Thomas Henry Huxley, the distinguished zoologist and advocate of Darwinism, made several incursions into philosophy. From his youth he had studied its problems unsystematically; he had a way of going straight to the point in any discussion; and, judged by a literary standard, he was a great master of expository and argumentative prose. Apart from his special work in science, he had an important influence upon English thought through his numerous addresses and essays on the topics of science, philosophy, religion, and politics. Among the most important of his papers relevant here are those entitled ‘The Physical Basis of Life’ (1868), and ‘On the Hypothesis that Animals are Automata’ (1874), along with a monograph on Hume (1879) and the Romanes lecture Ethics and Evolution (1893). Huxley is credited with the invention of the term ‘agnosticism’ to describe his philosophical position: it expresses his attitude towards certain traditional questions without giving any clear delimitation of the frontiers of the knowable. He regards consciousness as a collateral effect of certain physical causes, and only an effect–never also a cause. But, on the other hand, he holds that matter is only a symbol, and that all physical phenomena can be analyzed into states of consciousness. This leaves mental facts in the peculiar position of being collateral effects of something that, after all, is only a symbol for a mental fact; and the contradiction is left without remark.
His contributions to ethics are still more remarkable. In a paper entitled ‘Science and Morals’ (1888), he concluded that the safety of morality lay “in a real and living belief in that fixed order of nature which sends social disorganization on the track of immorality.” His Romanes lecture reveals a different tone. In it the moral order is contrasted with the cosmic order; evolution shows constant struggle; instead of looking to it for moral guidance, he “repudiates the gladiatorial theory of existence.” He saw that the facts of historical process did not constitute validity for moral conduct; and his plain language compelled other to see the same truth. But he exaggerated the opposition between them and did not leave room for the influence of moral ideas as a factor in the historical process.
Another man of science, William Kingdon Clifford, professor of mathematics in London, dealt in occasional essays with some central points in the theory of knowledge, ethics, and religion. In these essays he aimed at an interpretation of life in the light of the new science. There was insight as well as courage in all he wrote, and it was conveyed in a brilliant style. But his work was cut short by his early death in 1879, and his contributions to philosophy remain suggestions only.
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Last updated: April 16, 2001 | Originally published: April/16/2001
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