David Hume (1711-1776) is one of the British Empiricists of the Early Modern period, along with John Locke and George Berkeley. Although the three advocate similar empirical standards for knowledge, that is, that there are no innate ideas and that all knowledge comes from experience, Hume is known for applying this standard rigorously to causation and necessity. Instead of taking the notion of causation for granted, Hume challenges us to consider what experience allows us to know about cause and effect.
Hume shows that experience does not tell us much. Of two events, A and B, we say that A causes B when the two always occur together, that is, are constantly conjoined. Whenever we find A, we also find B, and we have a certainty that this conjunction will continue to happen. Once we realize that “A must bring about B” is tantamount merely to “Due to their constant conjunction, we are psychologically certain that B will follow A”, then we are left with a very weak notion of necessity. This tenuous grasp on causal efficacy helps give rise to the Problem of Induction–that we are not reasonably justified in making any inductive inference about the world. Among Hume scholars it is a matter of debate how seriously Hume means us to take this conclusion and whether causation consists wholly in constant conjunction.
This article examines the empirical foundations that lead Hume to his account of causation before detailing his definitions of causation and how he uses these key insights to generate the Problem of Induction. After explicating these two main components of Hume’s notion of causation, three families of interpretation will be explored: the causal reductionist, who takes Hume’s definitions of causation as definitive; the causal skeptic, who takes Hume’s problem of induction as unsolved; and the causal realist, who introduces additional interpretive tools to avoid these conclusions and maintains that Hume has some robust notion of causation.
Hume’s most important contributions to the philosophy of causation are found in A Treatise of Human Nature, and An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, the latter generally viewed as a partial recasting of the former. Both works start with Hume’s central empirical axiom known as the Copy Principle. Loosely, it states that all constituents of our thoughts come from experience. By learning Hume’s vocabulary, this can be restated more precisely. Hume calls the contents of the mind perceptions, which he divides into impressions and ideas. Though Hume himself is not strict about maintaining a concise distinction between the two, we may think of impressions as having their genesis in the senses, whereas ideas are products of the intellect. Impressions, which are either of sensation or reflection (memory), are more vivid than ideas. Hume’s Copy Principle therefore states that all our ideas are products of impressions.
At first glance, the Copy Principle may seem too rigid. To use Hume’s example, we can have an idea of a golden mountain without ever having seen one. But to proffer such examples as counter to the Copy Principle is to ignore the activities of the mind. The mind may combine ideas by relating them in certain ways. If we have the idea of gold and the idea of a mountain, we can combine them to arrive at the idea of a golden mountain. The Copy Principle only demands that, at bottom, the simplest constituent ideas that we relate come from impressions. This means that any complex idea can eventually be traced back to genesis constituent impressions.
In the Treatise, Hume identifies two ways that the mind associates ideas, via natural relations and via philosophical relations. Natural relations have a connecting principle such that the imagination naturally leads us from one idea to another. The three natural relations are resemblance, contiguity, and cause and effect. Of these, Hume tells us that causation is the most prevalent. But cause and effect is also one of the philosophical relations, where the relata have no connecting principle, instead being artificially juxtaposed by the mind. Of the philosophical relations, some, such as resemblance and contrariety, can give us certitude. Some cannot. Cause and effect is one of the three philosophical relations that afford us less than certain knowledge, the other two being identity and situation. But of these, causation is crucial. It alone allows us to go beyond what is immediately present to the senses and, along with perception and memory, is responsible for all our knowledge of the world. Hume therefore recognizes cause and effect as both a philosophical relation and a natural relation, at least in the Treatise, the only work where he draws this distinction.
The relation of cause and effect is pivotal in reasoning, which Hume defines as the discovery of relations between objects of comparison. But note that when Hume says “objects”, at least in the context of reasoning, he is referring to the objects of the mind, that is, ideas and impressions, since Hume adheres to the Early Modern “way of ideas”, the belief that sensation is a mental event and therefore all objects of perception are mental. But causation itself must be a relation rather than a quality of an object, as there is no one property common to all causes or to all effects. By so placing causation within Hume’s system, we arrive at a first approximation of cause and effect. Causation is a relation between objects that we employ in our reasoning in order to yield less than demonstrative knowledge of the world beyond our immediate impressions. However, this is only the beginning of Hume’s insight.
In both the Treatise and the Enquiry, we find Hume’s Fork, his bifurcation of all possible objects of knowledge into relations of ideas and matters of fact. Hume gives several differentiae distinguishing the two, but the principal distinction is that the denial of a true relation of ideas implies a contradiction. Relations of ideas can also be known independently of experience. Matters of fact, however, can be denied coherently, and they cannot be known independently of experience. Although Immanuel Kant later seems to miss this point, arguing for a middle ground that he thinks Hume missed, the two categories must be exclusive and exhaustive. A true statement must be one or the other, but not both, since its negation must either imply a contradiction or not. There is no middle ground. Yet given these definitions, it seems clear that reasoning concerning causation always invokes matters of fact. For Hume, the denial of a statement whose truth condition is grounded in causality is not inconceivable (and hence, not impossible; Hume holds that conceivability implies possibility). For instance, a horror movie may show the conceivability of decapitation not causing the cessation of animation in a human body. But if the denial of a causal statement is still conceivable, then its truth must be a matter of fact, and must therefore be in some way dependent upon experience. Though for Hume, this is true by definition for all matters of fact, he also appeals to our own experience to convey the point. Hume challenges us to consider any one event and meditate on it; for instance, a billiard ball striking another. He holds that no matter how clever we are, the only way we can infer if and how the second billiard ball will move is via past experience. There is nothing in the cause that will ever imply the effect in an experiential vacuum. And here it is important to remember that, in addition to cause and effect, the mind naturally associates ideas via resemblance and contiguity. Hume does not hold that, having never seen a game of billiards before, we cannot know what the effect of the collision will be. Rather, we can use resemblance, for instance, to infer an analogous case from our past experiences of transferred momentum, deflection, and so forth. We are still relying on previous impressions to predict the effect and therefore do not violate the Copy Principle. We simply use resemblance to form an analogous prediction. And we can charitably make such resemblances as broad as we want. Thus, objections like: Under a Humean account, the toddler who burned his hand would not fear the flame after only one such occurrence because he has not experienced a constant conjunction, are unfair to Hume, as the toddler would have had thousands of experiences of the principle that like causes like, and could thus employ resemblance to reach the conclusion to fear the flame.
If Hume is right that our awareness of causation (or power, force, efficacy, necessity, and so forth – he holds all such terms to be equivalent) is a product of experience, we must ask what this awareness consists in. What is meant when some event is judged as cause and effect? Strictly speaking, for Hume, our only external impression of causation is a mere constant conjunction of phenomena, that B always follows A, and Hume sometimes seems to imply that this is all that causation amounts to. (And this notion of causation as constant conjunction is required for Hume to generate the Problem of induction discussed below.) Nevertheless, ‘causation’ carries a stronger connotation than this, for constant conjunction can be accidental and therefore doesn’t get us the necessary connection that gives the relation of cause and effect its predictive ability. We may therefore now say that, on Hume’s account, to invoke causality is to invoke a constant conjunction of relata whose conjunction carries with it a necessary connection.
Hume points out that this second component of causation is far from clear. What is this necessity that is implied by causation? Clearly it is not a logical modality, as there are possible worlds in which the standard laws of causation do not obtain. It might be tempting to state that the necessity involved in causation is therefore a physical or metaphysical necessity. However, Hume considers such elucidations unhelpful, as they tell us nothing about the original impressions involved. At best, they merely amount to the assertion that causation follows causal laws. But invoking this common type of necessity is trivial or circular when it is this very efficacy that Hume is attempting to discover.
We must therefore follow a different route in considering what our impression of necessity amounts to. As causation, at base, involves only matters of fact, Hume once again challenges us to consider what we can know of the constituent impressions of causation. Once more, all we can come up with is an experienced constant conjunction. Of the common understanding of causality, Hume points out that we never have an impression of efficacy. Because of this, our notion of causal law seems to be a mere presentiment that the constant conjunction will continue to be constant, some certainty that this mysterious union will persist. Hume argues that we cannot conceive of any other connection between cause and effect, because there simply is no other impression to which our idea may be traced. This certitude is all that remains.
For Hume, the necessary connection invoked by causation is nothing more than this certainty. Hume’s Copy Principle demands that an idea must have come from an impression, but we have no impression of efficacy in the event itself. Instead, the impression of efficacy is one produced in the mind. As we experience enough cases of a particular constant conjunction, our minds begin to pass a natural determination from cause to effect, adding a little more “oomph” to the prediction of the effect every time, a growing certitude that the effect will follow again. It is the internal impression of this “oomph” that gives rise to our idea of necessity, the mere feeling of certainty that the conjunction will stay constant. Ergo, the idea of necessity that supplements constant conjunction is a psychological projection. We cannot help but think that the event will unfurl in this way.
Having approached Hume’s account of causality by this route, we are now in a position to see the where Hume’s two definitions of causation given in the Treatise come from. (He gives similar but not identical definitions in the Enquiry.) He defines “cause” in the following two ways:
(D1) An object precedent and contiguous to another, and where all the objects resembling the former are placed in like relations of precedency and contiguity to those objects that resemble the latter.
(D2) An object precedent and contiguous to another, and so united with it, that the idea of the one determined the mind to form the idea of the other, and the impression of the one to form a more lively idea of the other. (T 22.214.171.124; SBN 170)
There are reams of literature addressing whether these two definitions are the same and, if not, to which of them Hume gives primacy. J.A. Robinson is perhaps the staunchest proponent of the position that the two are nonequivalent, arguing that there is an nonequivalence in meaning and that they fail to capture the same extension. Two objects can be constantly conjoined without our mind determining that one causes the other, and it seems possible that we can be determined that one object causes another without their being constantly conjoined. But if the definitions fail in this way, then it is problematic that Hume maintains that both are adequate definitions of causation. Some scholars have argued for ways of squaring the two definitions (Don Garrett, for instance, argues that the two are equivalent if they are both read objectively or both read subjectively), while others have given reason to think that seeking to fit or eliminate definitions may be a misguided project.
One alternative to fitting the definitions lies in the possibility that they are doing two separate things, and it might therefore be inappropriate to reduce one to the other or claim that one is more significant than the other. There are several interpretations that allow us to meaningfully maintain the distinction (and therefore the nonequivalence) between the two definitions unproblematically. For instance, D1 can be seen as tracing the external impressions (that is, the constant conjunction) requisite for our idea of causation while D2 traces the internal impressions, both of which are important to Hume in providing a complete account. As Hume says, the definitions are “presenting a different view of the same object.” (T 126.96.36.199; SBN 170) Supporting this, Harold Noonan holds that D1 is “what is going on in the world” and that D2 is “what goes on in the mind of the observer” and therefore, “the problem of nonequivalent definitions poses no real problem for understanding Hume.” (Noonan 1999: 150-151) Simon Blackburn provides a similar interpretation that the definitions are doing two different things, externally and internally. However, Blackburn has the first as giving the “contribution of the world” and the latter giving the “functional difference in the mind that apprehends the regularity.” (Blackburn 2007: 107) However, this is not the only way to grant an nonequivalence without establishing the primacy of one over the other.
Another method is to cash out the two definitions in terms of the types of relation. Some scholars have emphasized that, according to Hume’s claim in the Treatise, D1 is defining the philosophical relation of cause and effect while D2 defines the natural relation. Walter Ott argues that, if this is right, then the lack of equivalence is not a problem, as philosophical and natural relations would not be expected to capture the same extension. (Ott 2009: 239) This way of dismissing the nonequivalence of the two definitions becomes more problematic, however, when we realize that Hume does not make the distinction between natural and philosophical relations in the Enquiry, yet provides approximately the same two definitions. If the definitions were meant to separately track the philosophical and natural relations, we might expect Hume to have explained that distinction in the Enquiry rather than dropping it while still maintaining two definitions. Perhaps for this reason, Jonathan Bennett suggests that it is best to forget Hume’s comment of this correspondence. (Bennett 1971: 398)
Though this treatment of literature considering the definitions as meaningfully nonequivalent has been brief, it does serve to show that the definitions need not be forced together. In fact, later in the Treatise, Hume states that necessity is defined by both, either as the constant conjunction or as the mental inference, that they are two different senses of necessity, and Hume, at various points, identifies both as the essence of connection or power. Whether or not Robinson is right in thinking Hume is mistaken in holding this position, Hume himself does not seem to believe one definition is superior to the other, or that they are nonequivalent.
Beyond Hume’s own usage, there is a second worry lingering. Attempting to establish primacy between the definitions implies that they are somehow the bottom line for Hume on causation. But Hume is at pains to point out that the definitions are inadequate. In discussing the “narrow limits of human reason and capacity,” Hume asks,
And what stronger instance can be produced of the surprizing ignorance and weakness of the understanding than [the analysis of causation]?…so imperfect are the ideas we form concerning it, that it is impossible to give any just definition of cause, except what is drawn from something extraneous and foreign to it….But though both these definitions be drawn from circumstances foreign to cause, we cannot remedy this inconvenience, or attain any more perfect definition…. (EHU 7.29; SBN 77, emphasis his)
The tone this passage conveys is one of resigned dissatisfaction. Although Hume does the best that can be expected on the subject, he is dissatisfied, but this dissatisfaction is inevitable. This is because, as Hume maintains in Part VII of the Enquiry, a definiens is nothing but an enumeration of the constituent simple ideas in the definiendum. However, Hume has just given us reason to think that we have no such satisfactory constituent ideas, hence the “inconvenience” requiring us to appeal to the “extraneous.” This is not to say that the definitions are incorrect. Note that he still applies the appellation “just” to them despite their appeal to the extraneous, and in the Treatise, he calls them “precise.” Rather, they are unsatisfying. It is an inconvenience that they appeal to something foreign, something we should like to remedy. Unfortunately, such a remedy is impossible, so the definitions, while as precise as they can be, still leave us wanting something further. But if this is right, then Hume should be able to endorse both D1 and D2 as vital components of causation without implying that he endorses either (or both) as necessary and sufficient for causation. For these reasons, Hume’s discussion leading up to the two definitions should be taken as primary in his account of causation rather than the definitions themselves.
The second of Hume’s influential causal arguments is known as the problem of induction, a skeptical argument that utilizes Hume’s insights about experience limiting our causal knowledge to constant conjunction. Though Hume gives a quick version of the Problem in the middle of his discussion of causation in the Treatise (T 1.3.6), it is laid out most clearly in Section IV of the Enquiry. An influential argument, the Problem’s skeptical conclusions have had a drastic impact on the field of epistemology. It should be noted, however, that not everyone agrees about what exactly the Problem consists in. Briefly, the typified version of the Problem as arguing for inductive skepticism can be described as follows:
Recall that proper reasoning involves only relations of ideas and matters of fact. Again, the key differentia distinguishing the two categories of knowledge is that asserting the negation of a true relation of ideas is to assert a contradiction, but this is not the case with genuine matters of fact. But in Section IV, Hume only pursues the justification for matters of fact, of which there are two categories:
(A) Reports of direct experience, both past and present
(B) Claims about states of affairs not directly observed
Matters of fact of category (A) would include sensory experience and memory, against which Hume never raises doubts, contra René Descartes. For Hume, (B) would include both predictions and the laws of nature upon which predictions rest. We cannot claim direct experience of predictions or of general laws, but knowledge of them must still be classified as matters of fact, since both they and their negations remain conceivable. In considering the foundations for predictions, however, we must remember that, for Hume, only the relation of cause and effect gives us predictive power, as it alone allows us to go beyond memory and the senses. All such predictions must therefore involve causality and must therefore be of category (B). But what justifies them?
It seems to be the laws governing cause and effect that provide support for predictions, as human reason tries to reduce particular natural phenomena “…to a greater simplicity, and to resolve the many particular effects into a few general causes….” (EHU 4.12; SBN 30) But this simply sets back the question, for we must now wonder what justifies these “general causes.” One possible answer is that they are justified a priori as relations of ideas. Hume rejects this solution for two reasons: First, as shown above, we cannot meditate purely on the idea of a cause and deduce the corresponding effect and, more importantly, to assert the negation of any causal law is not to assert a contradiction.
Here we should pause to note that the generation of the Problem of Induction seems to essentially involve Hume’s insights about necessary connection (and hence our treating it first). Since the Problem of Induction demands that causal connections cannot be known a priori, and that our access is only to constant conjunction, the Problem seems to require the most crucial components of his account of necessity. It is therefore an oddity that, in the Enquiry, Hume waits until Section VII to explicate an account of necessity already utilized in the Problem of Section IV. In the Treatise, however, a version of the Problem appears after Hume’s insights about experience limiting causation to constant conjunction but before the explication of the projectivist necessity and his presenting of the two definitions. It is therefore not entirely clear how Hume views the relationship between his account of necessity and the Problem. Stathis Psillos, for instance, views Hume’s inductive skepticism as a corollary to his account of necessary connection. (Psillos 2002: 31) However, Peter Millican rightly points out that the Problem can still be construed so as to challenge most non-reductive causal theories as well. (Millican 2002: 141) Kenneth Clatterbaugh goes further, arguing that Hume’s reductive account of causation and the skepticism the Problem raises can be parsed out so they are entirely separable. (Clatterbaugh 1999: 186) D.M. Armstrong disagrees, arguing that “…if laws of nature are nothing but Humean uniformities, then inductive scepticism is inevitable.” (Armstrong 1999: 52)
Whether the Problem of induction is in fact separable from Hume’s account of necessary connection, he himself connects the two by arguing that “…the knowledge of this relation is not, in any instance, attained by reasonings a priori; but arises entirely from experience, when we find that any particular objects are constantly conjoined with each other.” (EHU 4.6; SBN 27) Here, Hume invokes the account of causation explicated above to show that the necessity supporting (B) is grounded in our observation of constant conjunction. This is to say that (B) is grounded in (A). But again, (A) by itself gives us no predictive power. We have thus merely pushed the question back one more step and must now ask with Hume, “What is the foundation of all conclusions from experience?” (EHU 4.14; SBN 32, emphasis his)
The answer to this question seems to be inductive reasoning. We use direct observation to draw conclusions about unobserved states of affairs. But this is just to once more assert that (B) is grounded in (A). The more interesting question therefore becomes how we do this. What lets us reason from (A) to (B)? The only apparent answer is the assumption of some version of the Principle of the Uniformity of Nature (PUN), the doctrine that nature is always uniform, so unobserved instances of phenomena will resemble the observed. This is called an assumption since we have not, as yet, established that we are justified in holding such a principle. Once more, it cannot be known a priori, as we assert no contradiction by maintaining its falsity. A sporadic, random universe is perfectly conceivable. Therefore, knowledge of the PUN must be a matter of fact. But the principle is predictive and not directly observed. This means that the PUN is an instance of (B), but we were invoking the PUN as the grounds for moving from beliefs of type (A) to beliefs of type (B), thus creating a vicious circle when attempting to justify type (B) matters of fact. We use knowledge of (B) as a justification for our knowledge of (B). The bottom line for Hume’s Problem of induction seems to be that there is no clear way to rationally justify any causal reasoning (and therefore no inductive inference) whatsoever. We have no ground that allows us to move from (A) to (B), to move beyond sensation and memory, so any matter of fact knowledge beyond these becomes suspect.
Louis Loeb calls this reconstruction of Hume targeting the justification of causal inference-based reasoning the “traditional interpretation” (Loeb 2008: 108), and Hume’s conclusion that causal inferences have “no just foundation” (T 188.8.131.52; SBN 91) lends support to this interpretation. Under this reconstruction, the epistemic circularity revealed by Hume’s Problem of Induction seems detrimental to knowledge. However, there are philosophers (Max Black, R. B. Braithwaite, Charles Peirce [suggest notably Charles Pierce if author intends emphasis], and Brian Skyrms, for instance) that, while agreeing that Hume targets the justification of inductive inference, insist that this particular justificatory circle is not vicious or that it is unproblematic for various reasons. As discussed below, Hume may be one such philosopher. Alternatively, there are those that think that Hume claims too much in insisting that inductive arguments fail to lend probability to their conclusions. D. C. Stove maintains that, while Hume argues that inductive inference never adds probability to its conclusion, Hume’s premises actually only support “inductive fallibilism”, a much weaker position that induction can never attain certainty (that is, that the inferences are never valid). Hume illicitly adds that no invalid argument can still be reasonable. (Stove 1973: 48)
But not all are in agreement that Hume’s intended target is the justification of causal or inductive inference. Tom Beauchamp and Alexander Rosenberg agree that Hume’s argument implies inductive fallibilism, but hold that this position is adopted intentionally as a critique of the deductivist rationalism of Hume’s time. (Beauchamp and Rosenberg 1981: 44) Annette Baier defends a similar account, focusing on Hume’s use of “reason” in the argument, which she insists should be used only in the narrow sense of Hume’s “demonstrative sciences”. (Baier 1991: 60) More recently, Don Garret has argued that Hume’s negative conclusion is one of cognitive psychology, that we do not adopt induction based on doxastically sufficient argumentation. Induction is simply not supported by argument, good or bad. Instead, it is an instinctive mechanism that we share with animals. (Garrett 1997: 92, 94) Similarly, David Owen holds that Hume’s Problem of induction is not an argument against the reasonableness of inductive inference, but, “Rather Hume is arguing that reason cannot explain how we come to have beliefs in the unobserved on the basis of past experience.” (Owen 1999: 6) We see that there are a variety of interpretations of Hume’s Problem of induction and, as we will see below, how we interpret the Problem will inform how we interpret his ultimate causal position.
Having described these two important components of his account of causation, let us consider how Hume’s position on causation is variously interpreted, starting with causal reductionism. The family of reductionist theories, often read out of Hume’s account of necessity outlined above, maintain that causation, power, necessity, and so forth, as something that exists between external objects rather than in the observer, is constituted entirely by regular succession. In the external world, causation simply is the regularity of constant conjunction. In fact, the defender of this brand of regularity theory of causation is generally labeled a “Humean” about causation. However, since this interpretation, as Hume’s own historical position, remains in contention, the appellation will be avoided here.
Because of the variant opinions of how we should view the relationship between the two definitions proffered by Hume, we find two divergent types of reduction of Humean causation. First, there are reductionists that insist Hume reduces causation to nothing beyond constant conjunction, that is, the reduction is to a simple naïve regularity theory of causation, and therefore the mental projection of D2 plays no part. The motivation for this interpretation seems to be an emphasis on Hume’s D1, either by saying that it is the only definition that Hume genuinely endorses, or that D2 somehow collapses into D1 or that D2 does not represent a genuine ontological reduction, and is therefore not relevant to the metaphysics of causation. Robinson, for instance, claims that D2 is explanatory in nature, and is merely part of an empiricist psychological theory. (Robinson 1962)
This focus on D1 is regarded as deeply problematic by some Hume scholars (Francis Dauer, H.O. Mounce, and Fred Wilson, for instance), because it seems to be an incomplete account of Hume’s discussion of necessary connection presented above. A reductive emphasis on D1 as definitive ignores not only D2 as a definition but also ignores all of the argument leading up to it. This is to disregard the discussion through which Hume accounts for the necessity of causation, a component which he describes as “of much greater importance” than the contiguity and succession of D1. (T 184.108.40.206; SBN 77) In short, a reduction to D1 ignores the mental determination component. However, this practice may not be as uncharitable as it appears, as many scholars see the first definition as the only component of his account relevant to metaphysics. For instance, D.M. Armstrong, after describing both components, simply announces his intention to set aside the mental component as irrelevant to the metaphysics of causation. (Armstrong 1983: 4) J. L. Mackie similarly stresses that, “It is about causation so far as we know about it in objects that Hume has the firmest and most fully argued views,” (Mackie 1980: 21) and it is for this reason that he focuses on D1.
However, not everyone agrees that D2 can or should be dropped so easily from Hume’s system. In addition to its accounting for the necessity of causation mentioned above, recall that Hume makes frequent reference to both definitions as accurate or just, and at one point even refers to D2 as constituting the essence of causation. Therefore, whether or not the projectivism of D2 actually is relevant to the metaphysics of causation, a strong case can be made that Hume thinks it is so, and therefore an accurate historical interpretation needs to include D2 in order to capture Hume’s intentions. (Below, the assumption that Hume is even doing metaphysics will also be challenged.) The more common Humean reduction, then, adds a projectivist twist by somehow reducing causation to constant conjunction plus the internal impression of necessity. (See, for instance, Beauchamp and Rosenberg 1981: 11, Goodman 1983: 60, Mounce 1999: 42, Noonan 1999: 140-145, Ott 2009: 224 or Wilson 1997: 16) Of course while this second type of reductionist agrees that the projectivist component should be included, there is less agreement as to how, precisely, it is supposed to fit into Hume’s overall causal picture. Largely for this reason, we have a host of reductionist interpretations rather than a single version. The unifying thread of the reductionist interpretations is that causation, as it exists in the object, is constituted by regularity.
But given the Humean account of causation outlined above, it is not difficult to see how Hume’s writings give rise to such reductionist positions. After all, both D1 and D2 seem reductive in nature. If, as is often the case, we take definitions to represent the necessary and sufficient conditions of the definiendum, then both the definitions are reductive notions of causation. D1 reduces causation to proximity, continuity, and constant conjunction, and D2 similarly reduces causation to proximity, continuity, and the internal mental determination that moves the first object or idea to the second. Even considering Hume’s alternate account of definitions, where a definition is an enumeration of the constituent ideas of the definiendum, this does not change the two definitions’ reductive nature. Given that Hume’s discussions of causation culminate in these two definitions, combined with the fact that the conception of causation they provide is used in Hume’s later philosophical arguments of the Treatise, the definitions play a crucial role in understanding his account of causation. Therefore, the various forms of causal reductionism can constitute reasonable interpretations of Hume. By putting the two definitions at center state, Hume can plausibly be read as emphasizing that our only notion of causation is constant conjunction with certitude that it will continue. Nevertheless, reductionism is not the only way to interpret Hume’s theory of causation.
One way to interpret the reasoning behind assigning Hume the position of causal skepticism is by assigning similar import to the passages emphasized by the reductionists, but interpreting the claims epistemically rather than ontologically. In other words, rather than interpreting Hume’s insights about the tenuousness of our idea of causation as representing an ontological reduction of what causation is, Humean causal skepticism can instead be viewed as his clearly demarcating the limits of our knowledge in this area and then tracing out the ramifications of this limiting. (Below, we will see that the causal realists also take Hume’s account of necessity as epistemic rather than ontological.) If Hume’s account is intended to be epistemic, then the Problem of induction can be seen as taking Hume’s insights about our impressions of necessity to an extreme but reasonable conclusion. If it is true that constant conjunction (with or without the added component of mental determination) represents the totality of the content we can assign to our concept of causation, then we lose any claim to robust metaphysical necessity. But once this is lost, we also sacrifice our only rational grounding of causal inference. Our experience of constant conjunction only provides a projectivist necessity, but a projectivist necessity does not provide any obvious form of accurate predictive power. Hence, if we limit causation to the content provided by the two definitions, we cannot use this weak necessity to justify the PUN and therefore cannot ground predictions. We are therefore left in a position of inductive skepticism which denies knowledge beyond memory and what is present to the senses. By limiting causation to constant conjunction, we are incapable of grounding causal inference; hence Humean inductive skepticism.
In this way, the causal skeptic interpretation takes the “traditional interpretation” of the Problem of induction seriously and definitively, defending that Hume never solved it. Since we never directly experience power, all causal claims certainly appear susceptible to the Problem of Induction. The attempted justification of causal inference would lead to the vicious regress explained above in lieu of finding a proper grounding. The supporters of Humean causal skepticism can then be seen as ascribing to him what seems to be a reasonable position, which is, the conclusion that we have no knowledge of such causal claims, as they would necessarily lack proper justification. The family of interpretations that have Hume’s ultimate position as that of a causal skeptic therefore maintain that we have no knowledge of inductive causal claims, as they would necessarily lack proper justification. We can never claim knowledge of category (B) D. M. Armstrong reads Hume this way, seeing Hume’s reductivist account of necessity and its implications for laws of nature as ultimately leading him to skepticism. (Armstrong 1983: 53) Other Hume scholars that defend a skeptical interpretation of causation include Martin Bell, (Rupert and Richman 2007: 129) and Michael Levine, who maintains that Hume’s causal skepticism ultimately undermines his own Enquiry argument against miracles.
There are, however, some difficulties with this interpretation. First, it relies on assigning the “traditional interpretation” to the Problem of induction though, as discussed above, this is not the only account. Secondly, reading the conclusion of the Problem of Induction in this way is difficult to square with the rest of Hume’s corpus. For instance, the Copy Principle, fundamental to his work, has causal implications, and Hume relies on inductive inference as early as T 220.127.116.11; SBN 4. Hume consistently relies on analogical reasoning in the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion even after Philo grants that the necessity of causation is provided by custom, and the experimental method used to support the “science of man” so vital to Hume’s Treatise clearly demands the reliability of causal inference. Hume’s causal skepticism would therefore seem to undermine his own philosophy. Of course, if this is the correct way to read the Problem of Induction, then so much the worse for Hume.
A more serious challenge for the skeptical interpretation of Hume is that it ignores the proceeding Part of the Enquiry, in which Hume immediately provides what he calls a “solution” to the Problem of Induction. Hume states that, even though they are not supported by reason, causal inferences are “essential to the subsistence of all creatures,” and that:
It is more comfortable to the ordinary wisdom of nature to secure so necessary an act of the mind, by some instinct or mechanical tendency, which may be infallible in its operations, may discover itself at the first appearance of life and thought, and may be independent of all the laboured deductions of the understanding. As nature has taught us the use of our limbs, without giving us the knowledge of the muscles and nerves by which they are actuated; so she has implanted in us an instinct, which carries forward the thought in a correspondent course to that which she has established among external objects; though we are ignorant of those powers and forces, on which this course and succession of objects totally depends. (EHU 5.22; SBN 55)
Here, Hume seems to have causal inference supported by instinct rather than reason. The causal skeptic will interpret this as descriptive rather than normative, but others are not so sure. It is not clear that Hume views this instinctual tendency as doxastically inappropriate in any way. Therefore, another interpretation of this “solution” is that Hume thinks we can be justified in making causal inferences. However, it is not reason that justifies us, but rather instinct (and reason, in fact, is a subspecies of instinct for Hume, implying that at least some instinctual faculties are fit for doxastic assent). This will be discussed more fully below.
Against the positions of causal reductionism and causal skepticism is the New Hume tradition. It started with Norman Kemp Smith’s The Philosophy of David Hume, and defends the view that Hume is a causal realist, a position that entails the denial of both causal reductionism and causal skepticism by maintaining that the truth value of causal statements is not reducible to non-causal states of affairs and that they are in principle, knowable. (Tooley 1987: 246-47) The case for Humean causal realism is the least intuitive, given the explications above, and will therefore require the most explanation. However, the position can be rendered more plausible with the introduction of three interpretive tools whose proper utilization seems required for making a convincing realist interpretation. Of these, two are distinctions which realist interpretations insist that Hume respects in a crucial way but that non-realist interpretations often deny. The last is some mechanism by which to overcome the skeptical challenges Hume himself raises.
The first distinction is between ontological and epistemic causal claims. Strawson points out that we can distinguish:
(O) Causation as it is in the objects, and
(E) Causation so far as we know about it in the objects.
He maintains, “…Hume’s Regularity theory of causation is only a theory about (E), not about (O).” (Strawson 1989: 10) Whether or not we agree that Hume limits his theory to the latter, the distinction itself is not difficult to grasp. It simply separates what we can know from what is the case. The realist interpretation then applies this to Hume’s account of necessary connection, holding that it is not Hume’s telling us what causation is, but only what we can know of it. Hume’s account is then merely epistemic and not intended to have decisive ontological implications. This undercuts the reductionist interpretation. Simply because Hume says that this is what we can know of causation, it does not follow that Hume therefore believes that this is all that causation amounts to. In fact, such an interpretation might better explain Hume’s dissatisfaction over the definitions. If Hume were a reductionist, then the definitions should be correct or complete and there would not be the reservations discussed above.
Further, given Hume’s skeptical attitude toward speculative metaphysics, it seems unlikely that he would commit the Epistemic Fallacy and allow the inference from “x is all we can know of y” to “x constitutes the real, mind-independent essence of y,” as some (though not all) reductionist accounts would require. In fact, Hume must reject this inference, since he does not believe a resemblance thesis between perceptions and external objects can ever be philosophically established. He makes this denial explicit in Part XII of the Enquiry.
The epistemic interpretation of the distinction can be made more compelling by remembering what Hume is up to in the third Part of Book One of the Treatise. Here, as in many other areas of his writings, he is doing his standard empiricist investigation. Since we have some notion of causation, necessary connection, and so forth, his Copy Principle demands that this idea must be traceable to impressions. Hume’s account of causation should therefore be viewed an attempt to trace these genesis impressions and to thereby reveal the true content of the idea they comprise. Thus, it is the idea of causation that interests Hume. In fact, the title of Section 1.3.2 is “Of probability; and of the idea of cause and effect”. He announces, “To begin regularly, we must consider the idea of causation, and see from what origin it is deriv’d.” (T 18.104.22.168; SBN 74, his emphasis ) Hume therefore seems to be doing epistemology rather than metaphysics. (Mounce 1999: 32 takes this as indicative of a purely epistemic project.)
Although this employment of the distinction may proffer a potential reply to the causal reductionist, there is still a difficulty lurking. While it may be true that Hume is trying to explicate the content of the idea of causation by tracing its constituent impressions, this does not guarantee that there is a coherent idea, especially when Hume makes occasional claims that we have no idea of power, and so forth. The challenge seems to amount to this: Even if the previous distinction is correct, and Hume is talking about what we can know but not necessarily what is, the causal realist holds that substantive causal connections exist beyond constant conjunction. This is to posit a far stronger claim than merely having an idea of causation. The realist Hume says that there is causation beyond constant conjunction, thereby attributing him a positive ontological commitment, whereas his own skeptical arguments against speculative metaphysics rejecting parity between ideas and objects should, at best, only imply agnosticism about the existence of robust causal powers. (It is for this reason that Martin Bell and Paul Russell reject the realist interpretation.) There therefore seems to be a tension between accepting Hume’s account of necessary connection as purely epistemic and attributing to Hume the existence of an entity beyond what we can know by investigating our impressions.
Put another way, Hume’s Copy Principle requires that our ideas derive their content from constitutive impressions. However, if the previous distinction is correct, then Hume has already exhaustively explicated the impressions that give content to our idea of causation. This is the very same content that leads to the two definitions. It seems that Hume has to commit himself to the position that there is no clear idea of causation beyond the proffered reduction. But if this is true, and Hume is not a reductionist, what is he positing? It is here that the causal realist will appeal to the other two interpretive tools, viz. a second distinction and a belief mechanism, the former allowing us to make sense of the positive claim and the latter providing justification for it.
The realists claim that the second distinction is explicit in Hume’s writing. This is the distinction between “conceiving” or “imagining” and merely “supposing”. The general proposal is that we can and do have two different levels of clarity when contemplating a particular notion. We can either have a Cartesian clear and distinct idea, or we can have a supposition, that is, a vague, incomplete, or “relative” notion. The suggestion is this: Simple ideas are clear and distinct (though not as vivid as their corresponding impressions) and can be combined via the various relations. Groups compiled by relating these simple ideas form mental objects. In some cases, they combine in a coherent way, forming clear and distinct complex ideas, while in other cases, the fit is not so great, either because we do not see how the constituent ideas relate, or there is something missing from our conception. These suppositions do not attain the status of complex ideas in and of themselves, and remain an amalgamation of simple ideas that lack unity. The claim would then be that we can conceive distinct ideas, but only suppose incomplete notions.
Something like this distinction has historical precedence. In the Fifth Replies, Descartes distinguishes between some form of understanding and a complete conception. Berkeley also distinguishes between an “idea” and a mere “notion” in the third Dialogue and the second edition of the Principles. Perhaps most telling, Locke uses terminology identical to Hume’s in regard to substance, claiming we have “…no other idea of it at all, but only a Supposition….” (Essay, II.xxiii.2, emphasis his) Such a supposition is “an obscure and relative Idea.” (Essay, II.xxiii.3)
The realist employment of this second distinction is two-fold. First, the realist interpretation will hold that claims in which Hume states that we have no idea of power, and so forth, are claims about conceiving of causation. They only claim that we have no clear and distinct idea of power, or that what is clearly and distinctly conceived is merely constant conjunction. But a more robust account of causation is not automatically ruled out simply because our notion is not distinct. In this way, the distinction may blunt the passages where Hume seems pessimistic about the content of our idea of causation.
The second step of the causal realist interpretation will be to then insist that we can at least suppose (in the technical sense) a genuine cause, even if the notion is opaque, that is, to insist that mere suppositions are fit for doxastic assent. There doesn’t seem to be anything terribly problematic in believing in something of which we have an unclear representation. To return to the Fifth Replies, Descartes holds that we can believe in the existence and coherence of an infinite being with such vague ideas, implying that a clear and distinct idea is not necessary for belief. Hume denies clear and distinct content beyond constant conjunction, but it is not obvious that he denies all content beyond constant conjunction.
This second distinction is not introduced without controversy. Briefly, against the distinction, Kenneth Winkler offers an alternative suggestion that Hume’s talk of secret connections is actually a reference to further regularities that are simply beyond current human observation (such as the microscopic or subatomic), while ultimately interpreting Hume as an agnostic about robust causation. (Winkler 1991: 552-556) John Wright argues that this is to ignore Hume’s reasons for his professed ignorance in the hidden, that is, our inability to make causal inferences a priori. (Wright 1983: 92) Alternatively, Blackburn, a self-proclaimed “quasi-realist”, argues that the terminology of the distinction is too infrequent to bear the philosophical weight that the realist reading would require. (Blackburn 2007: 101-102) P.J.E. Kail resists this by pointing out that Hume’s overall attitude strongly suggests that he “assumes the existence of material objects,” and that Hume clearly employs the distinction and its terminology in at least one place: T 22.214.171.124; SBN 217-218. (Kail, 2007: 60) There, Hume describes a case in which philosophers develop a notion impossible to clearly and distinctly perceive, that somehow there are properties of objects independent of any perception. We simply cannot conceive such an idea, but it certainly remains possible to entertain or suppose this conjecture. Clatterbaugh takes an even stronger position than Blackburn, positing that for Hume to talk of efficacious secret powers would be literally to talk nonsense, and would force us to disregard Hume’s own epistemic framework, (Clatterbaugh 1999: 204) while Ott similarly argues that the inability to give content to causal terms means Hume cannot meaningfully affirm or deny causation. (Ott 2009: 198)
Even granting that Hume not only acknowledges this second distinction but genuinely believes that we can suppose a metaphysically robust notion of causal necessity, the realist still has this difficulty. How can Hume avoid the anti-realist criticism of Winkler, Ott, and Clatterbaugh that his own epistemic criteria demand that he remain agnostic about causation beyond constant conjunction? In other words, given the skeptical challenges Hume levels throughout his writings, why think that such a seemingly ardent skeptic would not merely admit the possibility of believing in a supposition, instead of insisting that this is, in fact, the nature of reality? The realist seems to require some Humean device that would imply that this position is epistemically tenable, that our notion of causation can reasonably go beyond the content identified by the arguments leading to the two definitions of causation and provide a robust notion that can defeat the Problem of Induction.
This is where the realists (and non-realists) seem most divided in their interpretations of Hume. Generally, the appeal is to Hume’s texts suggesting he embraces some sort of non-rational mechanism by which such beliefs are formed and/or justified, such as his purported solution to the Problem of Induction. This picture has been parsed out in terms of doxastic naturalism, transcendental arguments, psychological necessity, instinct, and even some form of proper function. However, what the interpretations all have in common is that humans arrive at certain mediate beliefs via some method quite distinct from the faculty of reason.
Let us now consider the impact that adopting these naturally formed beliefs would have on Hume’s causal theory. The function is two-fold. First, it provides some sort of justification for why it might be plausible for Hume to deem mere suppositions fit for belief. The other role is to answer the skeptical challenges raised by the “traditional interpretation” of the Problem of Induction. It would provide a way to justify causal beliefs despite the fact that said beliefs appear to be without rational grounds. It accomplishes the latter by emphasizing what the argument concludes, namely that inductive reasoning is groundless, that there is no rational basis for inductive inference. As Hume says, “Reason can never show us the connexion of one object with another….” (T 126.96.36.199; SBN 92, emphasis mine) In granting such a mechanism, we grant Hume the epistemic propriety of affirming something reason cannot establish. Further, it smoothes over worries about consistency arising from the fact that Hume seemingly undercuts all rational belief in causation, but then merrily shrugs off the Problem and continues to invoke causal reasoning throughout his writings.
In the realist framework outlined above, doxastic naturalism is a necessary component for a consistent realist picture. Kemp Smith argues for something stronger, that this non-rational mechanism itself implies causal realism. After engaging the non-rational belief mechanism responsible for our belief in body, he goes on to argue, “Belief in causal action is, Hume argues, equally natural and indispensable; and he freely recognizes the existence of ‘secret’ causes, acting independently of experience.” (Kemp Smith 2005: 88) He connects these causal beliefs to the unknown causes that Hume tells us are “original qualities in human nature.” (T 188.8.131.52; SBN 13) Kemp Smith therefore holds that Humean doxastic naturalism is sufficient for Humean causal realism. The reductionist, however, will rightly point out that this move is entirely too fast. Even granting that Hume has a non-rational mechanism at work and that we arrive at causal beliefs via this mechanism does not imply that Hume himself believes in robust causal powers, or that it is appropriate to do so. However, combining Humean non-rational justification with the two distinctions mentioned above at least seems to form a consistent alternative to the reductionist and skeptical interpretations. Just which of these three is right, however, remains contentious.
Hume wrote all of his philosophical works in English, so there is no concern about the accuracy of English translation. For the casual reader, any edition of his work should be sufficient. However, Oxford University Press produced the definitive Clarendon Edition of most of his works. For the serious scholar, these are a must have, as they contain copious helpful notes about Hume’s changes in editions, and so forth. The general editor of the series is Tom L. Beauchamp.
When referencing Hume’s works, however, there are standard editions of the Treatise and his Enquiries originally edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge and later revised by P.H. Nidditch. Hence, citations will often be given with an SBN page number. But Hume also numerated his own works to varying degrees. The Treatise is divided into three Books, each with Parts, Sections, and paragraphs. Hence, four numbers can give a precise location of a passage. Hume’s two definitions of cause are found at T 184.108.40.206; SBN 170, that is, in the Treatise, Book One, Part Three, Section Fourteen, paragraph thirty-one. This paragraph can be found on page 170 of the Selby-Bigge Nidditch editions. Hume’s shorter works, such as the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, are not as thoroughly outlined. Instead, the Enquiry is only divided into Sections, only some of which have Parts. Hence, we also find Hume’s definitions at EHU 7.29; SBN 76-77, or Part Seven of the Enquiry, paragraph twenty-nine, pages 76 and 77 of the Selby-Bigge Nidditch editions.
C. M. Lorkowski
University of Cincinnati
U. S. A.
Last updated: November 7, 2010 | Originally published: