Edmund Husserl (1859—1938) was an influential thinker of the first half of the twentieth century. His philosophy was heavily influenced by the works of Franz Brentano and Bernard Bolzano, and was also influenced in various ways by interaction with contemporaries such as Alexius Meinong, Kasimir Twardowski, and Gottlob Frege. In his own right, Husserl is considered the founder of twentieth century Phenomenology with influence extending to thinkers such as Martin Heidegger, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and to contemporary continental philosophy generally. Husserl’s philosophy is also being discussed in connection with contemporary research in the cognitive sciences, logic, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of mind, as well as in discussions of collective intentionality. At the center of Husserl’s philosophical investigations is the notion of the intentionality of consciousness and the related notion of intentional content (what Husserl first called ‘act-matter’ and then the intentional ‘noema’). To say that thought is “intentional” is to say that it is of the nature of thought to be directed toward or about objects. To speak of the “intentional content” of a thought is to speak of the mode or way in which a thought is about an object. Different thoughts present objects in different ways (from different perspectives or under different descriptions) and one way of doing justice to this fact is to speak of these thoughts as having different intentional contents. For Husserl, intentionality includes a wide range of phenomena, from perceptions, judgments, and memories to the experience of other conscious subjects as subjects (inter-subjective experience) and aesthetic experience, just to name a few. Given the pervasive role he takes intentionality to play in all thought and experience, Husserl believes that a systematic theory of intentionality has a role to play in clarifying and founding most other areas of philosophical concern, such as the theory of consciousness, the philosophy of language, the philosophy of logic, epistemology, and the philosophies of action and value. This article presents the key elements of Husserl’s understanding of intentionality and intentional content, specifically as these are developed in his works Logical Investigations and Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy.
Franz Brentano (1838—1917) is generally credited with having inspired renewed interest in the idea of intentionality, especially in his lectures and in his 1874 book Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. In this work Brentano is, among other things, concerned to identify the proper sphere or subject matter of psychology. Influenced in various ways by Aristotle’s psychology, by the medieval notion of the intentio of a thought, and by modern philosophical views such as those of Descartes and the empiricists, he identifies intentionality as the mark or distinctive characteristic of the mental. For Brentano this means that every mental phenomenon involves the “intentional inexistence” of an object toward which the mental phenomenon is directed. While every such mental phenomenon has an object, different mental phenomena relate to their objects in different ways depending on whether they are mental acts of presenting something, of judging about something, or of evaluating something as good or bad. Identifying intentionality as the mark of the mental in this way opens up the possibility of studying the mind in terms of its relatedness to objects, the different modes or forms that this relatedness takes (perceiving, imagining, hallucinating, and so forth), and in terms of the relationships that these different modes of intentionality bear to one another (the relationships between presentations, judgments, and evaluations; for example, that every judgment fundamentally depends on a presentation the object of which it is a judgment about). Husserl studied with Brentano from 1884 to 1886 and, along with others such as Alexius Meinong, Kasimir Twardowski, and Carl Stumpf, took away from this experience an abiding interest in the analysis of the intentionality of mind as a key to the clarification of other issues in philosophy.
It is important to note the distinction between intentionality in the sense under discussion here on the one hand and the idea of an intention in the sense of an intelligent agent’s goal or purpose in taking a specific action on the other. The intentionality under consideration here includes the idea of agent’s intentions to do things, but is also much broader, applying to any sort of object-directed thought or experience whatsoever. Thus, while it would be normal to say that “Jack intended to score a point when he kicked the ball toward the goal”, in the sense of ‘intention’ pertinent to Husserl it is equally correct to say that “Jack intended the bird as a blue jay”. This latter being a way of saying that Jack directed his mind toward the bird by thinking of it or perceiving it as a blue jay.
Husserl himself analyzes intentionality in terms of three central ideas: intentional act, intentional object, and intentional content. It is arguably in Husserl’s Logical Investigations that these ideas receive their first systematic treatment as distinct but correlative elements in the structure of thought and experience. This section clarifies these three notions based on Husserl’s main commitments, though not always using his exact terminology.
The intentional act or psychological mode of a thought is the particular kind of mental event that is, whether this be perceiving, believing, evaluating, remembering, or something else. The intentional act can be distinguished from its object, which is the topic, thing, or state of affairs that the act is about. So the intentional state of seeing a white dog can be analyzed in terms of its intentional act, visually perceiving, and in terms of its intentional object, a white dog. Intentional act and intentional object are distinct since it is possible for the same kind of intentional act to be directed at different objects (perceiving a tree vs. perceiving a pond vs. perceiving a house) and for different intentional acts to be directed at the same object (merely thinking about the Eiffel Tower vs. perceiving the Eiffel Tower vs. remembering the Eiffel Tower). At the same time the two notions are correlative. For any intentional mental event it would make no sense to speak of it as involving an act without an intentional object any more than it would to say that the event involved an intentional object but no act or way of attending to that object (no intentional act). The notion of intentionality as a correlation between subject and object is a prominent theme in Husserl’s Phenomenology.
The third element of the structure of intentionality identified by Husserl is the intentional content. It is a matter of some controversy to what extent and in what way intentional content is truly distinct from the intentional object in Husserl’s writings. The basic idea, however, can be stated without too much difficulty.
The intentional content of an intentional event is the way in which the subject thinks about or presents to herself the intentional object. The idea here is that a subject does not just think about an intentional object simpliciter; rather the subject always thinks of the object or experiences it from a certain perspective and as being a certain way or as being a certain kind of thing. Thus one does not just perceive the moon, one perceives it “as bright”, “as half full” or “as particularly close to the horizon”. For that matter, one perceives it “as the moon” rather than as some other heavenly body. Intentional content can be thought of along the lines of a description or set of information that the subject takes to characterize or be applicable to the intentional objects of her thought. Thus, in thinking that there is a red apple in the kitchen the subject entertains a certain presentation of her kitchen and of the apple that she takes to be in it and it is in virtue of this that she succeeds in directing her thought towards these things rather than something else or nothing at all. It is important to note, however, that for Husserl intentional content is not essentially linguistic. While intentional content always involves presenting an object in one way rather than another, Husserl maintained that the most basic kinds of intentionality, including perceptual intentionality, are not essentially linguistic. Indeed, for Husserl, meaningful use of language is itself to be analyzed in terms of more fundamental underlying intentional states (this can be seen, for example, throughout LI, I). For this reason characterizations of intentional content in terms of “descriptive content” have their limits in the context of Husserl’s thought.
The distinction between intentional object and intentional content can be clarified based on consideration of puzzles from the philosophy of language, such as the puzzle of informative identity statements. It is quite trivial to be told that Mark Twain is Mark Twain. However, for some people it can be informative and cognitively significant to learn that Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens. The notion of intentional content can be used to explain this. When a subject thinks about the identity statement asserting that Mark Twain is Mark Twain, the subject thinks about Mark Twain in the same way (using the same intentional content; perhaps “the author of Huckleberry Finn”) in association with the name on both the left and right sides of the identity, whereas when a subject thinks about the identity statement asserting that Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens what he learns is that different intentional contents (those associated with the names ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’ respectively) are true of the same intentional object. Cases such as this both motivate the distinction between intentional content and intentional object and can be explained in terms of it.
The notion of intentional content as distinct from intentional object is also important in relation to the issue of thought about and reference to non-existent objects. Examples of this include perceptual illusions, thought about fictional objects such as Hamlet or Lilliput, thought about impossible objects such as round-squares, and thought about scientific kinds that turn out not to exist such as phlogiston. What is common to each of these cases is that it seems possible to have meaningful experiences, thoughts and beliefs about these things even though the corresponding objects do not exist, at least not in any ordinary sense of ‘exist’. Identifying intentional content as a distinct and meaningful element of the structure of intentionality makes it possible for Husserl to explain such cases of meaningful thought about the non-existent in a way similar to that of Gottlob Frege and different from the strategy of his fellow student of Brentano, Alexius Meinong. Approaching issues of intentionality from the perspective of logic and the philosophy of language, Frege handled such cases by drawing a distinction between the sense or meaning and the referent (object denoted) of a term, and then saying that non-referring terms such as ‘Ulysses’ have senses, but no referents (Frege 1948). Meinong, on the other hand, was driven by his commitment to the thesis of intentionality to posit a special category of objects, the non-existing objects or objects that have Nichtsein, as the intentional objects of such thoughts (Meinong 1960). For Husserl, such cases involve an intentional act and intentional content where the intentional content does present an intentional object, but there is no real object at all corresponding to the intentional appearance. Given this, one way of reading the distinction between intentional content and intentional object is as a generalization to all mental acts of Frege’s primarily linguistic distinction between the senses and the referents of terms and sentences (for a defense of this interpretation see Føllesdal 1982, while for discussion and resistance to the view, see Drummond 1998). Husserl’s exact understanding of the ontological situation regarding intentional objects is quite involved and undergoes some changes between Logical Investigations and his later phenomenology, beginning with Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy. However, throughout his work Husserl is able to make use of the distinction between intentional content and intentional object to handle cases of meaningful thought about the non-existent without having to posit, in Meinongian fashion, special categories of non-existent objects.
The basic structure of Husserl’s account of intentionality thus involves three elements: intentional act, intentional content and intentional object. For Husserl, the systematic analysis of these elements of intentionality lies at the heart of the theory of consciousness, as well as, in varying ways, of logic, language and epistemology.
Logical Investigations (hereafter ‘Investigations’), which came out in two volumes in the years 1900 and 1901, represents Husserl’s first definitive treatment of intentionality and is the source of the main ideas that would drive much of his later philosophical thinking. The primary project of the Investigations is to criticize a view in the philosophy of logic called “psychologism” according to which the laws of logic are in some sense natural laws or rules governing the human mind and can thus be studied empirically by psychology. Husserl, notably in agreement with Frege, believed that this view had the undesirable consequences of treating the laws of logic as contingent rather than necessarily true and as being empirically discoverable rather than as known and validated a priori. In the first part of the Investigations, the “Prolegomena to Pure Logic”, Husserl systematically criticizes the psychologistic view and proposes to replace it with his own conception of “pure logic” as the a priori framework for organizing, understanding and validating the results of the formal, natural and social sciences (Husserl called the “theory of scientific theory in general” that pure logic was to be the foundation for ‘Wissenschaftslehre’). For Husserl, pure logic is an a priori system of necessary truths governing entailment and explanatory relationships among propositions that does not in any way depend on the existence of human minds for its truth or validity. However, Husserl maintains that the task of developing a human understanding of pure logic requires investigations into the nature of meaning and language, and into the way in which conscious intentional thought is able to comprehend meanings and come to know logical (and other) truths. Thus the bulk of a work that is intended to lay the foundations for a theory of logic as a priori, necessary, and completely independent of the composition or activities of the mind is devoted precisely to systematic investigations into the way in which language, meaning, thought, and knowledge are intentionally structured by the mind. While this tension is more apparent than real, it was a major source of criticism directed against the first edition of Logical Investigations, one which Husserl was concerned to clarify and defend himself against in his subsequent writings and in the second edition of the Investigations in 1913. Pertinent here is what Husserl had to say about language and expression (LI, I) and about intentionality itself (LI, V & VI).
In Logical Investigations Husserl developed a view according to which conscious acts are primarily intentional, and a mental act is intentional only in case it has an act-quality and an act-matter. Introducing this key distinction, Husserl writes:
The two assertions ‘2 x 2 = 4’ and ‘Ibsen is the principal founder of modern dramatic realism’, are both, qua assertions, of one kind; each is qualified as an assertion, and their common feature is their judgment-quality. The one, however, judges one content and the other another content. To distinguish such ‘contents’ from other notions of ‘content’ we shall speak here of the matter (material) of judgment. We shall draw similar distinctions between quality and matter in the case of all acts (LI, V § 20, p. 586).
An additional notion in the Investigations, which grows in importance in Husserl’s later work and will be discussed here, is the act-character. Husserl views act-quality, act-matter and act-character as mutually dependent constituents of a concrete particular thought. Just as there cannot be color without saturation, brightness and hue, so for Husserl there cannot be an intentional act without quality, matter and character. The quality of an act (called ‘intentional act’ above) is the kind of act that it is, whether perceiving, imagining, judging, wishing, and so fotrth. The matter of an act is what has been called above its intentional content, it is the mode or way in which an object is thought about, for example a house intended from one perspective rather than another, or Napoleon thought of first as “the victor at Jena”, then as “the vanquished at Waterloo”. The character of an act can be thought of as a contribution of the act-quality that is reflected in the act-matter. Act-character has to do with whether the content of the act, the act-matter, is posited as existing or as merely thought about and with whether the act-matter is taken as given with evidence (fulfillment) or without evidence (emptily intended). The next two sub-sections deal with act-character and act-matter respectively.
In the Investigations and in his later work, Husserl sometimes writes of an additional dimension in the analysis of intentionality, which he first calls the “act-character” and then in later writings the “doxic and ontic modalities” (For the former, see for example LI, VI § 7; for the latter, see Ideas, Chapter 4 particularly §§ 103—10). In the Investigations, act-character includes such things as whether the intentional act is merely one of reflecting on a possibility (a “non-positing act”) or one of judging or asserting that something is the case (a “positing act”), as well as the degree of evidence that is available to support the intention of the act as fulfilled or unfulfilled (as genuinely presenting some object in just the way that the act-matter suggests, or not). It seems clear that the character of an act is ultimately traceable to the act-quality, since it has to do with the way in which an act-matter is thought about rather than with what that act-matter itself presents. However, it is a contribution of the act-quality that casts a shadow or a halo around the matter, giving the content of the act a distinctive character. This becomes clearer through consideration of particular cases.
Consider first positing and non-positing acts. When a subject wonders whether or not the train will be on time, the content or act-matter of her intention is that of the train being on time. However, in this case the subject is not positing that the train will be on time, but merely reflecting on this in a non-committal (“non-positing”) way as a possibility. The same difference is present in the case of merely wondering whether Bob is the murderer on the one hand (non-positing act), and forming the firm judgment that he is on the other (positing act) (on positing and non-positing acts, see LI, V §§ 38—42).
The character of an intentional act also has to do with whether it is an “empty” merely signitive intention or whether it is a “non-empty” or fulfilled intention. Here what is at issue is the extent to which a subject has evidence of some sort for accepting the content of their intention. For example, a subject could contemplate, imagine or even believe that “the sun set today will be beautiful with few clouds and lots of orange and red colors” already at eleven in the morning. At this point the intention is an empty one because it merely contemplates a possible state of affairs for which there is no intuitive (experiential) evidence. When the same subject witnesses the sun set later in the day, her intention will either be fulfilled (if the sunset matches what she thought it would be like) or unfulfilled (if the sun set does not match her earlier intention). For Husserl, the difference here too does not have to do with the content or act-matter itself, but rather with the evidential character of the intention (LI VI, §§ 1—12).
Importantly, the distinctions between positing and non-positing acts on the one hand and between empty and fulfilled intentions on the other are separate. It would be possible for a subject to posit the existence of something for which she had no evidence or fulfillment (perhaps the belief that her favorite candidate will win next year’s election), just as it would be possible for a subject to not posit or affirm something for which she did have fulfillment or evidence (such as refraining from believing that water causes sticks immersed in it to bend, in spite of immediate perceptual information supporting this).
As noted above, the matter of an intentional act is its content: the way in which it presents the intentional object as being. The act-matter is:
that element in an act which first gives it reference to an object, and reference so wholly definite that it not merely fixes the object meant in a general way, but also the precise way in which it is meant. (LI, V § 20, p. 589, italics Husserl’s)
So the act-matter both determines to what object, if any, a thought refers, and determines how the thought presents that object as being. For Husserl, the matter of an intentional act does not consist of only linguistic descriptive content. The notion of act-matter is simply that of the significant object-directed mode of an act, and can be perceptual, imaginative, or memorial, linguistic or non-linguistic, particular and indexical, or general, context-neutral and universal. This makes intentionality and intentional content (act-matter) the fundamental targets of analysis, with the theory of language and expression to be analyzed in terms of these notions rather than the other way around. Husserl is thus committed to the notion that intentionality is primary and language secondary, and so also to the view that meaningful non-linguistic intentional thought and experience are both possible and common (LI, I §§ 9—11, 19, & 20).
Husserl’s understanding of the metaphysics of act-matter is also important. Motivated by his anti-psychologism he wants to treat meanings as objective and independent of the minds of particular subjects. Because of this Husserl views meanings in the Investigations as “ideal species”, a kind of abstract entity akin to a universal. However, having done this Husserl also needs to explain how it is that these abstract meanings can play a role in the intentional thought of actual subjects. Husserl’s solution to this is to say that meanings are ideal species or kinds of act-matter that are then instantiated in the actual act-matter of particular intentional subjects when they think the relevant thoughts. Thus, just as there is an ideal species or universal for shape, which gets instantiated in particular instances of shaped objects in the world, so there is an ideal species or universal of the act-matter “2+2=4”, which gets instantiated in the act-matter of a particular subject when he thinks this thought. Whereas Fregean accounts deal with the fact that one individual can have the same thought at different times and different individuals can think about the same thing at any time by positing a single abstract sense that is the numerically identical content of all of their thoughts, Husserl views particular act-matters or contents as instances of ideal act-matter species. Thus, on Husserl’s view, two subjects are able to think about the same thing in the same way when both of them instantiate exactly similar instances of a single kind of content or act-matter. Thus if John and Sarah are both thinking about how they would like to see the Twins win the 2008 World Series in baseball, they are having the same thought and thinking about the same objects in virtue of instantiating exactly similar act-matter instances of the single act-matter species “the Twins win the 2008 World series in baseball” (LI, I §§ 30—4, V §§ 21 & 45).
Largely motivated by his concern with developing a pure logic, Husserl devotes the entire first Logical Investigation, “Meaning and Expression”, to an analysis of issues of language, linguistic meaning and linguistic reference. Husserl’s discussion here is systematic and wide ranging, covering many issues that are also of concern to Frege in his analysis of language and that have continued to spur discussion in the philosophy of language up to the present. These include the distinction between linguistic types and tokens, the distinction between words and sentences and the meanings that these express, the distinction between sentence meaning and speaker meaning, the meaning and reference of proper names and the function of indexicals and demonstratives. As noted above, Husserl takes the intentionality of thought to be fundamental and the meaning-expressing and reference fixing capabilities of language to be parasitic on more basic features of intentionality. Here the main features of Husserl’s intentionality-based view of language are discussed.
Husserl is interested in analyzing the meaning and reference of language as part of his project of developing a pure logic. This leads him to focus primarily on declarative sentences from ordinary language, rather than on other kinds of potentially meaningful signs (such as the way in which smoke normally indicates or is a sign of fire) and gestures (such as the way in which a grimace might indicate or convey that someone feels pain or is uncomfortable). Husserl thus uses ‘expression’ to refer to declarative sentences in natural language and to parts thereof, such as names, general nouns, indexicals,and so forth (LI, I §§ 1—5).
Husserl maintains that the meaning of an expression cannot be identical to the expression for two reasons. First, expressions in different languages, such as ‘the cat is friendly’ and ‘il gatto è simpatico’ are linguistically different, but have the same meaning. Additionally, the same linguistic expression, such as ‘I am going to the bank’ can have different meanings on different occasions (due in this case to the ambiguity of the word ‘bank’). Thus sameness of word or linguistic expression is neither necessary nor sufficient for sameness of meaning (LI, I §§ 11 & 12).
Husserl also maintains that the meaning of a linguistic expression cannot be identical with its referent or referents. In support of this Husserl appeals to phenomena such as informative identity statements and meaningful linguistic expressions that have no referent, among others. An example of the first sort of case would be Frege’s famous ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’, where ‘Hesperus’ means “the evening star” and ‘Phosphorus’ means “the morning star”. Both ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ refer to the planet Venus and so if the meaning of a term just is the object that it refers to, then anyone who knows that Hesperus is Hesperus should also know that Hesperus is Phosphorus, yet clearly this is not the case. Husserl’s own explanation for this would be that a subject who found ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ informative would do so because he associated different act-matters or intentional contents with each of these names. Thus Husserl, like Frege, distinguishes the meaning of a term or expression both from that term itself and from the object or objects to which the term refers. Husserl identifies these distinctive linguistic meanings as kinds of intentional act-matter (LI, I §§ 13 & 14).
In the Investigations Husserl describes the normal use of an expression, such as ‘the weather is cool today’, in the following way. A subject who utters this expression to a companion is in an intentional state, which includes an act-matter or intentional content that presents the weather as being cool today. This act-matter instantiates an ideal species or act-matter type “the weather is cool today” and in virtue of doing so directs the utterer’s attention to the actual state of affairs regarding the weather. It is in virtue of these facts about the utterer’s intentional states that the words express, for him, the meaning that they do (which is not, of course, to rule out the possibility of miscommunication; for Husserl the description here is just the standard case). The subject performing the utterance does, in principle, three things for his interlocutor. First, the subject’s utterance “expresses” the ideal meaning “the weather is cool today”. Second, assuming the interlocutor grasps that this is what is being expressed, her attention will itself be directed to the referent of this ideal sense, namely the state of affairs involving the weather today (her act-matter will then also instantiate the relevant ideal act-matter species). Third, the subject will, in making his utterance, “intimate” to his interlocutor that he has certain beliefs or is undergoing certain mental states or experiences. This last point is very important for Husserl. He maintains that in normal cases what a subject intimates in uttering an expression (that he believes that the weather is cool today or that he fears that his country will intervene) is not part of the meaning of that expression, even though it is something that the interlocutor will be able to understand on the basis of the subject’s utterance. It is only in cases where a subject is making an assertion about his experiences, attitudes or mental states (such as ‘I doubt that things will improve this year’) that expressed meaning and intimated meaning coincide (on intimation, see LI, I §§ 7 & 8; the majority of the points summarized here are in the first chapter of LI, I, which is §§ 1—16).
Husserl recognized clearly the need for a distinction between what he called “objective” expressions on the one hand, and those that are “essentially occasional” on the other. An example of an objective expression would be a statement concerning logic, mathematics or the sciences whose meaning is fixed regardless of the context in which it is used (for example ‘The Pythagorean Theorem is a theorem of geometry’ or ‘7+5=12’). An example of an essentially occasional expression would be a sentence such as ‘I am hungry’, which seems to in some sense change its meaning on different occasions of utterance, depending on who is speaking. According to Husserl, essentially occasional expressions include both indexicals (‘I’, ‘you’, ‘here’, ‘now’, and so forth) and demonstratives (‘this’, ‘that’ , and so forth). Such expressions have two facets of meaning. The first is what Husserl calls a constant “semantic function” associated with particular indexical expressions. For example, “It is the universal semantic function of the word ‘I’ to designate whoever is speaking…” (LI, I §26, p. 315). Husserl recognizes, however, that the sentences expressing these semantic functions cannot simply be substituted for indexicals without affecting the meaning of sentences containing them. A subject who believes “whoever is now speaking is hungry” effectively has an existentially quantified belief to the effect that the person, whoever he or she is, who is now speaking is hungry. In order to capture what such a subject would mean when he says ‘I am hungry’ it is necessary to somehow make it clear that the individual quantified over is indeed the person now speaking, but there seems to be no way to do this other than to re-insert the indexical ‘I’ itself in the sentence. This makes it necessary to identify a second facet or component of indexical content.
To deal with this, Husserl proposes a distinction between the semantic function or “indicating meaning” of indexicals, which remains constant from use to use, and the “indicated” meaning of indexicals, which is fundamentally cued to certain features of the speaker and context of utterance. Thus the “indicating meaning” of ‘I’ is always “whoever is now speaking”, but the indicated meaning of its use on a given occasion is keyed to the “self-awareness” or “self-presentation” of the speaker on that occasion. In general, the indicating meaning of an indexical will specify some general relationship between the utterance of a sentence and some feature of the speaker’s conscious awareness or perceptually given environment, while the indicated meaning will be determined by what the speaker is actually aware of in the context in which the sentence is uttered. In the case of many indexicals, such as ‘you’ and ‘here’ their indicating meaning may be supplied in part by demonstrative pointing to features of the immediate perceptual environment. Thus, Husserl writes, “The meaning of ‘here’ is in part universal and conceptual [semantic function/indicating meaning], inasmuch as it always names a place as such, but to this universal element the direct place-presentation [indicated meaning] attaches, varying from case to case” (LI I § 26, pp. 317—18). Husserl thus has a relatively clear understanding of some of the key issues surrounding indexical thought and reference that have been recently discussed in the work of philosophers of language such as John Perry (1977, 1979), as well as an account of how indexical thought and reference works. The question of whether or not this account is adequate to resolve all of the issues raised by contemporary discussions of indexicals and demonstratives, however, is one that goes beyond the scope of this article (for discussion of this issue in Husserl’s philosophy see Smith and McIntyre 1982, pp. 194—226).
In the year 1913 Husserl published both a revised edition of Logical Investigations and the Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy (hereafter, Ideas). Between the first publication of the Investigations and the works of 1913 the main transition in Husserl’s thought is a change in emphasis from the primary project of laying the foundations of a pure a priori logic to the primary project of developing a systematic phenomenology of consciousness with the theory of intentionality at its core. In the Ideas, Husserl proposes the systematic description and analysis of first person consciousness, focusing on the intentionality of this consciousness, as the fundamental first step in both the theory of consciousness itself and, by extension, in all other areas of philosophy as well. With hints of the idea already present in the first edition of Logical Investigations, by 1913 Husserl has come to see first person consciousness as epistemologically and so logically prior to other forms of knowledge and inquiry. Whereas Descartes took his own conscious awareness to be epistemically basic and then immediately tried to infer, based on his knowledge of this awareness, the existence of a God, an external world, and other knowledge, Husserl takes first-person conscious awareness as epistemically basic and then proposes the systematic study of this consciousness itself as a fundamental philosophical task. In order to lay the foundations for this project Husserl proposes a methodology known as the phenomenological reduction.
The phenomenological reduction involves performing what Husserl calls the epoché, which is carried out by “bracketing”, setting in abeyance, or “neutralizing” the existential thesis of the “natural attitude”. The idea behind this is that most people most of the time do not focus their attention on the structure of their experience itself but rather look past this experience and focus their attention and interests on objects and events in the world, which they take to be unproblematically real or existent. This assumption about the unproblematic existence of the objects of experience is the “existential thesis” of the natural attitude. The purpose of the epoché is not to doubt or reject this thesis, but simply to set it aside or put it out of play so that the subject engaging in phenomenological investigation can reorient the focus of her attention to her experiences qua experiences and just as they are experienced. This amounts to a reorienting of the subject’s intentional focus from the natural to the phenomenological attitude. A subject who has performed the epoché and adopted the phenomenological attitude is in a position to objectively describe the features of her experience as she experiences them, the phenomena. Questions of the real existence of particular objects of experience and even of the world or universe themselves are thus set aside in order to make way for the systematic study of first person conscious experience (Ideas, §§ 27—32; Natanson 1973, chapters 2 & 3).
Distinct from the phenomenological reduction, but important for the project of Husserl’s Phenomenology as a whole, is what is sometimes called the “eidetic reduction”. The eidetic reduction involves not just describing the idiosyncratic features of how things appear to one, as might occur in introspective psychology, but focusing on the essential characteristics of the appearances and their structural relationships and correlations with one another. Husserl calls insights into essential features of kinds of things “eidetic intuitions”. Such eidetic intuitions, or intuitions into essence, are the result of a process Husserl calls ‘eidetic’ or ‘free’ variation in imagination. It involves focusing on a kind of object, such as a triangle, and systematically varying features of that object, reflecting at each step on whether the object being reflected upon remains, in spite of its altered feature(s), an instance of the kind under consideration. Each time the object does survive imaginative feature alteration that feature is revealed as inessential, while each feature the removal of which results in the object intuitively ceasing to instantiate the kind (such as addition of a fourth side to a triangle) is revealed as a necessary feature of that kind. Husserl maintained that this procedure can incrementally reveal elements of the essence of a kind of thing, the ideal case being one in which intuition of the full essence of a kind occurs. The eidetic reduction compliments the phenomenological reduction insofar as it is directed specifically at the task of analyzing essential features of conscious experience and intentionality. The considerations leading to the initial positing of the distinction between intentional act, intentional object and intentional content would, according to Husserl, be examples of this method at work and of some of its results in the domain of the mental. Whereas the purpose of the phenomenological reduction is to disclose and thematize first person consciousness so that it can be described and analyzed, the purpose of the eidetic reduction is to focus phenomenological investigations more precisely on the essential or invariant features of conscious intentional experience. (Ideas, §§ 34 & 69—71; Natanson 1973, chapter 4).
There is much debate about the exact significance, especially metaphysical and epistemological, of Husserl’s shift in focus and introduction of the methodology of the phenomenological reduction in the Ideas. Important here is that the notions of intentionality and intentional content remain central to Husserl’s project and so many of the descriptions and results of the Investigations remain relevant for the Ideas. However, Husserl does both modify and expand his views about intentionality, as well as the kinds of analyses of it that he pursues. Whereas in the Investigations Husserl was interested in intentionality specifically in relation to the project of laying the foundations for pure logic, in the Ideas he is interested in giving a systematic account of the ways in which intentionality structures, “constitutes”, and so makes possible all types of cognition, including the awareness of self, time, physical objects, mathematical objects, an intersubjective social world and many other things besides. The sections that follow concentrate on the core ideas concerning intentionality and intentional content from the Ideas, leaving many of these other areas out of consideration.
One change between the Investigations and the Ideas is that Husserl began using the term ‘noesis’ to refer to intentional acts or “act-quality” and ‘noema’ (plural ‘noemata’) to refer to what, in the Investigations had been referred to as “act-matter”. Husserl does not simply change his terminology, however. This change in terminology coincides with an apparent change in metaphysical understanding of the relationship between the noema as an ideal meaning and the particular mental activities of actual subjects, and also with a much more intense interest in analyzing the different elements of the noema, as well as understanding its relationships, both temporal and semantic, to other noemata.
Metaphysically the main change is that Husserl seems to abandon the model of meanings as ideal species that get instantiated in the act-matters of particular subjects in favor of a more direct correlative relationship between the noesis (intentional acts) and the noemata (their objects). In Ideas it is noemata themselves that are the objects of intentional thought, that are graspable and repeatable and that, according to Husserl, are not parts of the intentional acts of conscious subjects. It is a point of interpretative and philosophical contention whether the noema, as Husserl understood it, is better viewed as a sort of abstract Fregean sense that mediates between the subjective noetic acts of individual thinkers and the objective referents of their thoughts (Føllesdal 1982, Smith and McIntyre 1982), or whether the noema is better seen as the object of intentional thought itself as viewed from a particular perspective (Drummond 1990). While the difference between these two interpretations may seem rather small, they are actually quite different in terms of their metaphysical commitments and in terms of the particular issues of meaning, reference, and epistemology that they are able to resolve or be challenged by. For a general introduction and overview see the introduction to (Smith and Smith 1995) and for more detailed discussion of some of the main differences see (Dreyfus and Hall 1982, Zahavi 1994, Drummond 2003). No attempt will be made to resolve this interpretative dispute here, though it is worth noting that the question of the metaphysical status of the noesis, the noema, and the intentional object (if indeed this is to be viewed as a distinct entity in Husserl’s ontology) is in part complicated by Husserl’s methodological procedure of bracketing questions of existence.
In the Ideas Husserl identifies three central features of the noema, focusing especially on the case of perception. Husserl first distinguishes between a component of sense or descriptive content on the one hand (accounting for the mode of presentation or description under which the object is intended), and a core component standing for or presenting the very identity of the object intended, a sort of pure “X” as Husserl calls it, underlying the various contents or noemata that are correlated with a single object of thought. What Husserl is focusing on here is the idea that to be conscious of an object is not just to be conscious of something under one description or way of viewing it, but it is also to be conscious of the object as an identity of its own, one that is simultaneously given through discrete noematic perspectives or experiences, but is also more than what any one of these experiences presents it as being. When Husserl says that there is a noematic “core” or underlying “X” in the noema, what he means is that when we think of an object we always think of it as an entity with its own identity as well as an object as it appears to us or is thought of by us. Related to this point, Husserl maintains that the intention of an object via a certain noema at one moment involves, not only intending the object as it is currently experienced, but also contains a third element consisting of pointing references to a “horizon” of further possible determinations of the object, to further noemata or ways of being directed to one and the same object that are either motivated by or consistent with the way in which the current intention presents that object. The structure of the noema is thus quite complex, consisting of a noematic core, some descriptive or presentational content, and a horizon containing pointing references to other possible ways (noemata) of experiencing one and the same identical object (some of the most definitive sections on noesis and noema are Ideas, §§ 128—35, however the concepts are first introduced over two chapters from §§ 76—96).
Consider the perceptual experience of a red barn in a field in southeastern Wisconsin. The intentional content or noema of this experience will provide immediate awareness of one side or profile of the barn, perhaps intended as a barn, or perhaps just intended as a structure of some sort. This will be the descriptive sense or content of the intention. However, in this very perception the barn is not experienced as merely a facet or a two-dimensional stretch of color in space. Rather, it is experienced as a three dimensional object possessing other sides, parts and properties, and capable of being explored, investigated and determined, in short intended with regard to each of these further features. The barn, as an object of perception, transcends the information that can be given regarding it, the intention of it that can be made via any given noema, and this fact is a feature that is already intended in the very first thought a subject has about the barn. This is what is meant by the term ‘horizon’ or ‘noematic horizon’. From the first experience, the subject already has a sense of how to go about further determining, further intending and experiencing the object of thought, in this case, the barn. Perhaps the current experience is of the front side of the barn as being red; then this very experience includes as part of its “noematic horizon” the intention that the barn must also have a back side of some sort, and that this side of the barn, along with its color (perhaps it also is red, or perhaps grey, but at any rate it must have some color) can be experienced if the subject walks around to it and looks. In each further experience of the barn, in each further determination of it in thought, it is one and the same barn that is itself given, one and the same definite identity or object “X” that underlies all of the particular presentations of the same object, and that unites them in a “synthesis of identity” to provide a continuous and, ideally, unbroken series of further determinations of the same object, of further intentional experiences in which more is “filled in” or determined about the way the object actually is. Regarding such a system of experiences of the same object, Husserl says,
…There is inherent in each noema a pure object-something as a point of unity and, at the same time, we see how in a noematic respect two sorts of object-concepts are to be distinguished: this pure point of unity, this noematic “object simpliciter,” and the “object in the How of its determinations”—including undeterminednesses which for the time being “remain open” and, in this mode, are co-meant. (Ideas, § 131, p. 314)
Here, the “point of unity” is the underlying core of intended object identity “X”, the “object in the How of its determinations” is the descriptive content or sense, and the “undeterminednesses” constitute the horizon of the current content. Thus, it is possible to distinguish, phenomenologically speaking, between the way in which the object is intended via a particular noema or sense, and the seemingly transcendent self-identical object that is intended, and which is the ultimate determinant of the accuracy or inaccuracy, truth or falsity of the intentions that are directed toward it. While this distinction between the descriptive content and the identical X in a noema is phenomenologically real, this does not mean that these are “really separable” parts of the content in such a way that it would be possible to experience the one in the absence of the other. Indeed, Husserl explicitly denies this possibility.
This conception of the noema, as divided into a descriptive sense and the pure X or identity of the object intended via the sense, leads Husserl to the view that, phenomenologically speaking, it is possible to view an object (the underlying X) as determining a system of possible senses (noemata) or intentions of it, each of which is both (a) about that very same object and (b) able to be consciously recognized as about the same determinable X as the others when they are experienced in a sequence. Thus, in the example of the barn already discussed, a subject might begin by looking at it from the front and focusing on its color. This would be the first noema intending the very object X, the barn perceptually before one, as red. The subject could then go on to have further perceptual intentions of the barn by walking around it. Each time the subject shifts her perspective on or reconceptualizes the object of her thought, she entertains a new content or noema, a new possible way in which the barn can be experienced as being. If the barn is indeed the way she conceptualizes and experiences it, then that thought, that possibility is fulfilled by her ongoing experience. At each step the subject integrates her current experience with the previous one, identifying the X at the core of the current experience with the X at the core of the previous ones, and is at the same time directed toward new possible ways of filling out her experience of the barn in the horizon of the noema (for example by walking around it some more, or by going inside); Husserl refers to this process as a “synthesis of identity”. During the course of this “explication” of the horizon of the noema, it is always possible that some future experience will reveal the ones that have come before to have been in some fundamental way incorrect. For example, if the subject upon walking around to the back side of the barn discovers that it is really not a barn at all, but only a cleverly positioned façade, the original system of intentional experiences she had regarding it will be frustrated and a new system of intentions will begin.
Nevertheless, the idea that a single numerically identical object can be conceived, phenomenologically speaking, as the correlate of systems of contents or noemata all experienceable as directed towards one and the same object X gives rise, for Husserl, to the idea of an object as, phenomenologically speaking, the correlate of a complete set of such experiences. As Husserl puts it, using ‘perfect givenness’ to suggest the ideally possible experience of having gone through all of the possible correct intentions with regard to a given object:
But perfect givenness is nevertheless predesignated as “Idea” (in the Kantian sense)—as a system which, in its eidetic type, is an absolutely determined system of endless processes of continuous appearings, or as a field of these processes, an a priori determined continuum of appearances with different, but determined, dimensions, and governed throughout by a fixed set of eidetic laws…This continuum is determined more precisely as infinite on all sides, consisting of appearances in all its phases of the same determinable X so ordered in its concatenations and so determined with respect to the essential contents that any of its lines yields, in its continuous course, a harmonious concatenation (which itself is to be designated as a unity of mobile appearances) in which the X, given always as one and the same, is more precisely and never “otherwise” continuously-harmoniously determined. (Ideas, § 143, p. 342)
Here, then, we have what amounts to an analysis of the object of an intention considered from a phenomenological perspective. To be an object, phenomenologically speaking, is to be the correlate of a complete maximally consistent system of noematic senses, all synthesizable as directed towards one and the same underlying substrate or object X. This idea itself is given rise to by the three crucial features of the structure of definite intentional content that have been discussed here: the descriptive sense, the core content “X”, and the horizon of possible future experiences of one and the same object
David W. Smith and Ronald McIntyre have further developed Husserl’s account of the horizon of a noema at some length, and propose a distinction between kinds of possible further determinations of the object of a given thought that are predelineated in the horizon of a given noema (1982, pp. 246—56). It is possible to distinguish between (i) possible determinations that are motivated by the current noema or intentional content, (ii) possible determinations that are consistent with but not motivated by the current noema, and (iii) possible determinations that are neither motivated by nor consistent with the current noema. If a subject is intending a given object perceived from a particular side as a barn, then the motivated further determinations in the horizon will include further experiences of that same object as a barn: walking around it will reveal more barn-like sides, going inside will reveal that it is or has been used for certain purposes, more closely examining the material the walls are made of will reveal that they are not papier-mâché, and so forth. Now, there will still be divergent motivated possibilities. For example, barns can be made of either wood, or aluminum, or some combination of these with stone or of some other materials entirely, and they can also have many different colors, designs and particular interior layouts. Nevertheless, what makes each of these possibilities motivated is the fact that it is consistent with the object intended being exactly the kind of thing that it is currently intended as.
By contrast, a possible determination that is consistent with but unmotivated by the current perception of a barn as a barn is that the subject walks around to the back and discovers that the barn is really just a wooden barn façade erected to stimulate tourism in the area. This possible further experience is not totally inconsistent with a current experience of something as a barn, though it is not a motivated possibility relative to such an experience either. Finally, an experience that is neither motivated by nor consistent with the intention of an object as a barn would be the discovery that the current object is merely a complicated video image, or that it is some kind of new and heretofore undiscovered life form that just happens to look exactly like a barn when it is resting. A discovery such as this is, arguably, not even present in the horizon of the original noema to begin with. Husserl referred to experiences where the previously intended identity of an experienced object is entirely cancelled by some current experience as cases where the object intended “explodes”, and where it is unclear that the subject was really thinking about the object actually before her at all even if she was succeeding in referring to it in some minimal sense of the term (Ideas, §§ 138 & 151).
Husserl’s understanding of the noema in the Ideas retains the explanatory features (in terms of theory of language and its ability to resolves puzzles about meaningful reference to the non-existent, informative identity statements, and so forth) of Logical Investigations account while also incorporating a more nuanced analysis of the structure of intentional content itself and a more holistic understanding of how the intentional content (noema) that a subject is thinking at a given moment is interconnected with other features of that subject’s actual and possible experience (the systems of noemata).
In the Investigations Husserl retains an understanding of the “act-character” of an intentional event as being its quality of positing or not positing the existence of its object and of being evidentially empty or fulfilled. Referring to these characters as “modalities” of belief (“doxic” modalities) and experience, Husserl recognizes both the already identified modalities pertaining to beliefs and also additional “ontic” modalities pertaining to whether a subject takes the content of their intention to be necessary or merely possible, valuable or worthless, beautiful or ugly. The key feature of these noematic characters or modalities is that they are characteristics of thought and experience that affect its overall meaning for the subject but that are not, strictly speaking, represented in the content of the intention (the noema) itself.
The notions of empty and fulfilled intentions in conjunction with Husserl’s understanding of the noematic horizon and of systems of possible interrelated object-experiences allow him to continue the epistemological investigations begun earlier in the Sixth Logical Investigation along two major lines.
The first is the idea that the mere unfulfilled intention of an object or state of affairs, by its nature, dictates certain conditions of fulfillment or conditions under which the thought merely entertained in the current intention would be given with full and complete evidence or intuition. For example, the emptily intended thought of a beautiful sunset with lots of red and gold today has as its primary fulfillment conditions the direct perceptual intuition of a sunset matching in all relevant ways the content that it currently intends emptily. Husserl maintains that intentional beliefs and thoughts involving many different kinds of objects (physical objects, other minds, mathematical objects or proofs, abstract objects, scientific theories) all have fulfillment conditions that dictate what kinds of experiences and thought processes are necessary to bring them to evidential groundedness. Already in Logical Investigations Husserl saw this task as an essential contribution that phenomenology could make to epistemology and the theory of evidence and he continues to carry it out in the final chapters of the Ideas and in his later works.
The second idea that comes into its own with Husserl’s Phenomenology and understanding of the structure of intentionality is the idea of “constitution analysis” (Ideas, §§ 149—53). Husserl’s basic idea here is that consciousness of each kind of object of thought and experience, and of each noetic mode of being aware of the objects of experience (perception, introspection, reflection, imagination, reasoning, and so forth) is the result of a complex interworking of other intentional acts. However, some ways of thinking and experiencing are more basic or fundamental, while others depend or are founded on these basic intentions in very specific ways. As a simple example, the act of judging that something is the case presupposes some other act in which the idea or possibility of this thing’s being the case has been made available. It would be impossible to judge that something is (or is not the case) without a prior act familiarizing one with its existence or possibility in the first place. Husserl views awareness of complex intentional objects as the result of those objects having been “constituted” out of or on the basis of a series of more basic intentional states (Husserl usually identifies the most basic intentional experiences with various aspects of perception and introspection). Thus, a full phenomenological analysis of the cognition of a given kind of complex object, mathematical cognition, for example, will involve an analysis of the different kinds of intentional experiences and operations that underlie and so constitute the complex intentionality in question.
Of particular importance for Husserl in this connection is the notion of “categorial intuition”. In categorial intuition a subject becomes conscious of an articulated state of affairs as the object of her intention. Categorial intuition involves, for example, not just passive awareness of a ship, or just paying attention to particular parts or features of the ship, but rather intending the articulated complex state of affairs that is “the ship’s having two smokestacks” or “the ship’s being about to enter port”. It is intentional awareness of such facts that forms the basis of categorial judgments, and the intentional contents of categorial acts can be understood along the lines of propositions, the relations among and analysis of which is the subject matter of logic. In the present context, what is important is that the intentionality involved in categorial intuition is a complex intentionality built up out of more basic kinds of intentions and intentional transformations, and thus another key example of a phenomena requiring constitution analysis (LI, §§ 40—58). To the extent that understanding the factors that go into forming a belief or intention is relevant to evaluating the epistemic status of that belief, constitution analysis functions together with the analysis of evidence and fulfillment conditions and so comprises a part of Phenomenology’s contribution to epistemology.
It must also be noted, however, that constitution analysis within Phenomenology has an interest entirely independent of the role it plays in epistemology. This interest is that of providing a comprehensive analysis of the essential kinds of intentionality and relationships among them that are involved in making possible different kinds of complex intentional thoughts and experiences. As mentioned already, such constitution analyses include analysis of the constitution of time-consciousness, the constitution of mathematical object awareness, the constitution of bodily awareness, the constitution (subjective and inter-subjective) of the social world, and so forth.
The foregoing considerations go beyond the scope of what would normally be considered a discussion of Husserl’s views specifically on intentionality and intentional content. Hopefully they serve, however, to provide some sense of the interconnection between Husserl’s views concerning intentionality and the other parts of his philosophy.
The collected works of Husserl were published in 1950, in Husserliana: Edmund Husserl — Gesammelte Werke, The Hague/Dordrecht: Nijhoff/Kluwer. The following are works by Husserl listed in the chronological order of their German publications (the German publication date is in brackets).
The following works are secondary sources pertinent to Husserl’s views on intentionality and the role that it plays in his phenomenology.
Andrew D. Spear
Grand Valley State University
U. S. A.
Last updated: November 6, 2011 | Originally published: