David Hume (1711-1776) was called “Saint David” and “The Good David” by his friends, but his adversaries knew him as “The Great Infidel.” His contributions to religion have had a lasting impact and contemporary significance. Taken individually, Hume gives novel insights into many aspects of revealed and natural theology. When taken together, however, they provide his attempt at a systematic undermining of the justifications for religion. Religious belief is often defended through revealed theology, natural theology, or pragmatic advantage. However, through Hume’s various philosophical writings, he works to critique each of these avenues of religious justification.
Though Hume’s final view on religion is not clear, what is certain is that he was not a theist in any traditional sense. He gives a sweeping argument that we are never justified in believing testimony that a miracle has occurred, because the evidence for uniform laws of nature will always be stronger. If correct, this claim would undermine the veracity of any sacred text, such as the Bible, which testifies to miracles and relies on them as its guarantor of truth. As such, Hume rejects the truth of any revealed religion, and further shows that, when corrupted with inappropriate passions, religion has harmful consequences to both morality and society. Further, he argues, rational arguments cannot lead us to a deity. Hume develops what are now standard objections to the analogical design argument by insisting that the analogy is drawn only from limited experience, making it impossible to conclude that a cosmic designer is infinite, morally just, or a single being. Nor can we use such depictions to inform other aspects of the world, such as whether there is a dessert-based afterlife. He also defends what is now called “the Problem of Evil,” namely, that the concept of an all powerful, all knowing, and all good God is inconsistent with the existence of suffering.
Lastly, Hume is one of the first philosophers to systematically explore religion as a natural phenomenon, suggesting how religious belief can arise from natural, rather that supernatural means.
Hume is one of the most important philosophers to have written in the English language, and many of his writings address religious subjects either directly or indirectly. His very first work had the charge of atheism leveled against it, and this led to his being passed over for the Chair of Moral Philosophy at the University of Edinburgh. In fact, Hume’s views on religion were so controversial that he never held a university position in philosophy.
Hume addressed most of the major issues within the philosophy of religion, and even today theists feel compelled to confront Hume’s challenges. He leveled moral, skeptical, and pragmatic objections against both popular religion and the religion of the philosophers. These run the gamut from highly specific topics, such as metaphysical absurdities entailed by the Real Presence of the Eucharist, to broad critiques like the impossibility of using theology to infer anything about the world.
Hume’s very first work, A Treatise of Human Nature, includes considerations against an immortal soul, develops a system of morality independent of a deity, attempts to refute occasionalism, and argues against a necessary being, to name but a few of the religious topics that it addresses. Hume’s Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding re-emphasizes several of the challenges from the Treatise, but also includes a section against miracles and a section against the fruitfulness of theology. Hume’s major non-philosophical work, The History of England, discusses specific religious sects, largely in terms of their (often bloody) consequences. He also wrote numerous essays discussing various aspects of religion, such as the anti-doctrinal essays “Of the Immortality of the Soul” and “Of Suicide,” and critiques of organized religion and the clergy in “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm” and “Of National Characters.” Hume also wrote two major works entirely dedicated to religion: The Natural History of Religion (Natural History) and the Dialogues concerning Natural Religion (Dialogues), which merit brief discussions of their own.
Hume wrote the Natural History roughly in tandem with the first draft of the Dialogues, but while the former was published during his lifetime (as one of his Four Dissertations), the latter was not. In the introduction to the Natural History, Hume posits that there are two types of inquiry to be made into religion: its foundations in reason and its origin in human nature. While the Dialogues investigate the former, the task of the Natural History is to explore the latter. In the Natural History, he focuses on how various passions can give rise to common or false religion. It is an innovative work that brings together threads from philosophy, psychology, and history to provide a naturalistic account of how the various world religions came about.
Though Hume began writing the Dialogues at roughly the same time as the Natural History, he ultimately arranged to have the former published posthumously. In the twenty-five years between the time at which he first wrote them and his death, the Dialogues underwent three sets of revisions, including a final revision from his deathbed. The Dialogues are a rich discussion of Natural Theology, and are generally considered to be the most important book ever written on the subject. Divided into twelve parts, the Dialogues follow the discussion of three thinkers debating the nature of God. Of the three characters, Philo takes up the role of the skeptic, Demea represents the orthodox theologian of Hume’s day, and Cleanthes follows a more philosophical, empirical approach to his theology. The work is narrated by Pamphilus, a professed student of Cleanthes.
Both Hume’s style and the fact of posthumous publication give rise to interpretive difficulties. Stylistically, Hume’s Dialogues are modeled after On the Nature of the Gods, a dialogue by the Roman philosopher Cicero. In Circero’s works, unlike the dialogues of Plato, Leibniz, and Berkeley, a victor is not established from the outset, and all characters make important contributions. Hume ridicules such one-sided dialogues on the grounds that they put “nothing but Nonsense into the Mouth of the Adversary” (L1, Letter 72). The combination of this stylistic preference with Hume’s use of irony, an infrequently discussed but frequently employed literary device in his writings, makes the work a delight to read, but creates interpretive difficulties in determining who speaks for Hume on any given topic.
In the Dialogues, all the characters make good Humean points, even Pamphilus and Demea. The difficulty comes in determining who speaks for Hume when the characters disagree. Hume has been interpreted as Cleanthes/Pamphilus, Philo, an amalgamation, and as none of them. The most popular view, though not without dissent, construes Hume as Philo. Philo certainly has the most to say in the Dialogues. His arguments and objections often go unanswered, and he espouses many opinions on both religion and on other philosophical topics that Hume endorses in other works, such as the hypothesis that causal inference is based on custom. The more significant challenge to interpreting Hume as Philo concerns the collection of remarks at the beginning of Part XII of the Dialogues, known as Philo’s Reversal. After spending the bulk of the Dialogues raising barrage of objections against the design argument, Part XII has Philo admitting, “A purpose, an intention, a design strikes everywhere the most careless, the most stupid thinker…” (D 12.2). Nonetheless, whether Philo’s Reversal is sincere or not is fundamentally tied to Hume’s own views on religion.
Given the comprehensive critique that Hume levels against religion, it is clear that he is not a theist in any traditional sense. However, acknowledging this point does little to settle Hume’s considered views on religion. There remain three positions open to Hume: atheist naturalism, skeptical agnosticism, or some form of deism. The first position has Hume denying any form of supernaturalism, and is much more popular outside of Hume scholarship than within. The reason for this is that it runs contrary to Hume’s attitude regarding speculative metaphysics. It has him making a firm metaphysical commitment by allowing an inference from our having no good reason for thinking that there are supernatural entities, to a positive commitment that in fact there are none. However, Hume would not commit the Epistemic Fallacy and thereby allow the inference from “x is all we can know of subject y” to “x constitutes the real, mind-independent essence of y.” Indeed, in Part XII of the first Enquiry, Hume explicitly denies the inference from what we can know from our ideas to what is the case in reality.
These considerations against a full-fledged atheist position motivate the skeptical view. While atheism saddles Hume with too strong a metaphysical commitment, the skeptical view also holds that he does not affirm the existence of any supernatural entities. This view has Hume doubting the existence of supernatural entities, but still allowing their possibility. It has the advantage of committing Hume to the sparse ontology of the naturalist without actually committing him to potentially dogmatic metaphysical positions. Hence, Hume can be an atheist for all intents and purposes without actually violating his own epistemic principles.
Both the atheist and skeptical interpretations must, then, take Philo’s Reversal as insincere. Perhaps Hume feared the political consequences of publically denouncing theism; alternatively, he may have used Philo’s Reversal simply as a dialectical tool of the Dialogues. Many scholars tend to steer clear of the former for several reasons. First, while it was true that, early in his career, Hume edited his work to avoid giving offense, this was not the case later. For example, Hume excised the miracles argument from the Treatise, but it later found its way into print in the Enquiry. Second, Hume arranged to have the Dialogues published after his death, and therefore had no reason to fear repercussions for himself. Further, Hume did not seem to think that the content would bring grief to his nephew who brought it to publication, as he revealed in a letter to his publisher (L2, Appendix M). Third, it is not only in the Dialogues that we get endorsements of a deity or of a design argument. J.C.A. Gaskin (1988: 219) provides an extensive (though not exhaustive) list of several other places in which we get similar pro-deistic endorsements from Hume. Lastly, it is generally considered hermeneutically appropriate to invoke disingenuousness only if an alternative interpretation cannot be plausibly endorsed.
Norman Kemp Smith, in his commentary on the Dialogues, argues in favor of just such an alternative interpretation. Though he interprets Hume as Philo, he has the Reversal as insincerely made, not from fear, but as a dialectical tool. In his Ciceronian dialogue, Hume does not want the reader, upon finishing the piece, to interpret any of the characters as victorious, instead encouraging them to reflect further upon these matters. Thus, Philo’s Reversal is part of a “dramatic balance” intended to help mask the presence of a clear victor.
Nelson Pike, in his own commentary on the Dialogues, roundly criticizes Kemp Smith’s position. We should instead look for reasons to take the Reversal as genuine. One possibility he considers is the presence of the “irregular arguments” of Part III. Here, instead of presenting design arguments based on standard analogical reasoning, Cleanthes presents considerations in which design will, “immediately flow in upon you with a force like that of sensation” (D 3.7). Pike therefore interprets these “irregular arguments” as non-inferential. If this is right, and the idea of a designer comes upon us naturally rather than inferentially, as Ronald Butler, Stanley Tweyman, and others have argued, then Philo’s Reversal is not a reversal at all. He can consistently maintain that the inference of the design argument is insufficient for grounding one’s belief in God, and that nonetheless, we have a natural inclination to accept it.
There is, therefore, support for interpreting Hume as a deist of a limited sort. Gaskin calls this Hume’s “attenuated deism,” attenuated in that the analogy to something like human intelligence is incredibly remote, and that no morality of the deity is implied, due especially to the Problem of Evil. However, scholars that attribute weak deism to Hume are split in regard to the source of the belief. Some, like Gaskin, think that Hume’s objections to the design argument apply only to analogies drawn too strongly. Hence, Hume does not reject all design arguments, and , provided that the analogs are properly qualified, might allow the inference. This is different than the picture suggested by Butler and discussed by Pike in which the belief is provided by a natural, non-rational faculty and thereby simply strikes us, rather than as the product of an inferential argument. Therefore, though the defenders of a deistic Hume generally agree about the remote, non-moral nature of the deity, there is a fundamental schism regarding the justification and generation of this belief. Both sides, however, agree that the belief should not come from special revelation, such as miracles or revealed texts.
Because Hume’s denial of all miracles in section X of the Enquiry entails a denial of all revealed theology, it is worthwhile to consider his arguments in detail. The section is divided into two parts. While Part I provides an argument against believing in miracles in general, Part II gives four specific considerations against miracles based on particular facts about the world. Therefore, we may refer to the argument of Part I as Hume’s Categorical Argument against miracles and those of Part II as the four Evidential Arguments against miracles. Identifying Hume’s intentions with these arguments is notoriously difficult. Though the Evidential Arguments are fairly straightforward in and of themselves, there are two major interpretive puzzles: what the Categorical Argument of Part I is supposed to be, and how it fits with the Evidential Arguments of Part II. Some see the two parts as entirely separable, while others insist that they provide two parts of a cohesive whole. The following reconstructions attempt to stay interpretively neutral on these disputes.
Hume begins Part I with rules for the appropriate proportioning of belief. First, he divides arguments that justify beliefs regarding cause and effect into proofs and probabilities. Proofs are arguments supported by evidence in which the effects have been constant, such as the sun rising every day. However, there are stronger and weaker proofs—consider a professor showing up for class every day versus the sun rising every day—and only the strongest proofs, those supporting our beliefs in the laws of nature, have been attested to “in all countries and all ages.” Effects, however, are not always constant. When faced with a “contrariety of effects,” we must instead use probabilities, which are evidentially weaker than proofs. Since the strength of both proofs and probabilities varies in degree, we have the potential for “all imaginable degrees of assurance.” Hume maintains that, “The wise man…proportions his beliefs to the evidence.” In cases where effects have been constant and therefore supported by proof, our beliefs are held with a greater degree of assurance than those supported by mere probability (EHU 10.1-4).
Having explained Hume’s model for proportioning beliefs, we can now consider its ramifications for attested miracles:
A miracle is a violation of the laws of nature; and as a firm and unalterable experience has established these laws, the proof against a miracle, from the very nature of the fact, is as entire as any argument from experience can possibly be imagined. (EHU 10.12)
Here, Hume defines a miracle as a “violation of the laws of nature” though he then “accurately” defines a miracle in a footnote as “a transgression of a law of nature by a particular volition of the Deity or by the interposition of some invisible agent.” As to which definition is more relevant, the second more adequately captures the notion of a miracle. In a 1761 letter to Blair, Hume indicates that, as an empirical fact, miracles always have religious content: “I never read of a miracle in my life that was not meant to establish some new point of religion” (L1, Letter 188). A Humean miracle is, therefore, a violation of a law of nature whose cause is an agent outside of nature, though the incompatibility with a law of nature is all that the Categorical Argument requires.
We must, therefore, consider Hume’s conception of the laws of nature. Following Donald Livingston, we may draw out some of the explicit features of Hume’s conception. They are universal, so any falsification of a supposed law or a law’s failure to be upheld would be sufficient to rob it of its nomological status. Laws, therefore, admit of no empirical counterexamples. Secondly, laws of nature are matters of fact, not relations of ideas, as their denial is always coherent. Indeed, like any other matter of fact, they must have some empirical content. As Livingston concludes, “…it must be possible to discipline theoretical talk about unobservable causal powers with empirical observations” (Livingston 1984: 203).
Utilizing this conception of the laws of nature, Hume draws his conclusion:
There must, therefore, be a uniform experience against every miraculous event, otherwise the event would not merit that appellation. And as the uniform experience amounts to a proof, then there is here a direct and full proof, from the nature of the fact, against the existence of any miracle; nor can such a proof be destroyed, or the miracle rendered credible, but by an opposite proof, which is superior….no testimony is sufficient to establish a miracle, unless the testimony be of such a kind, that its falsehood would be more miraculous, than the fact, which it endeavors to establish…. (EHU 10.12-10.13; SBN 115-116, Hume’s emphasis)
The interpretation of this passage requires considerable care. As many commentators have pointed out, if Hume’s argument is: a miracle is a violation of a law of nature, but laws of nature do not admit of counterexamples, therefore there are no miracles, then Hume clearly begs the question. Call this the Caricature Argument. William Paley first attributed this to Hume, and the interpretation has had proponents ever since; but this cannot be Hume’s argument. The Caricature Argument faces three major obstacles, two of which are insurmountable. However, considering the inaccuracies of the Caricature Argument will help us to arrive at a more accurate reconstruction.
First, the Caricature Argument is an a priori, deductive argument from definition. This would make it a demonstration in Hume's vernacular, not a proof. Nonetheless, both the argument of Section X and the letter in which he elucidates it repeatedly appeal to the evidence against miracles as constituting a proof. If the Caricature Argument were correct, then the argument against miracles could not be labeled as such.
A second, related problem is that, if one accepts the Caricature Argument, then one must accept the entailed modality. From the conclusion of the a priori deductive argument, it follows that the occurrence of a miracle would be impossible. If this were the case, then no testimony could persuade a person to believe in the existence of a miracle. However, many take Hume to implicitly reject such an assumption. Such critics point to Hume’s acceptance of the claim that if a sufficient number of people testify to an eight-day darkness, then this constitutes a proof of its occurrence (EHU 10.36). Therefore, there are hypothetical situations in which our belief in a miracle could be established by testimony, implying that the conclusion of the Caricature Argument is too strong. This reply, however, is incorrect. Hume’s description of the proof for total darkness is generally interpreted as his establishing criteria for the rational justification of a belief, based on testimony, that a miracle has occurred. However, we must note that the passage that immediately precedes the example contains an ambiguous disjunct: “…there may possibly be miracles, or violations of the usual course of nature, of such a kind as to admit proof from human testimony” (EHU 10.36 emphasis added). From this passage alone, it is not clear whether Hume means for the darkness scenario to count as an example of the former, the latter, or both. Nevertheless, in Hume’s letter to Blair, he presents a similar example with an unambiguous conclusion. In considering Campbell’s complaint that it is a contradiction for Hume to introduce a fiction in which the testimony of miracle constitutes a proof, he has us consider his previous example concerning the
...supposition of testimony for a particular miracle [that might] amount to a full proof of it. For instance, the absence of the sun during 48 hours; but reasonable men would only conclude from this fact, that the machine of the globe was disordered during this time. (L1, Letter 188)
The conclusion Hume draws is that, even if testimony of a strange event were to amount to a full proof, it would be more reasonable to infer a hiccup in the natural regularity of things (on par with an eclipse, where apparent, but not the disturbance of a higher level regularity), rather than to conclude a miracle. Therefore, when presented with a situation that is either a miracle or a “violation of the usual course of nature,” we ought to infer the latter.
This preference for a naturalistic explanation is reemphasized in Hume’s discussion of Joan of Arc in the History of England. Hume states:
It is the business of history to distinguish between the miraculous and the marvelous; to reject the first in all narrations merely profane and human; to doubt the second; and when obliged by unquestionable testimony…to admit of something extraordinary, to receive as little of it as is consistent with the known facts and circumstances. (H 2.20, Hume’s emphasis )
Here, he once more suggests that we always reject the miraculous testimony and only accept as much of the marvelous as is required to remain consistent with the “unquestionable testimony.” For Hume, testimony of a miracle is always to be rejected in favor of the naturalistic interpretation. He therefore never grants a proof of a miracle as a real possibility, so the Caricature Argument may surmount at least this objection.
However, a final difficulty related to the modality of the conclusion concerns the observation that Hume couches his argument in terms of appropriate belief. Hume’s conclusion should, therefore, be interpreted as epistemic, but the Caricature Argument instead requires a metaphysical conclusion: miracles are impossible. The Caricature Argument cannot be correct, because Hume’s entire argument hinges on the way that we apportion our beliefs, and a fortiori, beliefs about testimony. Hume speaks of “our evidence” for the truth of miracles, belief in them being “contrary to the rules of just reasoning,” and miracles never being “established on…evidence.” “A miracle can never be proved” is a far cry from saying that a miracle has never occurred and never could occur. This gives us reason to reject the metaphysical conclusion of the Caricature Argument.
There are also logical implications against the metaphysical conclusion, such as Hume’s avowal that miracles have an essence, and that there can be un-witnessed miracles. Hume does not say that violations are impossible, only unknowable. Of course, it could be that Hume grants this merely for the sake of argument, but then the stronger conclusion would still have a problem. For whether or not Hume grants the occurrence of miracles, he certainly allows for their conceivability, something the Caricature Argument cannot allow since, for Hume, conceivability implies possibility. Finally, there is the fact that Part II exists at all. If Hume did indeed think that Part I established that miracles could never occur, the entire second part, where he shows that “…there never was a miraculous event established on… [sufficient] evidence” (EHU 10.14), would be logically superfluous. The proper conclusion is, therefore, the epistemic one.
In overcoming the weaknesses of the Caricature Argument, a more plausible Humean argument takes form. Hume’s Categorical Argument of Part I may be reconstructed as follows:
There is much to be said for this reconstruction. First, in addition to Humean axioms, we have empirical premises rather than definitions that support the key inferences. Hence, the reconstruction is a proof, not a demonstration. Second, given that Hume has ancillary arguments for these empirical premises, there is no question-begging of the form that the Caricature Argument suggests. For instance, he argues for (4) by drawing on his criterion of “in all countries and all ages.” He does not simply assert that laws of nature automatically meet this criterion.
However, there is a separate worry of question-begging in (4) that needs to be addressed before moving on to the arguments of Part II. The challenge is that, in maintaining Hume’s position that men in all ages testify to the constancy of the laws of nature, any testimony to the contrary (that is, testimony of the miraculous) must be excluded. However, there are people that do testify to miracles. The worry is that, in assigning existence to laws of nature without testimonial exception, Hume may beg the question against those that maintain the occurrence of miracles.
This worry can be overcome, however, if we follow Don Garrett in realizing what Hume is attempting to establish in the argument:
… [when] something has the status of “law of nature”- that is, plays the cognitive role of a “law of nature”- for an individual judger…it has the form of a universal generalization, is regarded by the judger as causal, and is something for which the judger has firm and unalterable experience….This is, of course, compatible with there actually being exceptions to it, so long as one of those exceptions has, for the judger, the status of experiments within his or her experience. (Garrett 1997: 152, Hume’s emphasis)
Garrett rightly points out that in Hume’s argument laws of nature govern our belief, and fulfill a certain doxastic role for the judger. Nonetheless, once this is realized, we can strengthen Garrett’s point by recognizing that this role is, in fact, a necessary condition for testimony of a miracle. To believe in a miracle, the witness must believe that a law of nature has been violated. However, this means that, in endorsing the occurrence of the miracle, the witness implicitly endorses two propositions: that there is an established law of nature in place and that it has been broken. Thus, in order for a witness to convince me of a miracle, we must first agree that there is a law in place. The same testimony which seeks to establish the miracle reaffirms the nomological status of the law as universally believed.
This leads to the second point that Garrett raises. Only after this common ground is established do we consider, as an experiment, whether we should believe that the said law has been violated. Hence, even such a testimonial does not count against the universality of what we, the judges, take to be a law of nature. Instead, we are setting it aside as experimental in determining whether we should offer assent to the purported law or not. If this is right, then (4) does not beg the question. This leaves us with empirical premise (5), which leads to Part II.
Hume begins Part II by stating that, in granting that the testimonies of miracles may progress beyond mere probability, “we have been a great deal too liberal in our concession…” (EHU 10.14). He then gives four considerations as to why this is the case, three of which are relatively straightforward.
First, Hume tells us that, as an empirical fact, “there is not to be found, in all history, any miracle attested by a sufficient number of men, of such unquestioned good sense, education, and learning…” to secure its testimony (EHU 10.15). To be persuaded of a miracle, we would need to be sure that no natural explanation, such as delusion, deception, and so forth, was more likely than the miraculous, a task which, for Hume, would simply take more credible witnesses than have ever attested to a miracle.
Second, it is a fact of human nature that we find surprise and wonder agreeable. We want to believe in the miraculous, and we are much more likely to pass along stories of the miraculous than of the mundane. For Hume, this explains why humans tend to be more credulous with attested miracles than should reasonably be the case, and also explains why the phenomenon is so widespread.
His third, related presumption against miracles is that testimony of their occurrence tends to be inversely proportionate to education: miracles “are observed chiefly to abound among ignorant and barbarous nations” (EHU 10.20). Hume’s explanation for this is that purported miracles are generally born of ignorance. Miracles are used as placeholders when we lack the knowledge of natural causes. However, as learning progresses, we become increasingly able to discover natural causes, and no longer need to postulate miraculous explanations.
Hume’s fourth consideration is also his most difficult:
Every miracle, therefore, pretended to have wrought in any of these religions…as its direct scope is to establish the particular system to which it is attributed; so has it the same force, though more indirectly, to overthrow every other system. In destroying a rival system, it likewise destroys the credit of those miracles, on which that system was established; so that all the [miracles] of different religions are to be regarded as contrary facts, and evidence of these…as opposite to each other. (EHU 10.24)
His general idea is that, since multiple, incompatible religions testify to miracles, they cancel each other out in some way, but scholars disagree as to how this is supposed to happen. Interpreters such as Gaskin (1988: 137-138) and Keith Yandell (1990: 334) focus on Hume’s claim that miracles are generally purported to support or establish a particular religion. Therefore, a miracle wrought by Jesus is opposed and negated by one wrought by Mohammed, and so forth. However, as both Gaskin and Yandell point out, this inference would be flawed, because miracles are rarely such that they entail accepting one religion exclusively. Put another way, the majority of miracles can be interpreted and accepted by most any religion.
However, there is a more charitable interpretation of Hume’s fourth Evidential Argument. As the rest of the section centers around appropriate levels of doxastic assent, we should think that the notion is at play here too. A less problematic reconstruction therefore has his fourth consideration capturing something like the following intuition: the testifiers of miracles have a problem. In the case of their own religion, their level of incredulity is sufficiently low so as to accept their own purported miracles. However, when they turn to those attested by other religions, they raise their level of incredulity so as to deny these miracles of other faiths. Thus, by participating in a sect that rejects at least some miracles, they thereby undermine their own position. In claiming sufficient grounds for rejecting the miracles of the other sects, they have thereby rejected their own. For Hume, the sectarians cannot have their cake and eat it. Intellectual honesty requires a consistent level of credulity. By rejecting their opponent’s claims to miracles, they commit to the higher level of incredulity and should thereby reject their own. Hence, Hume’s later claim that, in listening to a Christian’s testimony of a miracle, “we are to regard their testimony in the same light as if they had mentioned that Mahometan miracle, and had in express terms contradicted it, with the same certainty as they have for the miracle they relate” (EHU 10.24). Thus, the problem for Hume is not that the sectarians cannot interpret all purported miracles as their own but that they, in fact, do not.
These are the four evidential considerations against miracles Hume provides in Part II. However, if the above reconstruction of Part I is correct, and Hume thinks that the Categorical Argument has established that we are never justified in believing the testimony of miracles, we might wonder why Part II exists at all. Its presence can be justified in several ways. First, on the reconstruction above, Part II significantly bolsters premise (5). Second, even if Part II were logically superfluous, Michael Levine rightly points out that the arguments of Part II can still have a buttressing effect for persuading the reader to the conclusion of Part I, thereby softening the blow of its apparently severe conclusion. A third, related reason is a rhetorical consideration. In order for one’s philosophical position to be well-grounded, it is undesirable to hang one’s hat on a single consideration. As Hume himself acknowledges, resting one part of his system on another would unnecessarily weaken it (T 18.104.22.168). Therefore, the more reasons he can present, the better. Fourth, Hume, as a participant in many social circles, is likely to have debated miracles in many ways against many opponents, each with his or her own favored example. Part II, therefore, gives him the opportunity for more direct and specific redress, and he does indeed address many specific miracles there. Finally, the considerations of Part II, the second and third especially, have an important explanatory effect. If Hume is right that no reasonable person would believe in the existence of miracles based on testimony, then it should seem strange that millions have nevertheless done so. Like the Natural History discussed below, Part II can disarm this worry by explaining why, if Hume is right, we have this widespread phenomenon despite its inherent unreasonableness.
In his essay, “Of the Immortality of the Soul,” Hume presents many pithy and brief arguments against considerations of an afterlife. He offers them under three broad headings, metaphysical, moral, and physical. Written for a popular audience, they should be treated as challenges or considerations against, rather than decisive refutations of, the doctrine.
Hume’s metaphysical considerations largely target the rationalist project of establishing a mental substance a priori (such as the discovery of the “I” in Descartes’ Meditations ). His first two considerations against this doctrine draw on arguments from his Treatise, referring to his conclusion that we have only a confused and insufficient idea of substance. If this is the case, however, then it becomes exceedingly difficult to discover the essence of such a notion a priori. Further, Hume says, we certainly have no conception of cause and effect a priori, and are therefore in no position to make a priori conclusions about the persistence conditions of a mental substance, or to infer that this substance grounds our thoughts. Indeed, even if we admit a mental substance, there are other problems.
Assuming that there is a mental substance, Hume tells us that we must treat it as relevantly analogous to physical substance. The physical substance of a person disperses after death and loses its identity as a person. Why think that the mental substance would behave otherwise? If the body rots, disperses, and ceases to be human, why not say the same thing of the soul? If we reply by saying that mental substances are simple and immortal, then for Hume, this implies that they would also be non-generable, and should not come into being either. If this were true, we should have memories from before our births, which we clearly do not. Note that here we see Hume drawing on his considerations against miracles; implicitly rejecting the possibility of a system whereby God continuously and miraculously brings souls into existence. Finally, if the rationalists are right that thought implies eternal souls, then animals should have them as well since, in the Treatise, Hume argued that mental traits such as rationality obtain by degree throughout the animal world, rather than by total presence or total absence; but this is something that the Christians of Hume’s day explicitly denied. In this way, Hume’s metaphysical considerations turn the standard rationalist assumptions of the theists, specifically the Christian theists of his day, against them.
The moral considerations, however, require no such presuppositions beyond the traditional depictions of heaven and hell. Hume begins by considering two problems involving God’s justice: first, he addresses the defender of an afterlife who posits its existence as a theodicy, maintaining that there is an afterlife so that the good can be appropriately rewarded and the wicked appropriately punished. For reasons considered in detail below, Hume holds that we cannot infer God’s justice from the world, which means we would need independent reasons for positing an alternate existence. However, the success of the arguments discussed above would largely undercut the adequacy of such reasons. Second, Hume points out that this system would not be just regardless. Firstly, Hume claims it is unwarranted to put so much emphasis on this world if it is so fleeting and minor in comparison to an infinite afterlife. If God metes out infinite punishment for finite crimes, then God is omni-vindictive, and it seems equally unjust to give infinite rewards for finitely meritorious acts. According to Hume, most men are somewhere between good and evil, so what sense is there in making the afterlife absolute? Further, Hume raises difficulties concerning birth. If all but Christians of a particular sect are doomed to hell, for instance, then being born in, say, Japan, would be like losing a cosmic lottery, a notion difficult to reconcile with perfect justice. Finally, Hume emphasizes that punishment without purpose, without some chance of reformation, is not a satisfactory system, and should not be endorsed by a perfect being. Hence, Hume holds that considerations of an afterlife seem to detract from, rather than bolster, God’s perfection.
Lastly are the physical (empirical) considerations, which Hume identifies as the most relevant. First, he points out how deeply and entirely connected the mind and body are. If two objects work so closely together in every other aspect of their existence, then the end of one should also be the end of the other. Two objects so closely linked, and that began to exist together, should also cease to exist together. Second, again in opposition to the rationalist metaphysicians, he points out that dreamless sleep establishes that mental activity can be at least temporarily extinguished; we therefore have no reason to think that it cannot be permanently extinguished. His third consideration is that we know of nothing else in the universe that is eternal, or at least that retains its properties and identity eternally, so it would be strange indeed if there were exactly one thing in all the cosmos that did so. Finally, Hume points out that nature does nothing in vain. If death were merely a transition from one state to another, then nature would be incredibly wasteful in making us dread the event, in providing us with mechanisms and instincts that help us to avoid it, and so forth. That is, it would be wasteful for nature to place so much emphasis on survival. Because of these skeptical considerations, Hume posits that the only argument for an immortal soul is from special revelation, a source he rejects along with miracles.
Having discussed Hume’s rejection of revealed theology, we now turn to his critiques of the arguments of Natural Theology, the most hopeful of which, for Hume, is the Design Argument. His assaults on the design argument come in two very different types. In the Dialogues, Hume’s Philo provides many argument-specific objections, while Section XI of the Enquiry questions the fruitfulness of this type of project generally.
In the Dialogues, Cleanthes defends various versions of the design argument (based on order) and the teleological argument (based on goals and ends). Generally, he does not distinguish between the two, and they are similar in logical form: both are arguments by analogy. In analogical arguments, relevant similarities between two or more entities are used as a basis for inferring further similarities. In this case, Cleanthes is draws an analogy between artifacts and nature: artifacts exhibit certain properties and have a designer/creator; parts, or the totality, of nature exhibit similar properties, therefore, we should infer a relevantly analogous designer/creator. Hume’s Philo raises many objections against such reasoning, most of which are still considered as legitimate challenges to be addressed by contemporary philosophers of religion. Replies, however, will not be addressed here. Though Philo presents numerous challenges to this argument, they can be grouped under four broad headings: the scope of the conclusion, problems of weak analogy, problems with drawing the inference, and problems with allowing the inference. The first two types of problem are related in many cases, but not all. After the objections from the Dialogues are discussed, we will turn to Hume’s more general critique from the first Enquiry.
Scope of the Conclusion: Philo points out that, if the analogy is to be drawn between an artifact and some experienced portion of the universe, then the inferred designer must be inferred only from the phenomena. That is, we can only make merited conclusions about the creator based on the experienced part of the universe that we treat as analogous to an artifact, and nothing beyond this. As Philo argues in Part V, since the experienced portion of the world is finite, then we cannot reasonably infer an infinite creator. Similarly, our limited experience would not allow us to make an inference to an eternal creator, since everything we experience in nature is fleeting. An incorporeal creator is even more problematic, because Hume maintains that the experienced world is corporeal. In fact, even a unified, single creator becomes problematic if we are drawing an analogy between the universe and any type of complex artifact. If we follow someone like William Paley, who maintains that the universe is relevantly similar to a watch, then we must further pursue the analogy in considering how many people contributed to that artifact’s coming to be. Crafting a watch requires that many artificers work on various aspects of the artifact in order to arrive at a finished project. Finally, Philo insists that we also lack the ability to infer a perfect creator or a morally estimable creator, though the reasons for this will be discussed below in the context of the Problem of Evil. Given these limitations that we must place on the analogy, we are left with a very vague notion of a designer indeed. As Philo claims, a supporter of the design analogy is only “…able, perhaps, to assert, or conjecture, that the universe, sometime, arose from something like design: But beyond that position, he cannot ascertain one single circumstance, and is left afterward to fix every point on his [revealed] theology…” (D 5.12). This is Gaskin’s “attenuated deism” mentioned above. However, even weakening the conclusion to this level of imprecision still leaves a host of problems.
Problems of Weak Analogy: As mentioned above, many of Philo’s objections can be classified as either a problem with the scope of the conclusion or as a weak analogy. For instance, concluding an infinite creator from a finite creation would significantly weaken the analogy by introducing a relevant disanalogy, but the argument is not vulnerable in this way if the scope of the conclusion is properly restricted. However, beyond these problems of scope, Philo identifies two properties that serve to weaken the analogy but that cannot be discharged via a sufficient limitation of the conclusion. In Part X, Philo points out the apparent purposelessness of the universe. Designed artifacts are designed for a purpose. An artifact does something. It works toward some goal. Thus, there is a property that all artifacts have in common but that we cannot locate in the universe as a whole. For Philo, the universe is strikingly disanalogous to, for instance, a watch, precisely because the former is not observed to work toward some goal. This weakness cannot be discharged by restricting the conclusion, and any attempt to posit a purpose to the universe will either rely on revealed theology or is simply implausible. To show why Philo thinks this, take a few simplified examples: If we say that the universe exists “for the glory of God,” we not only beg the question about the existence of God, but we also saddle our conception of God with anthropomorphized attributes Hume would find unacceptable, such as pride and the need for recognition. Similar problems exist if we say that the universe was created for God’s amusement. However, if we change tactics and claim that the universe was created for the flourishing of humans, or any other species, then for Hume, we end up ignoring the phenomena in important ways, such as the numerous aspects of the universe that detract from human flourishing (such as mosquitoes) rather than contribute to it, and the vast portions of the universe that seem utterly irrelevant to human existence.
Beyond this, Philo finds another intractably weak analogy between artifacts and natural objects. This is the fundamental difference between nature and artifices. Philo holds that the more we learn about nature, the more striking the disanalogy between nature and artifacts. They are simply too fundamentally different. Consider, for instance, that many aspects of nature are self-maintaining and even self-replicating. Even if there are important analogies to be drawn between a deer and a watch, the dissimilarities, for Philo, will always outweigh them.
Problems with Drawing the Inference: There are further problems with the design inference that go beyond the mere dissimilarity of the analogs. Hume’s Philo raises two such objections based on experience. First, there is no clear logical relationship between order and a designer. In Part VII, Philo argues that we do in fact experience order without agency: an acorn growing into an oak tree shows that one does not need knowledge or intent to bestow order. Nor can we reply that the acorn was designed to produce a tree, for this is the very issue in question, and to import design in this way would beg the question. But if we can have order without a designer, then the mere presence of order cannot allow us to infer presence of design.
His second problem with making the design inference is that, like all inductive inferences, the design argument essentially involves a causal component. However, for Hume, knowledge of causal efficacy requires an experienced constant conjunction of phenomena; that is, only after we have seen that events of type B always follow events of type A do we infer a causal relationship from one to the other (see Hume: Causation). However, the creation of the universe necessarily would be a singular event. Since we do not have experience of multiple worlds coming into existence, causal inferences about any cosmogony become unfathomable for Hume in an important sense. This objection is often interpreted as peculiar to Hume’s own philosophical framework, relying heavily on his account of causation, but the point can be made more generally while still raising a challenge for the design argument. Because of our limited knowledge of the origins, if any, of the universe (especially in the 18th century), it becomes metaphysical hubris to think that we can make accurate inferences pertaining to issues such as: its initial conditions, persistence conditions, what it would take to cause a universe, whether the event has or requires a cause, and so forth. This relates to Philo’s next objection.
Problems when the Inference is Allowed: The previous two objections teach us that there are multiple origins of order, and that we are in a poor epistemic state to make inferences about speculative cosmogony. Taking these two points together, it becomes possible to postulate many hypothetical origins of the universe that are, for Hume, on as solid a footing as that of a designer, but instead rely on a different principle of order. Though Philo indicates that there are many, he specifically identifies only four principles which have been experienced to produce order in our part of the universe alone: reason (that is, rational agency), instinct, generation, and vegetation. Though Cleanthes defends reason as the only relevant principle of order, Philo develops alternative cosmogonies based on vegetation, where the universe grows from a seed, and generation, where the universe is like an animal or is like something created instinctively, such as a spider’s web; but Philo should not be taken as endorsing any of these alternative cosmogonies. Instead, his point is that, since we have just as much reason to think that order can arise from vegetation as it can from rational agency, as we have experience of both, there is no obvious reason to think that the inference to the latter, as the source of the order of the universe, is any better than the inference from the former, since we can make just as good an analogy with any of these. If order can come from multiple sources, and we know nothing about the creation of the universe, then Cleanthes is not in a position to give one a privileged position over the others. This means that, if we are to follow Cleanthes in treating the design inference as satisfactory, then we should treat the other inferences as satisfactory as well. However, since we cannot accept multiple conflicting cosmogonies, Philo maintains that we should refrain from attempting any such inferences. As he says in a different context: “A total suspense of judgement is here our only reasonable resource” (D 8.12).
A second problem Philo raises with allowing the design inference is that doing so can lead to a regress. Let us assume that the designer inference is plausible, that is, that a complex, purposive system requires a designing mind as its principle of order. But wait! Surely a creative mind is itself a complex, purposive system as well. A mind is complex, and its various parts work together to achieve specific goals. Thus, if all such purposive systems require a designing mind as their principle of order, then it follows that we would need a designing mind for the designing mind as well. Using the same inference, we would need a designing mind for that mind, and so on. Hence, allowing that complex, purposive systems require a designing mind as their principle of order leads to an infinite regress of designing minds. In order to stop this regress while still maintaining the design inference, one must demand that the designer of the universe does not require a designer, and there are two ways to make this claim. Either one could say that the designing mind that created the universe is a necessary being whose existence does not require a causal explanation, or one could simply say that the designer’s existence is brute. Cleanthes rejects the former option in his refutation of Demea’s “argument a priori” and, more generally, Hume does not think that this form of necessity is coherent. The only option then is to declare that the designer’s existence is brute, and therefore does not require a designer for its explanation. However, if this is the case, and we are allowing brute, undesigned existences into our ontology, then Philo asks why not declare that the universe itself is the brute existence instead? If we are allowing one instance where complexity and purposiveness does not imply a designer, then why posit an extraneous entity based on what is for Philo a dubious inference when parsimony should lead us to prefer a brute universe?
Setting aside the Problem of Evil for later, these are the major specific challenges Hume raises for the design argument in the Dialogues. However, Hume generalizes our inability to use theology to make analogical inferences about the world in Section XI of the Enquiry. Call it the Inference Problem. Rather than raising specific objections against the design argument, the Inference Problem instead questions the fruitfulness of the project of natural theology generally. Roughly stated, the Inference Problem is that we cannot use facts about the world to argue for the existence of some conception of a creator, and then use that conception of the creator to reveal further facts about the world, such as the future providence of this world, and so forth.
First, it is important to realize that the Inference Problem is a special case of an otherwise unproblematic inference. In science, we make this type of inference all the time; for instance, using phenomena to infer laws of nature and then using those laws of nature to make further predictions. Since Hume is clearly a proponent of scientific methodology, we must ask why the creator of the universe is a special and problematic case. The short answer is because of the worry of the Dialogues discussed above, that the creation of the cosmos is necessarily a singular event. This means that the Inference Problem for a creator is a special case for two reasons: first, when inferring the existence and attributes of a creator deity, Hume demands that we use all available data, literally anything available in the cosmos that might be relevant to our depiction of the creator rather than limiting the scope of our inquiry to a specific subset of phenomena. Hence, the deity we posit would represent our best guess based on all available information, unlike the case of discovering specific laws. Second, because the creation was a singular event, Hume insists that we cannot use analogy, resemblance, and so forth, to make good inductive inferences beyond what we have already done in positing the deity to begin with. On account of these two unique factors, there is a special Inference Problem that will arise whenever we try to use our inferred notion of a creator in order to discover new facts about the world.
In order to better understand the Inference Problem, let us take a concrete example, inferring a creator deity who is also just. There are only two possibilities: either the totality of the available evidence of the experienced cosmos does not imply the existence of a just creator or it does. If it does not, then we simply are not merited in positing a just deity and we therefore are not justified in assuming, for instance, that the deity’s justice will be discovered later, say in an afterlife. But if the evidence does imply a just creator deity (that is, the world is sufficiently just such as to allow the inference to a just creator), then Hume says we have no reason to think that a just afterlife is needed in order to supplement and correct an unjust world. In either case, says Hume, we are not justified in inferring further facts about the world based on our conception of the deity beyond what we have already experienced. Mutatis mutandis, this type of reasoning will apply to any conclusion drawn from natural theology. Our conception of the deity should be our best approximation based on the totality of available evidence. This means that for Hume, there are only two possibilities: either any relevant data is already considered and included in inferring our conception of the creator to begin with, and we therefore learn nothing new about the world; or the data is inconclusive and simply insufficient to support the inference to the conception of the deity. Hence, we cannot reasonably make it. If the data is not already there, then it cannot be realized from a permissible inference from the nature of the deity. However, if this is right, then the religious hypothesis of natural theology supplies no new facts about the world and is therefore explanatorily impotent.
Hume couches his concerns about theological inference as emanating from problems with drawing an analogical design inference. Since this is not the only type of argument in natural theology, we must now consider Hume’s reasons for rejecting other arguments that support the existence of a creator deity. Hume never makes a clear distinction between what Immanuel Kant later dubbed ontological and cosmological arguments, instead Hume lumps them together under the heading of arguments a priori. Note that this is not as strange as it might first appear, because although cosmological arguments are now uniformly thought of as a posteriori rather than a priori, this was not the case in Hume’s day. It took Hume’s own insights about the a posteriori nature of causation and of the Principle of Sufficient Reason to make us realize this. For Hume, what is common among such ontological and cosmological arguments is that they infer the existence of a necessary being. Hume seems to slip here, failing to distinguish between the logical necessity of the deity concluded by ontological arguments and the metaphysical necessity of the deity concluded by cosmological arguments. He therefore uniformly rejects all such arguments due to the incoherence of a necessary being, a rejection found in both the Dialogues and the first Enquiry.
In Part IX of the Dialogues, Demea presents his “argument a priori,” a cosmological argument based on considerations of necessity and contingency. The argument was intentionally similar to a version proffered by Samuel Clarke, but is also similar to arguments defended by both Leibniz and Aquinas. Before discussing the rejection of this argument, it is significant to note that it is not Philo that rejects Demea’s “argument a priori” but Cleanthes. Philo simply sits back and lets the assault occur without his help. This is telling because Cleanthes is a theist, though for Hume, ultimately misguided about the success of the design argument. The implication, then, is that for Hume, even the philosophical theist who erroneously believes that natural theology can arrive at an informative conception of a deity should still reject the cosmological argument as indefensible.
Cleanthes’ rejection of the argument a priori is ultimately fourfold. The first problem he suggests is a Category Mistake involved in trying to show that the existence of God is something that can be known a priori. For Hume and for Cleanthes, claims about existence are matters of fact, and matters of fact can never be demonstrated a priori. The important distinction between relations of ideas and matters of fact is that the denial of the former is inconceivable, whereas the denial of the latter is not. Hume maintains that we can always imagine a being not existing without contradiction; hence, all existential claims are matters of fact. Cleanthes finds this argument, “entirely decisive” and is “willing to rest the whole controversy upon it” (D 9.5), and it is a point Philo affirms in Part II. Hume argues similarly in the first Enquiry, maintaining that, “The non-existence of any being, without exception, is as clear and distinct an idea as its existence” (EHU 12.28). Hence, its denial is conceivable, and must be a matter of fact.
A related objection is that, since, for Hume, we can always conceive of a being not existing, there can be nothing essential about its existence. It is therefore not the type of property that can be found in a thing’s essence. Hume’s Cleanthes goes so far as to imply that the appellation “necessary existence” actually has no “consistent” meaning and therefore cannot be used in a philosophically defensible argument.
Thirdly, there is the worry mentioned above of allowing the design inference. Even if the inference is correct and we must posit a causeless being, this does not imply that this being is the deity. The inference is only to a necessary being, and for Philo, it is at least as acceptable to posit the universe as necessary in this way rather than positing an extra entity above and beyond it. This is true whether we posit a necessary being in order to stop a designer regress as above, or if we posit it to explain the contingent beings in the universe.
Finally, Hume thinks there is the dubiousness of the inference itself. A crucial premise of the argument a priori is that an infinite regress is impossible, because it violates the Principle of Sufficient Reason. However, Cleanthes takes contention with this claim. Imagine an infinitely long chain in which each event in that chain is explained through the previous members of the series. Note that in this picture, every member of the series is explained, because for any given member, there is always a prior set of members that fully explains it; but if each member of the series has been explained, then you have explained the series. It is unnecessary and inappropriate to insist on an explanation of the series as a whole. For these reasons, Hume concludes that, “The existence, therefore, of any being can only be proved by arguments from its cause or its effect” (EHU 12.29).
In addition to his refutations of the arguments of natural theology, Hume gives positive reasons for rejecting a theistic deity with the Problem of Evil. Hume holds that the evidence of the Problem of Evil counts much more significantly against the theist’s case than the other objections that he raises against a designer, and it is in this area that Philo claims to “triumph” over Cleanthes. Hume’s discussion of the Problem takes place mainly in Parts X and XI of the Dialogues. The discussion is quite thorough, and includes presentations of both the Logical Problem of Evil and the Evidential Problem of Evil. Philo also considers and ultimately rejects several general approaches to solutions.
In Part X, Demea becomes Philo’s unwitting accomplice in generating the Problem of Evil. The two join together to expound an eloquent presentation of moral and natural evil, but with different motives. Demea presents evil as an obstacle that can only be surmounted with the assistance of God. Religion becomes the only escape from this brutish existence. Philo, however, raises the old problem of Epicurus, that the existence of evil is incompatible with a morally perfect and omnipotent deity. Hence, in Part X, Philo defends a version of the logical Problem. Although Philo ultimately believes that, “Nothing can shake the solidity of this reasoning, so short, so clear, so decisive”, he is “contented to retire still from this entrenchment” and, for the sake of argument, is willing to “allow, that pain or misery in man is compatible with infinite power and goodness in the deity” (D 10.34-35, Hume’s emphasis). Philo does not believe that a solution to the logical Problem of Evil is possible but, by granting this concession, he shifts the discussion to the evidential Problem in Part XI.
Hume generally presents the evidential Problem of Evil in two ways: in terms of prior probability and in terms of the likelihood of gratuitous evil. Taking them in order, Demea first hypothesizes a stranger to this world who is dropped into it and shown its miseries. Philo continues along these lines with a similar example in which someone is first shown a house full of imperfections, and is then assured that each flaw prevents a more disastrous structural flaw. For Hume, the lesson of both examples is the same. Just as the stranger to the world would be surprised to find that this world was created by a perfect being, the viewer of the house would be surprised to learn that he was considered a great or perfect architect. Philo asks, “Is the world considered in general…different from what a man…would, beforehand, expect from a very powerful, wise, and benevolent Deity?” (D 11.4, Hume’s emphasis). Since it would be surprising rather than expected, we have reason to think that a perfect creator is unlikely, and that the phenomena do not support such an inference. Moreover, pointing out that each flaw prevents a more disastrous problem does not improve matters, according to Philo.
Apart from these considerations from prior probability, Philo also argues the likelihood of gratuitous evil. To this end, Philo presents four circumstances that account for most of the natural evil in the world. Briefly, these are a) the fact that pain is used as a motivation for action, b) that the world is conducted by general laws, c) that nature is frugal in giving powers, and d) that nature is “inaccurate,” that is, more or less than the optimum level of a given phenomenon, such as rain, can and does occur. As Philo presents these sources of evil during the discussion of the evidential Problem of Evil, his point must be interpreted accordingly. In presenting these sources, all Philo needs to show is that it is likely that at least one of these circumstances could be modified so as to produce less suffering. For instance, in the third circumstance, it seems that, were humans more resistant to hypothermia, this would lead to a slightly better world. In this way, Philo bolsters the likelihood of gratuitous evil by arguing that things could easily have been better than they are.
Having presented the Problem of Evil in these ways, Hume explicitly rejects some approaches to a solution while implicitly rejecting others. First, Demea appeals to Skeptical Theism by positing a deity that is moral in ways that we cannot fathom, but Hume rebuffs this position in several ways. First, Cleanthes denies any appeal to divine mystery, insisting that we must be empiricists rather than speculative theologians. Second, Hume’s Cleanthes insists that, if we make God too wholly other, then we ultimately abandon religion. Hence, in Part XI Cleanthes presents the theist as trapped in a dilemma: either the theist anthropomorphizes the morality of the deity and, in doing so, is forced to confront the Problem of Evil, or he abandons human analogy and, thereby “abandons all religion, and retain[s] no conception of the great object of our adoration” (D 11.1). For Cleanthes, if we cannot fathom the greatness of God, then the deity cannot be an object of praise, nor can we use God to inform some notion of morality. But without these interactions, there is little left for religion to strive toward. We might add a third rejection of the skeptical theist approach: to rationally reject the Problem of Evil without providing a theodicy, we must have independent grounds for positing a good deity. However, Hume has been quite systematic in his attempts to remove these other grounds, rejecting the design and cosmological arguments earlier in the Dialogues, rejecting miracles (and therefore divine revelation) in the Enquiry, and rejecting any pragmatic justification in many works by drawing out the harms of religion. Hence, for Hume, an appeal to divine mystery cannot satisfactorily discharge the Problem of Evil.
Turning to other solutions, Hume does not consider specific theodicies in the Dialogues. Instead, he seems to take the arguments from prior probability and the four circumstances as counting against most or all of them. Going back to the house example, Hume doesn’t seem to think that pointing out that the flaws serve a purpose by preventing more disastrous consequences is sufficient to exonerate the builder. A perfect being should at least be able to reduce the number of flaws or the amount of suffering from its current state. Furthermore, recall that, in focusing on the empirical and in rejecting revealed texts, Hume would not accept any possible retreat to doctrine-specific theodicies such as appeals to the Fall Theodicy or the Satan Theodicy.
Given the amount of evil in the world, Philo ultimately holds that an indifferent deity best explains the universe. There is too much evil for a good deity, too much good for an evil deity, and too much regularity for multiple deities.
Hume wrote the Dialogues roughly in tandem with another work, the Natural History. In its introduction, Hume posits that there are two types of inquiry to be made into religion: its foundations in reason and its origin in human nature. While the Dialogues investigates the former, the explicit task of the Natural History is to explore the latter. In the Natural History, he discharges the question of religion’s foundations in reason by gesturing at the design argument (and the interpretive puzzles discussed above regarding Hume’s views still apply) before focusing on his true task: how various passions give rise to vulgar or false religion.
According to Hume, all religion started as polytheistic. This was due largely to an ignorance of nature and a tendency to assign agency to things. In barbarous times, we did not have the time or ability to contemplate nature as a whole, as uniform. On account of this, we did not understand natural causes generally. In the absence of such understanding, human nature is such that we tend to assign agency to effects, since that is the form of cause and effect that we are most familiar with. This has been well documented in children who will, for instance, talk of a hammer wanting to pound nails. This is especially true of effects that seem to break regularity. Seeing two hundred pounds of meat seemingly moving in opposition to the laws of gravity, is not a miracle, but just a person walking. Primitive humans focused on these breaks in apparent regularity rather than focusing on the regularity itself. While focusing on the latter would lead us to something like a design argument, focusing on the former brings about polytheism. Irregularity can be beneficial, such as a particularly bountiful crop, or detrimental, such as a drought. Thus, on his account, as we exercise our propensity to assign agency to irregularities, a variety of effects gives rise to a variety of anthropomorphized agents. We posit deities that help us and deities that oppose us.
Eventually, Hume says, polytheism gives way to monotheism not through reason, but through fear. In our obsequious praising of these deities, motivated by fear rather than admiration, we dare not assign them limitations, and it is from this fawning praise that we arrive at a single, infinite deity who is perfect in every way, thus transforming us into monotheists. Were this monotheism grounded in reason, its adherence would be stable. Since it is not, there is “flux and reflux,” an oscillation back and forth between anthropomorphized deities with human flaws and a perfect deity. This is because, as we get farther from anthropomorphism, we make our deity insensible to the point of mysticism. Indeed, as Hume’s Cleanthes points out, this is to destroy religion. Therefore, to maintain a relatable deity, we begin to once more anthropomorphize and, when taken too far, we once more arrive at vulgar anthropomorphic polytheism.
Hume insists that monotheism, while more reasonable than polytheism, is still generally practiced in the vulgar sense; that is, as a product of the passions rather than of reason. As he repeatedly insists, the corruption of the best things lead to the worst, and monotheism has two ugly forms which Hume calls “superstition” and “enthusiasm.” Discussed in both the Natural History and the essay, “On Superstition and Enthusiasm”, both of these corrupt forms of monotheism are grounded in inappropriate passions rather than in reason. If we believe that we have invisible enemies, agents who wish us harm, then we try to appease them with rituals, sacrifices, and so forth. This gives rise to priests that serve as intermediaries and petitioners for these invisible agents. This emphasis on fear and ritual is the hallmark of Hume’s “superstition,” of which the Catholicism of his day was his main example. Superstition arises from the combination of fear, melancholy, and ignorance.
Enthusiasm, on the other hand, comes from excessive adoration. In the throes of such obsequious praise, one feels a closeness to the deity, as if one were a divine favorite. The emphasis on perceived divine selection is the hallmark of Hume’s “enthusiasm,” a view Hume saddled to many forms of Protestantism of his day. Enthusiasm thereby arises from the combination of hope, pride, presumption, imagination, and ignorance.
In this way, Hume identifies four different forms of “false” or “vulgar” religion. The first is polytheism, which he sometimes calls “idolatry.” Then there are the vulgar monotheisms, superstition, enthusiasm, and mysticism. Though Hume does not call the last a vulgar religion explicitly, he does insist that it must be faith-based, and therefore does not have a proper grounding in reason. True religion, by contrast, supports the “principles of genuine theism,” and seems to consist mainly in assigning a deity as the source of nature’s regularity. Note that this entails that breaks in reality, such as miracles, count against genuine theism rather than for it. In the Dialogues, Philo has the essence of true religion as maintaining, “that the cause or causes of order in the universe probably bear some remote analogy to human intelligence” (D 12.33). This deity is stripped of the traits that make the design analogy weak, and is further stripped of human passions as, for Philo, it would be absurd to think that the deity has human emotions, especially a need to be praised. Cleanthes, however, supplements his version of true religion by adding that the deity is “perfectly good” (D 12.24). However, because of this added moral component, Cleanthes sees religion as giving morality and order, a position that both Philo and Hume, in the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, deny. Instead, the true religion described by both Hume and Philo is independent of morality. As Yandell (1990: 29) points out, it does not superimpose new duties and motives to the moral framework. True religion does not, therefore, affect morality, and does not lead to “pernicious consequences.” In fact, it does not seem to inform our actions at all. Because true religion cannot guide our actions, Philo holds that the dispute between theists and atheists is “merely verbal.”
A historian by profession, Hume spent much effort in his writings examining religion in its less savory aspects. He deplored the Crusades, and saw Great Britain torn asunder on multiple occasions over the disputes between Catholicism and Protestantism. Based on these historical consequences, Hume saw enthusiasm as affecting society like a violent storm, doing massive damage quickly before petering out. Superstition, however, he saw as a more lingering corruption, involving the invasion of governments, and so forth. Hume argued that, because both belief systems are monotheistic, both must be intolerant by their very nature. They must reject all other deities and ways of appeasing those deities, unlike polytheism which, having no fixed dogma, sits lighter on men’s minds. Generally, Hume held that religion, especially popular monotheism, does more harm than good and he thereby develops a critique of religion based on its detrimental consequences.
Yandell (1990: 283) questions the methodology of such an attack. For him, it is not clear what religion’s socio-political consequences tell us about its truth. However, if we view Hume’s attack against religion as systematic, then consequence-based critiques fulfill a crucial role. Setting aside faith-based accounts, there seem to be three ways to justify one’s belief in religion: through revealed theology, through natural theology, or via pragmatic advantage. Hume denies revealed theology, as his argument against miracles, if successful, entails the unsustainability of most divine experiences and of revealed texts. The Dialogues are his magnum opus on natural theology, working to undermine the reasonability of religion and therefore the appeal to natural theology. If these Humean critiques are successful, then the only remaining path for justifying religious belief is from a practical standpoint, that we are somehow better off for having it or for believing it. Cleanthes argues this way in Part XII of the Dialogues, insisting that corrupt religion is better than no religion at all. However, if Hume is right that religion detracts from rather than contributes to morality, and that its consequences are overall negative, then Hume has closed off this avenue as well, leaving us nothing but faith, or perhaps human nature, on which to rest our beliefs.
Hume wrote all of his philosophical works in English, so there is no concern about the accuracy of an English translation. For the casual reader, any edition of his work should be sufficient. However, Oxford University Press has recently begun to produce the definitive Clarendon Edition of most of his works. For the serious scholar, these are a must have, because they contain copious helpful notes about Hume’s changes in editions, and so forth. The general editor of the series is Tom L. Beauchamp.
C. M. Lorkowski
Kent State University- Trumbull Campus
U. S. A.
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