The time when the term “Humanism” was first adopted is unknown. It is, however, certain that both Italy and the re-adopting of Latin letters as the staple of human culture were responsible for the name “Humanists.” Literoe humaniores was an expression coined in reference to the classic literature of Rome and the imitation and reproduction of its literary forms in the “new learning”; this was in contrast to and against the Literoe sacroe of scholasticism. In the time of Ariosto, Erasmus, and Luther, the term umanisa was in effect an equivalent to the terms “classicist ” or ” classical scholar.”
Dante had an admiration for ancient letters. At first, he intended to compose his great epic in Latin verse. Petrarch considered his Africa a fair effort to reproduce Vergil. In the exordium of his chief work Petrarc h appeals to the Heliconian Sisters as well as to Jesus Christ, Savior of the world. He also reviews the epics of Homer (although he never learned Greek), Statius, and Lucan. He was overwhelmed with the friendships of many prestigous men of his day, a mong whom Cardinal Stephen Colonna was prominent. Petrarch is the pathfinder as well as the measure of the new movement. He idealized the classical world. His classicist consciousness and his Christian consciousness are revealed in his writings. Th e experiences of life constantly evoke in him classic parallels, reminiscences, associations. Julius Caesar, Papirius Cursor, are nostri, “our people”; Pyrrhus, Hannibal, Massinissa are externi, “foreigners.” His epistles provide the b est revelation of his soul. Of course, the craving for pure Latinity and the elevation of such practical power of imitation and reproduction involved an artificiality of which neither Petrarch nor his successors were aware. Boccaccio was not only a hu manist, but he, with appalling directness, revealed the emancipation of the flesh as one of the unmistakable trends of the new movement. Both he and Poggio, Valla, Beccadelli, Enea Silvio dei Piccolomini (in his youth) show that the hatred of the cle rical class instigated literary composition. At the same time in the caricatures of foulness which these leaders of the new learning loved to draw, there is no moral indignation, but clearly like satyrs they themselves relish these things. For this reason the Humanists of Italy, as such, were not at all concerned in the efforts for a reformation of the church as attempted in the councils of Constance or of Basel. Poggio, apostolic secretary, came to Constance with the pope, but spent most of his time in ransacking the libraries of Swiss monasteries for Latin codices. The defense of Jerome of Prague before the Council reminded him of Cato of Utica. His correspondent Lionardo Bruni at Florence warns him to be more circumspect in his praise of a heretic. In the Curia itself a semipagan spirit was bred by the Humanists. In 1447 Parentucelli, an enthusiast for codices, became pope as Nicholas V. On Easter, the eminent humanist Filelfo wrote to him from Milan to congratul ate him on his elevation. Filelfo expressed a general satisfaction of scholars, citing also the humanitas of Christ himself, as well as writing somewhat hypocritically of fucata gentilium . . . sapientia. Some time later, in 1453, Filelfo personally appeared at the papal court. Nicholas kept the vile “Satyrae” of the humanist until he had perused them, and gave Filelfo a purse of 500 ducats when he departed. Enea Silvio de’ Piccolomini ascended the papal throne in 1458 as Pius II., another humanist pope.
A very clear view of the Humanistic movement may be gained from the writings of the biographer and beneficiary of Leo X., Paul Giovio (Jovius). In his Elogia (Antwerp,1557) he presents a gallery of literary scholar s, beginning with Dante, and including Petrarch, Boccaccio, Bruni, Poggo, Beceadelli (the pornographic poet), Valla, Filelfo, Platina, the Greeks Emanuel Chrysoloras, Cardinal Bessarion, Trapezuntius the Cretan, Theodorus Gaza, Argyropulos, Chalcondyla s, Musurus of Crete, and Lasearis. Also, he gives us Lorenzo de’Medici, Ermolao Barbaro, Politian, Pico di Mirandola, and even Savonarola. But Savonarola’s attacks on Pope Alexander VI., father of Cesare and Lucrezia, are treated as treason and felon y. The Platonic academy of Ficinus at Florence had certainly no power to regenerate the political and moral corruption of its patron Lorenzo. Bibienna, the favorite of Leo X., was witty at banquets; at Leo’s court this cardinal produced his lascivio us comedy, “Colandra,” because Terence was too grave. Even Thomas More and Reuchlin are included. Among the latter’s academic friends were the anonymous composers of the satiric Epistoloe obscurorum virorum-the flail of the new learning swung ag ainst the old. The Italian Humanists were not concerned in the reformatory movements of the fifteenth century. They drifted into a palpable paganism or semipaganism, curiously illustrated in the verse, e.g., of Politian, especially his Greek verse, a nd of him even the lax Giovio writes: “he was a man of unseemly morals. “They all more or less emphasized “vera virtus” by which they meant “true excellence,” the self-wrought development of human faculties and powers. Still they knew how to ma intain friendly relations with those higher clerics who had resources with which to patronize the new learning. They often accepted clerical preferment, as did Gievio, who became bishop of Nocera. Often the Latin verse of their youth proved very awkw ard when they entered upon their benefices. All were more interested “in viewing the early monuments of sensual enjoyment” than in study of the New Testament. As they greatly exceeded the corruption of the clergy in their own conduct, they could not take any practical interest in any spiritual or theological reformation. In all the correspondence of Filelfo, extending from 1428 to 1462, there is but once or twice a slight (deistic) utterance of spiritual concern, when, in the siege of Milan by Francesco Sforza, 1449, the ducal city endured terrible sufferings. Jacob Burckhardt says of the Humanists that they were demoralized by their reproduction of Latin verse. But why did they delve in Ovid, Catullus, and the like with steady predilection? At best a mild deism or pantheism may be perceived in their more serious writings. Greek, on the whole, was a rare attainment among them, reproductive ostentation limited most of them to Latin.
Erasmus of Rotterdam in his person and career marks the point where the “new learning” had arrived at the parting of the ways. He felt an affinity for Lucian; his Encomium Morioe, a vitriolic satire, dealt not gently with clerical corruption. He edited the New Testament and dedicated it to Leo X. He had no desire to abandon the old Church, considering the bounties and pensions which he received were all derived from princes or clerics who adhered to the papacy. He pretended that he could not read the German writings of Luther. Erasmus wrote that “Luther’s movement was not connected with learning,” and, at the same time he wrote to Pope Hadrian VI.: “I could find a hundred passages where St. Paul seems to teach the doctrines which they condemn in Luther. “Other utterances show his unwillingness to serve the Reformation or to be held responsible for any part of it: I have written nothing which can be laid hold of against the established orders. . . . I would rather see things left as they are than to see a revolution which may lead to one knows not what. Others may be martyrs, if they like. I aspire to no such honor. . . . I care nothing what is done to Luther, but I care for peace. . . . If you must take a side, take the side which is most in favor.” His keen sense of actual dependencies in the movement of things led him to see situations and realities with wonderful clearness; but his genius, like that of many scholars, was essentially negative. When he was fifty-one, not long before 1517, he wrote to Fabricius at Basel: “My chief fear is that with the revival of Greek literature there may be a revival of paganism. There are Christians who are Christians but in name, and are Gentiles at heart.” In the fall of 1525, when central Germany had been affected by the Peasants’ War, he wrote: “You remember Reuchlin. The conflict was raging between the Muses and their enemies, when up sprang Luther, and the object thenceforward was to entangle the friends of literature in the Lutheran business, so as to destroy both them and him together.”
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Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: