state was the provision and protection of individuals’ basic natural rights. For Locke, the protection and promotion of individuals’ natural rights was the sole justification for the creation of government. The natural rights to life, liberty, and property set clear limits to the authority and jurisdiction of the State. States were presented as existing to serve the interests, the natural rights, of the people, and not of a Monarch or a ruling cadre. Locke went so far as to argue that individuals are morally justified in taking up arms against their government should it systematically and deliberately fail in its duty to secure individuals’ possession of natural rights.

Analyses of the historical predecessors of the contemporary theory of human rights typically accord a high degree of importance to Locke’s contribution. Certainly, Locke provided the precedent of establishing legitimate political authority upon a rights foundation. This is an undeniably essential component of human rights. However, the philosophically adequate completion of theoretical basis of human rights requires an account of moral reasoning, that is both consistent with the concept of rights, but which does not necessarily require an appeal to the authority of some super-human entity in justifying human beings’ claims to certain, fundamental rights. The 18th. Century German philosopher, Immanuel Kant provides such an account.

Many of the central themes first expressed within Kant’s moral philosophy remain highly prominent in contemporary philosophical justifications of human rights. Foremost amongst these are the ideals of equality and the moral autonomy of rational human beings. Kant bestows upon contemporary human rights’ theory the ideal of a potentially universal community of rational individuals autonomously determining the moral principles for securing the conditions for equality and autonomy. Kant provides a means for justifying human rights as the basis for self-determination grounded within the authority of human reason. Kant’s moral philosophy is based upon an appeal to the formal principles of ethics, rather than, for example, an appeal to a concept of substantive human goods. For Kant, the determination of any such goods can only proceed from a correct determination of the formal properties of human reason and thus do not provide the ultimate means for determining the correct ends, or object, of human reason. Kant’s moral philosophy begins with an attempt to correctly identify those principles of reasoning that can be applied equally to all rational persons, irrespective of their own specific desires or partial interests. In this way, Kant attaches a condition of universality to the correct identification of moral principles. For him, the basis of moral reasoning must rest upon a condition that all rational individuals are bound to assent to. Doing the right thing is thus not determined by acting in pursuit of one’s own interests or desires, but acting in accordance with a maxim which all rational individuals are bound to accept. Kant terms this the categorical imperative, which he formulates in the following terms, ‘act only on that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law.’ (1948:84). Kant argues that this basic condition of universality in determining the moral principles for governing human relations is a necessary expression of the moral autonomy and fundamental equality of all rational individuals. The categorical imperative is self-imposed by morally autonomous and formally equal rational persons. It provides the basis for determining the scope and form of those laws which morally autonomous and equally rational individuals will institute in order to secure these very same conditions. For Kant, the capacity for the exercise of reason is the distinguishing characteristic of humanity and the basis for justifying human dignity. As the distinguishing characteristic of humanity, formulating the principles of the exercise of reason must necessarily satisfy a test of universality; they must be capable of being universally recognized by all equally rational agents. Hence, Kant’s formulation of the categorical imperative. Kant’s moral philosophy is notoriously abstract and resists easy comprehension. Though often overlooked in accounts of the historical development of human rights, his contribution to human rights has been profound. Kant provides a formulation of fundamental moral principles that, though exceedingly formal and abstract, are based upon the twin ideals of equality and moral autonomy. Human rights are rights we give to ourselves, so to speak, as autonomous and formally equal beings. For Kant, any such rights originate in the formal properties of human reason, and not the will of some super-human being.

The philosophical ideas defended by the likes of Locke and Kant have come to be associated with the general Enlightenment project initiated during the 17th. and 18th. Centuries, the effects of which were to extend across the globe and over ensuing centuries. Ideals such as natural rights, moral autonomy, human dignity and equality provided a normative bedrock for attempts at re-constituting political systems, for overthrowing formerly despotic regimes and seeking to replace them with forms of political authority capable of protecting and promoting these new emancipatory ideals. These ideals effected significant, even revolutionary, political upheavals throughout the 18th. Century, enshrined in such documents as the United States’ Declaration of Independence and the French National Assembly’s Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen. Similarly, the concept of individual rights continued to resound throughout the 19th. Century exemplified by Mary Wollstencraft’s Vindication of the Rights of Women and other political movements to extend political suffrage to sections of society who had been denied the possession of political and civil rights. The concept of rights had become a vehicle for effecting political change. Though one could argue that the conceptual prerequisites for the defence of human rights had long been in place, a full Declaration of the doctrine of human rights only finally occurred during the 20th. Century and only in response to the most atrocious violations of human rights, exemplified by the Holocaust. The Universal Declaration of Human Rights (UDHR) was adopted by the UN General Assembly on 10th. December 1948 and was explicitly motivated to prevent the future occurrence of any similar atrocities. The Declaration itself goes far beyond any mere attempt to reassert all individuals’ possession of the right to life as a fundamental and inalienable human right. The UDHR consists of a Preamble and 30 articles which separately identify such things as the right not to be tortured (article 5), a right to asylum (article 14), a right to own property (article 17), and a right to an adequate standard of living (article 25) as being fundamental human rights. As I noted earlier, the UDHR has been further supplemented by such documents as the European Convention for the Protection of Human Rights and Fundamental Freedoms (1953) and the International Covenant on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights (1966). The specific aspirations contained within these three documents have themselves been reinforced by innumerable other Declarations and Conventions. Taken together these various Declarations, conventions and covenants comprise the contemporary human rights doctrine and embody both the belief in the existence of a universally valid moral order and a belief in all human beings’ possession of fundamental and equal moral status, enshrined within the concept of human rights. It is important to note, however, that the contemporary doctrine of human rights, whilst deeply indebted to the concept of natural rights, is not a mere expression of that concept but actually goes beyond it in some highly significant respects. James Nickel ( 1987: 8-10) identifies three specific ways in which the contemporary concept of human rights differs from, and goes beyond that of natural rights. First, he argues that contemporary human rights are far more concerned to view the realization of equality as requiring positive action by the state, via the provision of welfare assistance, for example. Advocates of natural rights, he argues, were far more inclined to view equality in formalistic terms, as principally requiring the state to refrain from ‘interfering’ in individuals’ lives. Second, he argues that, whereas advocates of natural rights tended to conceive of human beings as mere individuals, veritable ‘islands unto themselves’, advocates of contemporary human rights are far more willing to recognize the importance of family and community in individuals’ lives. Third, Nickel views contemporary human rights as being far more ‘internationalist’ in scope and orientation than was typically found within arguments in support of natural rights. That is to say, the protection and promotion of human rights are increasingly seen as requiring international action and concern. The distinction drawn by Nickel between contemporary human rights and natural rights allows one to discern the development of the concept of human rights. Indeed, many writers on human rights agree in the identification of three generations of human rights. First generation rights consist primarily of rights to security, property, and political participation. These are most typically associated with the French and US Declarations. Second generation rights are construed as socio-economic rights, rights to welfare, education, and leisure, for example. These rights largely originate within the UDHR. The final and third generation of rights are associated with such rights as a right to national self-determination, a clean environment, and the rights of indigenous minorities. This generation of rights really only takes hold during the last two decades of the 20th. Century but represents a significant development within the doctrine of human rights generally.

While the full significance of human rights may only be finally dawning on some people, the concept itself has a history spanning over two thousand years. The development of the concept of human rights is punctuated by the emergence and assimilation of various philosophical and moral ideals and appears to culminate, at least to our eyes, in the establishment of a highly complex set of legal and political documents and institutions, whose express purpose is the protection and promotion of the fundamental rights of all human beings everywhere. Few should underestimate the importance of this particular current of human history.

3. Philosophical analysis of the concept of human rights

Human rights are rights that attach to human beings and function as moral guarantees in support of our claims towards the enjoyment of a minimally good life. In conceptual terms, human rights are themselves derivative of the concept of a right. This section focuses upon the philosophical analysis of the concept of a ‘right’ in order to clearly demonstrate the various constituent parts of the concept from which human rights emerges. In order to gain a full understanding of both the philosophical foundations of the doctrine of human rights and the different ways in which separate human rights function, a detailed analysis is required.

a. Moral vs. Legal Rights

The distinction drawn between moral rights and legal rights as two separate categories of rights is of fundamental importance to understanding the basis and potential application of human rights. Legal rights refer to all those rights found within existing legal codes. A legal right is a right that enjoys the recognition and protection of the law. Questions as to its existence can be resolved by simply locating the relevant legal instrument or piece of legislation. A legal right cannot be said to exist prior to its passing into law and the limits of its validity are set by the jurisdiction of the body which passed the relevant legislation. An example of a legal right would be my daughter’s legal right to receive an adequate education, as enshrined within the United Kingdom’s Education Act (1944). Suffice it to say, that the exercise of this right is limited to the United Kingdom. My daughter has no legal right to receive an adequate education from a school board in Southern California. Legal positivists argue that the only rights that can be said to legitimately exist are legal rights, rights that originate within a legal system. On this view, moral rights are not rights in the strict sense, but are better thought of as moral claims, which may or may not eventually be assimilated within national or international law. For a legal positivist, such as the 19th. Century legal philosopher Jeremy Bentham, there can be no such thing as human rights existing prior to, or independently from legal codification. For a positivist determining the existence of rights is no more complicated than locating the relevant legal statute or precedent. In stark contrast, moral rights are rights that, it is claimed, exist prior to and independently from their legal counterparts. The existence and validity of a moral right is not deemed to be dependent upon the actions of jurists and legislators. Many people argued, for example, that the black majority in apartheid South Africa possessed a moral right to full political participation in that country’s political system, even though there existed no such legal right. What is interesting is that many people framed their opposition to apartheid in rights terms. What many found so morally repugnant about apartheid South Africa was precisely its denial of numerous fundamental moral rights, including the rights not to be discriminated against on grounds of colour and rights to political participation, to the majority of that country’s inhabitants. This particular line of opposition and protest could only be pursued because of a belief in the existence and validity of moral rights. A belief that fundamental rights which may or may not have received legal recognition elsewhere, remained utterly valid and morally compelling even, and perhaps especially, in those countries whose legal systems had not recognized these rights. A rights-based opposition to apartheid South Africa could not have been initiated and maintained by appeal to legal rights, for obvious reasons. No one could legitimately argue that the legal political rights of non-white South Africans were being violated under apartheid, since no such legal rights existed. The systematic denial of such rights did, however, constitute a gross violation of those peoples’ fundamental moral rights.

From the above example it should be clear that human rights cannot be reduced to, or exclusively identified with legal rights. The legal positivist’s account of justified law excludes the possibility of condemning such systems as apartheid from a rights perspective. It might, therefore, appear tempting to draw the conclusion that human rights are best identified as moral rights. After all, the existence of the UDHR and various International Covenants, to which South Africa was not a signatory in most cases, provided opponents of apartheid with a powerful moral argument. Apartheid was founded upon the denial of fundamental human rights. Human rights certainly share an essential quality of moral rights, namely, that their valid existence is not deemed to be conditional upon their being legally recognized. Human rights are meant to apply to all human beings everywhere, regardless of whether they have received legal recognition by all countries everywhere. Clearly, there remain numerous countries that wholly or partially exclude formal legal recognition to fundamental human rights. Supporters of human rights in these countries insist that the rights remain valid regardless, as fundamental moral rights. The universality of human rights positively entails such claims. The universality of human rights as moral rights clearly lends greater moral force to human rights. However, for their part, legal rights are not subject to disputes as to their existence and validity in quite the way moral rights are. It would be a mistake to exclusively identify human rights with moral rights. Human rights are better thought of as both moral rights and legal rights. Human rights originate as moral rights and their legitimacy is necessarily dependent upon the legitimacy of the concept of moral rights. A principal aim of advocates of human rights is for these rights to receive universal legal recognition. This was, after all, a fundamental goal of the opponents of apartheid. Human rights are best thought of, therefore, as being both moral and legal rights. The legitimacy claims of human rights are tied to their status as moral rights. The practical efficacy of human rights is, however, largely dependent upon their developing into legal rights. In those cases where specific human rights do not enjoy legal recognition, such as in the example of apartheid above, moral rights must be prioritised with the intention that defending the moral claims of such rights as a necessary prerequisite for the eventual legal recognition of the rights in question.

b. Claim Rights & Liberty Rights

To gain an understanding of the functional properties of human rights it is necessary to consider the more specific distinction drawn between claim rights and liberty rights. It should be noted that it is something of a convention to begin such discussions by reference to W.N. Hohfeld’s (1919) more extended classification of rights. Hohfeld identified four categories of rights: liberty rights, claim rights, power rights, and immunity rights. However, numerous scholars have subsequently tended to collapse the last two within the first two and hence to restrict attention to liberty rights and claim rights. The political philosopher Peter Jones (1994) provides one such example.

Jones restricts his focus to the distinction between claim rights and liberty rights. He conforms to a well-established trend in rights’ analysis in viewing the former as being of primary importance. Jones defines a claim right as consisting of being owed a duty. A claim right is a right one holds against another person or persons who owe a corresponding duty to the right holder. To return to the example of my daughter. Her right to receive an adequate education is a claim right held against the local education authority, which has a corresponding duty to provide her with the object of the right. Jones identifies further necessary distinctions within the concept of a claim right when he distinguishes between a positive claim right and a negative claim right. The former are rights one holds to some specific good or service, which some other has a duty to provide. My daughter’s claim right to education is therefore a positive claim right. Negative claim rights, in contrast, are rights one holds against others’ interfering in or trespassing upon one’s life or property in some way. My daughter could be said to possess a negative claim right against others attempting to steal her mobile phone, for example. Indeed, such examples lead on to the final distinction Jones identifies within the concept of claim rights: rights held ‘in personam’ and rights held ‘in rem’. Rights held in personam are rights one holds against some specifically identified duty holder, such as the education authority. In contrast, rights held in rem are rights held against no one in particular, but apply to everyone. Thus, my daughter’s right to an education would be practically useless were it not held against some identifiable, relevant, and competent body. Equally, her right against her mobile phone being stolen from her would be highly limited if it did not apply to all those capable of potentially performing such an act. Claim rights, then, can be of either a positive or a negative character and they can be held either in personam or in rem.

Jones defines liberty rights as rights which exist in the absence of any duties not to perform some desired activity and thus consist of those actions one is not prohibited from performing. In contrast to claim rights, liberty rights are primarily negative in character. For example, I may be said to possess a liberty right to spend my vacations lying on a particularly beautiful beach in Greece. Unfortunately, no one has a duty to positively provide for this particular exercise of my liberty right. There is no authority or body, equivalent to an education authority, for example, who has a responsibility to realize my dream for me. A liberty right can be said, then, to be a right to do as one pleases precisely because one is not under an obligation, grounded in others’ claim rights, to refrain from so acting. Liberty rights provide for the capacity to be free, without actually providing the specific means by which one may pursue the objects of one’s will. For example, a multi-millionaire and a penniless vagrant both possess an equal liberty right to holiday in the Caribbean each year.

c. Substantive categories of human rights

The above section was concerned to analyse what might be termed the ‘formal properties’ of rights. This section, in contrast, proceeds to consider the different categories of substantive human rights. If one delves into all of the various documents that together form the codified body of human rights, one can identify and distinguish between five different categories of substantive human rights. These are as follows: rights to life; rights to freedom; rights to political participation; rights to the protection of the rule of law; rights to fundamental social, economic, and cultural goods. These rights span the so-called three generations of rights and involve a complex combination of both liberty and claim rights. Some rights, such as for example the right to life, consist of both liberty and claim rights in roughly equal measure. Thus, the adequate protection of the right to life requires the existence of liberty rights against others trespassing against one’s person and the existence of claim rights to have access to basic prerequisites to sustaining one’s life, such as an adequate diet and health-care. Other rights, such as social, economic, and cultural rights, for example, are weighted more heavily towards the existence of various claim rights, which requires the positive provision of the objects of such rights. The making of substantive distinctions between human rights can have controversial, but important, consequences. Human rights are typically understood to be of equal value, each right is conceived of as equally important as every other. On this view, there can exist no potential for conflict between fundamental human rights. One is simply meant to attach equal moral weight to each and every human right. This prohibits arranging human rights in order of importance. However, conflict between rights can and does occur. Treating all human rights as of equal importance prohibits any attempts to address or resolve such conflict when it arises. Take the example of a hypothetical developing world country with severely limited financial and material resources. This country is incapable of providing the resources for realising all of the human rights for all of its citizens, though it is committed to doing so. In the meantime, government officials wish to know which human rights are more absolute than others, which fundamental human rights should it immediately prioritise and seek to provide for? This question, of course, cannot be answered if one sticks to the position that all rights are of equal importance. It can only be addressed if one allows for the possibility that some human rights are more fundamental than others and that the morally correct action for the government to take would be to prioritise these rights. A refusal to do so, no matter how consistent it may be philosophically would be tantamount to dogmatically sticking one’s head in the metaphorical sands. Attempting to make such distinctions is, of course, a philosophically fraught exercise. It clearly requires the existence of some more ultimate criteria against which one can ‘measure’ the relative importance of separate human rights. This is a highly controversial issue within the philosophy of human rights and one which I shall return to when I consider how philosophers attempt to justify the doctrine of human rights. What remains to be addressed in our analysis of the concept of a human right are the questions of what adequately implementing human rights generally requires, and upon whom does this task fall; who has responsibility for protecting and promoting human rights and what is required of them to do so?

d. Scope of human rights duties

Human rights are said to be possessed equally, by everyone. A conventional corollary of this claim is that everyone has a duty to protect and promote the human rights of everyone else. However, in practice, the onus for securing human rights typically falls upon national governments and international, inter-governmental bodies. Philosophers such as Thomas Pogge (1995) argue that the moral burden for securing human rights should fall disproportionately upon such institutions precisely because they are best placed and most able to effectively perform the task. On this reading, non-governmental organizations and private citizens have an important role to play in supporting the global protection of human rights, but the onus must fall upon the relevant national and international institutions, such as the governments of nation-states and such bodies as the United Nations and the World Bank. One might wish to argue that, for example, human rights can be adequately secured by the existence of reciprocal duties held between individuals across the globe. However, ‘privatizing’ human rights in this fashion would ignore two particularly salient factors: individuals have a tendency to prioritise the moral demands of those closest to them, particularly members of their own family or immediate community; individuals’ ability to exercise their duties is, to a large extent, determined by their own personal financial circumstances. Thus, global inequalities in the distribution of wealth fundamentally undermine the ability of those in the poorer countries to reciprocate assistance provided them by those living in wealthier countries. Reasons such as these underlie Pogge’s insistence that the onus of responsibility lies at the level of national and international institutions. Adequately protecting and promoting human rights requires both nation-states ensuring the adequate provision of services and institutions for their own citizens and the co-operation of nation-states within international institutions acting to secure the requisite global conditions for the protection and promotion of everyone’s human rights.

What must such bodies actively do to adequately secure individuals’ human rights? Does my daughter’s human right to receive an adequate education require the education authority to do everything possible to assist and enhance my child’s education? Does it require the provision of a world-class library, frequent study trips abroad, and employing the most able and best-qualified teachers? The answer is, of course, no. Given the relative scarcity of resources and the demands placed upon those resources, we are inclined to say that adequately securing individuals’ human rights extends to the establishment of decent social and governmental practice so as to ensure that all individuals have the opportunity of leading a minimally good life. In the first instance, national governments are typically held to be primarily responsible for the adequate provision of their own citizens’ human rights. Philosophers such as Brian Orend (2002) endorse this aspiration when he writes that the object of human rights is to secure ‘minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment.’ It is important to note, however, that the duty ensure the provision of even minimal levels of decent and respectful treatment cannot be strictly limited by national boundaries. The adequate protection and promotion of everyone’s human rights does require, for example, the more affluent and powerful nation-states providing sufficient assistance to those countries currently incapable of adequately ensuring the protection of their own citizens’ basic human rights. While some may consider Orend’s aspirations for human rights to be unduly cautious, even the briefest survey of the extent of human suffering and deprivation in many parts of the world today is sufficient to demonstrate just how far we are from realizing even this fairly minimal standard.

National and international institutions bear the primary responsibility of securing human rights and the test for successfully fulfilling this responsibility is the creation of opportunities for all individuals to lead a minimally good life. The realization of human rights requires establishing the conditions for all human beings to lead minimally good lives and thus should not be confused as an attempt to create a morally perfect society. The impression that many have of human rights as being unduly utopian testifies less to the inherent demands of human rights and more to the extent to which even fairly modest aspirations are so far from being realized in the world today. The actual aspirations of human rights are, on the face of it, quite modest. However, this should not distract from a full appreciation of the possible force of human rights. Human rights call for the creation of politically democratic societies in which all citizens have the means of leading a minimally good life. While the object of individual human rights may be modest, the force of that right is intended to be near absolute. That is to say, the demands of rights are meant to take precedence over other possible social goals. Ronald Dworkin has coined the term ‘rights as trumps’ to describe this property. He writes that, ‘rights are best understood as trumps over some background justification for political decisions that states a goal for the community as a whole.’ (1977:153) In general, Dworkin argues, considerations of rights claims must take priority over alternative considerations when formulating public policy and distributing public benefits. Thus, for example, a minority’s possession of rights against discriminatory treatment should trump any and all considerations of the possible benefits that the majority would derive from discriminating against the minority group. Similarly, an individual’s right to an adequate diet should trump other individuals’ desires to eat lavish meals, despite the aggregate gain in pleasure these individuals would derive. For Dworkin, rights as trumps expresses the fundamental ideal of equality upon which the contemporary doctrine of human rights rests. Treating rights as trumps is a means for ensuring that all individuals are treated in an equal and like fashion in respect of the provision of fundamental human rights. Fully realizing the aspirations of human rights may not require the provision of ‘state of the art’ resources, but this should not detract from the force of human rights as taking priority over alternative social and political considerations.

4. Philosophical justifications of human rights

We have established that human rights originate as moral rights but that the successful passage of many human rights into international and national law enables one to think of human rights as, in many cases, both moral rights and legal rights. Furthermore, human rights may be either claim rights or liberty rights, and have a negative or a positive complexion in respect of the obligations imposed by others in securing the right. Human rights may be divided into five different categories and the principal object of securing human rights is the creation of the conditions for all individuals to have the opportunity to lead a minimally good life. Finally, human rights are widely considered to trump other social and political considerations in the allocation of public resources. Broadly speaking, philosophers generally agree on such issues as the formal properties of human rights, the object of human rights, and the force of human rights. However, there is much less agreement upon the fundamental question on how human rights may be philosophically justified. It would be fair to say that philosophers have provided many different, at times even conflicting, answers to this question. Philosophers have sought to justify human rights by appeal to single ideals such as equality, autonomy, human dignity, fundamental human interests, the capacity for rational agency, and even democracy. For the purposes of clarity and relative simplicity I will focus upon the two, presently most prominent, philosophical attempts to justify human rights: interests theory and will theory. Before I do that, it is necessary to address a prior question.

a. Do human rights require philosophical justification?

Many people tend to take the validity of human rights for granted. Certainly, for many non-philosophers human rights may all too obviously appear to rest upon self-evidently true and universally valid moral principles. In this respect, human rights may be perceived as empirical facts about the contemporary world. Human rights do exist and many people do act in accordance with the correlative duties and obligations respecting human rights entails. No supporter of human rights could possibly complain about such perceptions. If nothing else, the prevalence of such views is pragmatically valuable for the cause of human rights. However, moral philosophers do not enjoy such licence for epistemological complacency. Moral philosophers remain concerned by the question of the philosophical foundations of human rights. There is a good reason why we should all be concerned with such a question. What might be termed the ‘philosophically naïve’ view of human rights effectively construes human rights as legal rights. The validity of human rights is closely tied to, and dependent upon, the legal codification of human rights. However, as was argued earlier, such an approach is not sufficient to justify human rights. Arguments in support of the validity of any moral doctrine can never be settled by simply pointing to the empirical existence of particular moral beliefs or concepts. Morality is fundamentally concerned with what ought to be the case, and this cannot be settled by appeals to what is the case, or is perceived to be the case. From such a basis, it would have been very difficult to argue that apartheid South Africa, to take an earlier example, was a morally unjust regime. One must not confuse the law with morality, per se. Nor consider the two to be simply co-extensional. Human rights originate as moral rights. Human rights claim validity everywhere and for everyone, irrespective of whether they have received comprehensive legal recognition, and even irrespective of whether everyone is agreement with the claims and principles of human rights. Thus, one cannot settle the question of the philosophical validity of human rights by appealing to purely empirical observations upon the world. As a moral doctrine, human rights have to be demonstrated to be valid as norms and not facts. In order to achieve this, one has to turn to moral philosophy. Presently, two particular approaches to the question of the validity of human rights predominate: what might be loosely termed the ‘interests theory approach’ and the ‘will theory approach’.

b. The interests theory approach

Advocates of the interests theory approach argue that the principal function of human rights is to protect and promote certain essential human interests. Securing human beings’ essential interests is the principal ground upon which human rights may be morally justified. The interests approach is thus primarily concerned to identify the social and biological prerequisites for human beings leading a minimally good life. The universality of human rights is grounded in what are considered to be some basic, indispensable, attributes for human well-being, which all of us are deemed necessarily to share. Take, for example, an interest each of us has in respect of our own personal security. This interest serves to ground our claim to the right. It may require the derivation of other rights as prerequisites to security, such as the satisfaction of basic nutritional needs and the need to be free from arbitrary detention or arrest, for example. The philosopher John Finnis provides a good representative of the interests theory approach. Finnis (1980) argues that human rights are justifiable on the grounds of their instrumental value for securing the necessary conditions of human well-being. He identifies seven fundamental interests, or what he terms ‘basic forms of human good’, as providing the basis for human rights. These are: life and its capacity for development; the acquisition of knowledge, as an end in itself; play, as the capacity for recreation; aesthetic expression; sociability and friendship; practical reasonableness, the capacity for intelligent and reasonable thought processes; and finally, religion, or the capacity for spiritual experience. According to Finnis, these are the essential prerequisites for human well-being and, as such, serve to justify our claims to the corresponding rights, whether they be of the claim right or liberty right variety.

Other philosophers who have defended human rights from an interests-based approach have addressed the question of how an appeal to interests can provide a justification for respecting and, when necessary, even positively acting to promote the interests of others. Such questions have a long heritage in western moral and political philosophy and extend at least as far back as the 17th. Century philosopher Thomas Hobbes. Typically, this approach attempts to provide what James Nickel (1987:84) has termed ‘prudential reasons’ in support of human rights. Taking as the starting point the claim that all human beings possess basic and fundamental interests, advocates of this approach argue that each individual owes a basic and general duty to respect the rights of every other individual. The basis for this duty is not mere benevolence or altruism, but individual self-interest. As Nickel writes, ‘a prudential argument from fundamental interests attempts to show that it would be reasonable to accept and comply with human rights, in circumstances where most others are likely to do so, because these norms are part of the best means for protecting one’s fundamental interests against actions and omissions that endanger them.’ (ibid). Protecting one’s own fundamental interests requires others’ willingness to recognize and respect these interests, which, in turn, requires reciprocal recognition and respect of the fundamental interests of others. The adequate protection of each individual’s fundamental interests necessitates the establishment of a co-operative system, the fundamental aim of which is not to promote the common good, but the protection and promotion of individuals’ self-interest.

For many philosophers the interests approach provides a philosophically powerful defence of the doctrine of human rights. It has the apparent advantage of appealing to human commonality, to those attributes we all share, and, in so doing, offers a relatively broad-based defence of the plethora of human rights considered by many to be fundamental and inalienable. The interests approach also provides for the possibility of resolving some of the potential disputes which can arise over the need to prioritise some human rights over others. One may do this, for example, by hierarchically ordering the corresponding interests identified as the specific object, or content, of each right.

However, the interests approach is subject to some significant criticisms. Foremost amongst these is the necessary appeal interests’ theorists make to some account of human nature. The interests-approach is clearly operating with, at the very least, an implicit account of human nature. Appeals to human nature have, of course, proven to be highly controversial and typically resist achieving the degree of consensus required for establishing the legitimacy of any moral doctrine founded upon an account of human nature. For example, combining the appeal to fundamental interests with the aspiration of securing the conditions for each individual leading a minimally good life would be complicated by social and cultural diversity. Clearly, as the economic philosopher Amartya Sen (1999) has argued, the minimal conditions for a decent life are socially and culturally relative. Providing the conditions for leading a minimally good life for the residents of Greenwich Village would be significantly different to securing the same conditions for the residents of a shanty town in Southern Africa or South America. While the interests themselves may be ultimately identical, adequately protecting these interests will have to go beyond the mere specification of some purportedly general prerequisites for satisfying individuals’ fundamental interests. Other criticisms of the interests approach have focused upon the appeal to self-interest as providing a coherent basis for fully respecting the rights of all human beings. This approach is based upon the assumption that individuals occupy a condition of relatively equal vulnerability to one another. However, this is simply not the case. The model cannot adequately defend the claim that a self-interested agent must respect the interests of, for example, much less powerful or geographically distant individuals, if she wishes to secure her own interests. On these terms, why should a purely self-interested and over-weight individual in, say, Los Angeles or London, care for the interests of a starving individual in some distant and impoverished continent? In this instance, the starving person is not in a position to affect their overweight counterpart’s fundamental interests. The appeal to pure self-interest ultimately cannot provide a basis for securing the universal moral community at the heart of the doctrine of human rights. It cannot justify the claims of universal human rights. An even more philosophically oriented vein of criticism focuses upon the interests’ based approach alleged neglect of constructive human agency as a fundamental component of morality generally. Put simply, the interests-based approach tends to construe our fundamental interests as pre-determinants of human moral agency. This can have the effect of subordinating the importance of the exercise of freedom as a principal moral ideal. One might seek to include freedom as a basic human interest, but freedom is not constitutive of our interests on this account. This particular concern lies at the heart of the so-called ‘will approach’ to human rights.

c. The Will Theory Approach

In contrast to the interests approach, the will theory attempts to establish the philosophical validity of human rights upon a single human attribute: the capacity for freedom. Will theorists argue that what is distinctive about human agency is the capacity for freedom and that this ought to constitute the core of any account of rights. Ultimately, then, will theorists view human rights as originating in, or reducible to, a single, constitutive right, or alternatively, a highly limited set of purportedly fundamental attributes. H.L.A. Hart, for example, inferentially argues that all rights are reducible to a single, fundamental right. He refers to this as ‘equal right of all men to be free.’ (1955:77). Hart insists that rights to such things as political participation or to an adequate diet, for example, are ultimately reducible to, and derivative of, individuals’ equal right to liberty. Henry Shue (1996) develops upon Hart’s inferential argument and argues that liberty alone is not ultimately sufficient for grounding all of the rights posited by Hart. Shue argues that many of these rights imply more than mere individual liberty and extend to include security from violence and the necessary material conditions for personal survival. Thus, he grounds rights upon liberty, security, and subsistence. The moral philosopher Alan Gewirth (1978, 1982) has further developed upon such themes. Gewirth argues that the justification of our claims to the possession of basic human rights is grounded in what he presents as the distinguishing characteristic of human beings generally: the capacity for rationally purposive agency. Gewirth states that the recognition of the validity of human rights is a logical corollary of recognizing oneself as a rationally purposive agent since the possession of rights are the necessary means for rationally purposive action. Gewirth grounds his argument in the claim that all human action is rationally purposive. Every human action is done for some reason, irrespective of whether it be a good or a bad reason. He argues that in rationally endorsing some end, say the desire to write a book, one must logically endorse the means to that end; as a bare minimum one’s own literacy. He then asks what is required to be a rationally purposive agent in the first place? He answers that freedom and well-being are the two necessary conditions for rationally purposive action. Freedom and well-being are the necessary means to acting in a rationally purposive fashion. They are essential prerequisites for being human, where to be human is to possess the capacity for rationally purposive action. As essential prerequisites, each individual is entitled to have access to them. However, Gewirth argues that each individual cannot simply will their own enjoyment of these prerequisites for rational agency without due concern for others. He bases the necessary concern for others’ human rights upon what he terms the ‘principle of generic consistency’ (PGC). Gewirth argues that each individual’s claim to the basic means for rationally purposive action is based upon an appeal to a general, rather than, specific attribute of all relevant agents. I cannot logically will my own claims to basic human rights without simultaneously accepting the equal claims of all rationally purposive agents to the same basic attributes. Gewirth has argued that there exists an absolute right to life possessed separately and equally by all of us. In so claiming, Gewirth echoes Dworkin’s concept of rights as trumps, but ultimately goes further than Dworkin is prepared to do by arguing that the right to life is absolute and cannot, therefore, be overridden under any circumstances. He states that a ‘right is absolute when it cannot be overridden in any circumstances, so that it can never be justifiably infringed and it must be fulfilled without any exceptions.’ (1982:92). Will theorists then attempt to establish the validity of human rights upon the ideal of personal autonomy: rights are a manifestation of the exercise of personal autonomy. In so doing, the validity of human rights is necessarily tied to the validity of personal autonomy. On the face of it, this would appear to be a very powerful, philosophical position. After all, as someone like Gewirth might argue, critics of this position would themselves necessarily be acting autonomously and they cannot do this without simultaneously requiring the existence of the very means for such action: even in criticizing human rights one is logically pre-supposing the existence of such rights.

Despite the apparent logical force of the will approach, it has been subjected to various forms of criticism. A particularly important form of criticism focuses upon the implications of will theory for so-called ‘marginal cases’; human beings who are temporarily or permanently incapable of acting in a rationally autonomous fashion. This would include individuals who have diagnosed from suffering from dementia, schizophrenia, clinical depression, and, also, individuals who remain in a comatose condition, from which they may never recover. If the constitutive condition for the possession of human rights is said to be the capacity for acting in a rationally purposive manner, for example, then it seems to logically follow, that individuals incapable of satisfying this criteria have no legitimate claim to human rights. Many would find this conclusion morally disturbing. However, a strict adherence to the will approach is entailed by it. Some human beings are temporarily or permanently lacking the criteria Gewirth, for instance, cites as the basis for our claims to human rights. It is difficult to see how they could be assimilated within the community of the bearers of human rights on the terms of Gewirth’s argument. Despite this, the general tendency is towards extending human rights considerations towards many of the so-called ‘marginal cases’. To do otherwise would appear to many to be intuitively wrong, if not ultimately defensible by appeal to practical reason. This may reveal the extent to which many peoples’ support of human rights includes an ineluctable element of sympathy, taking the form of a general emotional concern for others. Thus, strictly applying the will theorists’ criteria for membership of the community of human rights bearers would appear to result in the exclusion of some categories of human beings who are presently recognized as legitimate bearers of human rights.

The interests theory approach and the will theory approach contain strengths and weaknesses. When consistently and separately applied to the doctrine of human rights, each approach appears to yield conclusions that may limit or undermine the full force of those rights. It may be that philosophical supporters of human rights need to begin to consider the potential philosophical benefits attainable through combining various themes and elements found within these (and other) philosophical approaches to justifying human rights. Thus, further attempts at justifying the basis and content of human rights may benefit from pursuing a more thematically pluralist approach than has typically been the case to date.

5. Philosophical criticisms of human rights

The doctrine of human rights has been subjected to various forms of fundamental, philosophical criticism. These challenges to the philosophical validity of human rights as a moral doctrine differ from critical appraisals of the various philosophical theories supportive of the doctrine for the simple reason that they aim to demonstrate what they perceive to the philosophical fallacies upon which human rights are founded. Two such forms of critical analysis bear particular attention: one which challenges the universalist claims of human rights, and another which challenges the presumed objective character of human rights principles.

a. Moral relativism

Philosophical supporters of human rights are necessarily committed to a form of moral universalism. As moral principles and as a moral doctrine, human rights are considered to be universally valid. However, moral universalism has long been subject to criticism by so-called moral relativists. Moral relativists argue that universally valid moral truths do not exist. For moral relativists, there is simply no such thing as a universally valid moral doctrine. Relativists view morality as a social and historical phenomenon. Moral beliefs and principles are therefore thought of as socially and historically contingent, valid only for those cultures and societies in which they originate and within which they are widely approved. Relativists point to the vast array of diverse moral beliefs and practices apparent in the world today as empirical support for their position. Even within a single, contemporary society, such as the United States or Great Britain, one can find a wide diversity of fundamental moral beliefs, principles, and practices. Contemporary, complex societies are thus increasingly considered to be pluralist and multicultural in character. For many philosophers the multicultural character of such societies serves to fundamentally restrict the substance and scope of the regulative political principles governing those societies. In respect of human rights, relativists have tended to focus upon such issues as the presumed individualist character of the doctrine of human rights. It has been argued by numerous relativists that human rights are unduly biased towards morally individualist societies and cultures, at the necessary expense of the communal moral complexion of many Asian and African societies. At best, some human rights’ articles may be considered to be redundant within such societies, at worse they may appear to be positively harmful if fully implemented, replacing the fundamental values of one civilization with those of another and thereby perpetuating a form of cultural and moral imperialism.

The philosophical debate between universalists and relativists is far too complex to adequately summarise here. However, certain immediate responses to the relativist critique of human rights are immediately available. First, merely pointing to moral diversity and the presumed integrity of individual cultures and societies does not, by itself, provide a philosophical justification for relativism, nor a sufficient critique of universalism. After all, there have existed and continue to exist many cultures and societies whose treatment of their own people leaves much to be desired. Is the relativist genuinely asking us to recognize and respect the integrity of Nazi Germany, or any other similarly repressive regime? There can be little doubt that, as it stands, relativism is incompatible with human rights. On the face of it, this would appear to lend argumentative weight to the universalist support of human rights. After all, one may speculate as to the willingness of any relativist to actually forego their possession of human rights if and when the social surroundings demanded it. Similarly, relativist arguments are typically presented by members of the political elites within those countries whose systematic oppression of their peoples has attracted the attention of advocates of human rights. The exponential growth of grass-roots human rights organizations across many countries in the world whose cultures are alleged to be incompatible with the implementation of human rights, raises serious questions as to the validity and integrity of such ‘indigenous’ relativists. At its worst, the doctrine of moral relativism may be being deployed in an attempt to illegitimately justify oppressive political systems. The concern over the presumed incompatibility between human rights and communal moral systems appears to be a more valid issue. Human rights have undeniably conceived of the principal bearer of human rights as the individual person. This is due, in large part, to the Western origins of human rights. However, it would be equally fair to say that the so-called ‘third generation’ of human rights is far more attuned to the communal and collective basis of many individuals’ lives. In keeping with the work of political philosophers such as Will Kymlicka, there is increasing awareness of the need to tailor human rights principles to such things as the collective rights of minorities and, for example, these minorities’ claims to such things as communal land rights. While human rights remain philosophically grounded within an individualist moral doctrine, there can be no doubt that attempts are being made to adequately apply and human rights to more communally oriented societies. Human rights can no longer be accused of being ‘culture-blind’.

b. Epistemological criticisms of human rights

The second most important contemporary philosophical form of human rights’ criticism challenges the presumed objective basis of human rights as moral rights. This form of criticism may be thought of as a river into which run many philosophical tributaries. The essence of these attempts to refute human rights consists in the claim that moral principles and concepts are inherently subjective in character. On this view moral beliefs do not emanate from a correct determination of a rationally purposive will, or even gaining insight into the will of some divine being. Rather, moral beliefs are fundamentally expressions of individuals’ partial preferences. This position therefore rejects the principal ground upon which the concept of moral rights rests: that there exist rational and a priori moral principles upon which a correct and legitimate moral doctrine is to be founded. In modern, as opposed to ancient, philosophy this argument is most closely associated with the 18th. Century Scottish philosopher David Hume. More recently versions of it have been defended by the likes of C.L.Stevenson, Ludwig Wittgenstein, J.L.Mackie, and Richard Rorty. Indeed, Rorty (1993) has argued that human rights are based not upon the exercise of reason, but a sentimental vision of humanity. He insists that human rights are not rationally defensible. He argues that one cannot justify the basis of human rights by appeal to moral theory and the canons of reason since, he insists, moral beliefs and practices are not ultimately motivated by an appeal to reason or moral theory, but emanate from a sympathetic identification with others: morality originates in the heart, and not in the head. Interestingly, though unambiguously sceptical about the philosophical basis of human rights, Rorty views the existence of human rights as a ‘good and desirable thing’, something whose existence we all benefit from. His critique of human rights is this not motivated by an underlying hostility to the doctrine. For Rorty, human rights are better served by emotional appeals to identify with the unnecessary suffering of others, than by arguments over the correct determination of reason.

Rorty’s emphasis upon the importance of an emotional identification with others is a legitimate concern. It may, for example, provide additional support for the philosophical arguments presented by the likes of Gewirth. However, as Michael Freeman has recently pointed out, ‘Rorty’s argument…confuses motivation and justification. Sympathy is an emotion. Whether the action we take on the basis of our emotions is justified depends on the reasons for the action. Rorty wishes to eliminate unprovable metaphysical theories from philosophy, but in his critique of human-rights theory he goes too far, and eliminates reasoning.’ (2002:56) Rorty’s own account of the basis and scope of moral knowledge ultimately prohibits him from claiming that human rights is a morally desirable phenomenon, since he explicitly rules out the validity of appealing to the independently verifiable criteria required to uphold any such judgement. What we require from Rorty is an independent reason for accepting his conclusion. It is precisely this that he denies may be legitimately provided by moral philosophy.

Rorty aside, the general critique of moral objectivity has a long and very well-established heritage in modern moral philosophy. It would be false to claim that either the objectivists or the subjectivists have scored any ultimate ‘knock-down’ over their philosophical opponents. Human rights are founded upon the claim to moral objectivity, whether by appeal to interests or the will. Any critique of moral objectivism is bound, therefore, to have repercussions for the philosophical defence of human rights. As I noted above, philosophers such as Alan Gewirth and John Finnis, in their separate and different ways, have attempted to establish the rational and objective force of human rights. The reader interested in pursuing this particular theme further is therefore recommended to pursue a close philosophical analysis of either, or both, of these two philosophers.

6. Conclusion

Human rights have a long historical heritage. The principal philosophical foundation of human rights is a belief in the existence of a form of justice valid for all peoples, everywhere. In this form, the contemporary doctrine of human rights has come to occupy centre stage in geo-political affairs. The language of human rights is understood and utilized by many peoples in very diverse circumstances. Human rights have become indispensable to the contemporary understanding of how human beings should be treated, by one another and by national and international political bodies. Human rights are best thought of as potential moral guarantees for each human being to lead a minimally good life. The extent to which this aspiration has not been realized represents a gross failure by the contemporary world to institute a morally compelling order based upon human rights. The philosophical basis of human rights has been subjected to consistent criticism. While some aspects of the ensuing debate between philosophical supporters and opponents of human rights remain unresolved and, perhaps, irresolvable, the general case for human rights remains a morally powerful one. Arguably, the most compelling motivation for the existence of human may rest upon the exercise of imagination. Try imagining a world without human rights!

7. References and Further Reading

  • Dworkin, Ronald. Taking Rights Seriously, (London: Duckworth, 1978)
  • Freeman, Michael. Human Rights: An Interdisciplinary Approach, (Cambridge: Polity, 2002)
  • Finnis, John. Natural Law and Natural Rights, (Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Reason and Morality, (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1978)
  • Gewirth, Alan. Human Rights: Essays on Justification and Applications, (Chicago; University of Chicago Press, 1982)
  • Jones, Peter. Rights, (Basingstoke; Macmillan, 1994)
  • Mackie, J.L. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, (Harmondsworth; Penguin, 1977)
  • Nickel, James. Making Sense of Human Rights: Philosophical Reflections on the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, (Berkeley; University of California Press, 1987)
  • Rorty, Richard. “Human rights, rationality, and sentimentality”. In S.Shute & S. Hurley (eds.) On Human Rights: the Oxford Amnesty Lectures 1993, (New York; Basic Books, 1993)
  • Waldron, Jeremy. Theories of Rights, (Oxford; Oxford University Press, 1984) Chapters by Ronald Dworkin, Alan Gewirth, and H.L.A.Hart

Author Information

Andrew Fagan
Email: fagaaw@essex.ac.uk
University of Essex
United Kingdom