Abu al-Walid Muhammad ibn Ahmad ibn Rushd, better known in the Latin West as Averroes, lived during a unique period in Western intellectual history, in which interest in philosophy and theology was waning in the Muslim world and just beginning to flourish in Latin Christendom. Just fifteen years before his birth, the great critic of Islamic philosophy, al-Ghazzali (1058-1111), had died after striking a blow against Muslim Neoplatonic philosophy, particularly against the work of the philosopher Ibn Sina (Avicenna). From such bleak circumstances emerged the Spanish-Muslim philosophers, of which the jurist and physician Ibn Rushd came to be regarded as the final and most influential Muslim philosopher, especially to those who inherited the tradition of Muslim philosophy in the West.
His influential commentaries and unique interpretations on Aristotle revived Western scholarly interest in ancient Greek philosophy, whose works for the most part had been neglected since the sixth century. He critically examined the alleged tension between philosophy and religion in the Decisive Treatise, and he challenged the anti-philosophical sentiments within the Sunni tradition sparked by al-Ghazzali. This critique ignited a similar re-examination within the Christian tradition, influencing a line of scholars who would come to be identified as the “Averroists.”
Ibn Rushd contended that the claim of many Muslim theologians that philosophers were outside the fold of Islam had no base in scripture. His novel exegesis of seminal Quranic verses made the case for three valid “paths” of arriving at religious truths, and that philosophy was one if not the best of them, therefore its study should not be prohibited. He also challenged Asharite, Mutazilite, Sufi, and “literalist” conceptions of God’s attributes and actions, noting the philosophical issues that arise out of their notions of occasionalism, divine speech, and explanations of the origin of the world. Ibn Rushd strived to demonstrate that without engaging religion critically and philosophically, deeper meanings of the tradition can be lost, ultimately leading to deviant and incorrect understandings of the divine.
This article provides an overview of Ibn Rushd’s contributions to philosophy, emphasizing his commentaries, his original works in Islamic philosophy, and his lasting influence on medieval thought and the Western philosophical tradition.
Ibn Rushd was born in Cordova, Spain, to a family with a long and well-respected tradition of legal and public service. His grandfather, the influential Abdul-Walid Muhammad (d. 1126), was the chief judge of Cordova, under the Almoravid dynasty, establishing himself as a specialist in legal methodology and in the teachings of the various legal schools. Ibn Rushd’s father, Abdul-Qasim Ahmad, although not as venerated as his grandfather, held the same position until the Almoravids were ousted by the Almohad dynasty in 1146.
Ibn Rushd’s education followed a traditional path, beginning with studies in hadith, linguistics, jurisprudence and scholastic theology. The earliest biographers and Muslim chroniclers speak little about his education in science and philosophy, where most interest from Western scholarship in him lies, but note his propensity towards the law and his life as a jurist. It is generally believed that Ibn Rushd was influenced by the philosophy of Ibn Bajjah (Avempace), and perhaps was once tutored by him. His medical education was directed under Abu Jafar ibn Harun of Trujillo. His aptitude for medicine was noted by his contemporaries and can be seen in his major enduring work Kitab al-Kulyat fi al-Tibb (Generalities) This book, together with Kitab al-Taisir fi al-Mudawat wa al-Tadbir (Particularities) written by Abu Marwan Ibn Zuhr, became the main medical textbooks for physicians in the Jewish, Christian and Muslim worlds for centuries to come.
Ibn Rushd traveled to Marrakesh and came under the patronage of the caliph ‘Abd al-Mu’min, likely involved in educational reform for the dynasty. The Almohads, like the Almoravids they had supplanted, were a Northwest African Kharijite-influenced Berber reform movement. Founded in the theology of Ibn Tumart (1078-1139), who emphasized divine unity and the idea of divine promise and threat, he believed that a positive system of law could co-exist with a rational and practical theology. This led to the concept that law needed to be primarily based on revelation instead of the traditions of the jurists. Ibn Talmart’s theology affirmed that the existence and essence of God could be established through reason alone, and used that to posit an ethical legal theory that depended on a divine transcendence.
Ibn Rushd’s relationship with the Almohad was not merely opportunistic, (considering the support his father and grandfather had given to the Almoravids) for it influenced his work significantly; notably his ability to unite philosophy and religion. Sometime between 1159 and 1169, during one of his periods of residence in Marrakesh, Ibn Rushd befriended Ibn Tufayl (Abubacer), a philosopher who was the official physician and counselor to Caliph Abu Yaqub Yusuf, son of ‘Abd al-Mu’min. It was Ibn Tufayl who introduced Ibn Rushd to the ruler. The prince was impressed by the young philosopher and employed him first as chief judge and later as chief physician. Ibn Rushd’s legacy as the commentator of Aristotle was also due to Abu Yaqub Yusuf. Although well-versed in ancient philosophy, the prince complained about the challenge posed by the Greek philosopher’s texts and commissioned Ibn Rushd to write a series of commentaries on them.
Through most of Ibn Rushd’s service, the Almohads grew more liberal, leading eventually to their formal rejection of Ibn Talmart’s theology and adoption of Malikite law in 1229. Despite this tendency, public pressure against perceived liberalizing tendencies in the government led to the formal rejection of Ibn Rushd and his writings in 1195. He was exiled to Lucena, a largely Jewish village outside of Cordoba, his writings were banned and his books burned. This period of disgrace did not last long, however, and Ibn Rushd returned to Cordoba two years later, but died the following year. Doubts about Ibn Rushd’s orthodoxy persisted, but as Islamic interest in his philosophy waned, his writings found new audiences in the Christian and Jewish worlds.
While this article focuses on Ibn Rushd’s own philosophical writings, a word about the significant number of commentaries he wrote is important. Ibn Rushd wrote on many subjects, including law and medicine. In law he outshone all his predecessors, writing on legal methodology, legal pronouncements, sacrifices and land taxes. He discussed topics as diverse as cleanliness, marriage, jihad and the government’s role with non-Muslims. As for medicine, in addition to his medical encyclopedia mentioned above, Ibn Rushd wrote a commentary on Avicenna’s medical work and a number of summaries on the works of Galen. Besides his own philosophical and theological work, Ibn Rushd wrote extensive commentaries on the texts of a wide range of thinkers. These commentaries provide interesting insights into how Ibn Rushd arrived at certain positions and how much he was authentically Aristotelian. Commissioned to explain Aristotle Ibn Rushd spent three decades producing multiple commentaries on all of Aristotle’s works, save his Politics, covering every subject from aesthetics and ethics to logic and zoology. He also wrote about Plato’s Republic, Alexander’s De Intellectu, the Metaphysics of Nicolaus of Damascus, the Isagoge of Porphyry, and the Almajest of Ptolemy. Ibn Rushd would often write more than one commentary on Aristotle’s texts; for many he wrote a short or paraphrase version, a middle version and a long version. Each expanded his examination of the originals and their interpretations by other commentators, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius and Ibn Bajjah, The various versions were meant for readers with different levels of understanding.
Ibn Rushd’s desire was to shed the prevalent Neoplatonic interpretations of Aristotle, and get back to what the Greek thinker originally had intended to communicate. Of course, Ibn Rushd did not shy away from inserting his own thoughts into his commentaries, and his short paraphrase commentaries were often flexible interpretations. At times, in an effort to explain complex ideas in Aristotle, Ibn Rushd would rationalize the philosopher in directions that would not seem authentic to contemporary interpreters of Aristotle. Nevertheless, Ibn Rushd’s commentaries came to renew Western intellectual interest in Aristotle, whose works had been largely ignored or lost since the sixth century.
Until the eighth century, and the rise of the Mutazilite theology, Greek philosophy was viewed with suspicion. Despite the political support given to philosophy because of the Mutazilites and the early philosophers, a strong anti-philosophical movement rose through theological schools like the Hanbalites and the Asharites. These groups, particular the latter, gained public and political influence throughout the tenth and eleventh century Islamic world. These appealed to more conservative elements within society, to those who disliked what appeared to be non-Muslim influences. Ibn Rushd, who served a political dynasty that had come into power under a banner of orthodox reform while privately encouraging the study of philosophy, was likely sensitive to the increasing tensions that eventually led to his banishment. Though written before his exile his Decisive Treatise provides an apologetic for those theologians who charged philosophers with unbelief.
Ibn Rushd begins with the contention that Law commands the study of philosophy. Many Quranic verses, such as “Reflect, you have a vision” (59.2) and “they give thought to the creation of heaven and earth” (3:191), command human intellectual reflection upon God and his creation. This is best done by demonstration, drawing inferences from accepted premises, which is what both lawyers and philosophers do. Since, therefore, such obligation exists in religion, then a person who has the capacity of “natural intelligence” and “religious integrity” must begin to study philosophy. If someone else has examined these subjects in the past, the believer should build upon their work, even if they did not share the same religion. For, just as in any subject of study, the creation of knowledge is built successively from one scholar to the next. This does not mean that the ancients’ teachings should be accepted uncritically, but if what is found within their teachings is true, then it should not be rejected because of religion. (Ibn Rushd illustrated this point by citing that when a sacrifice is performed with the prescribed instrument, it does not matter if the owner of the instrument shares the same religion as the one performing the sacrifice.)
The philosopher, when following the proper order of education, should not be harmed by his studies, hence it is wrong to forbid the study of philosophy. Any harm that may occur is accidental, like that of the side effects of medicine, or from choking on water when thirsty. If serious harm comes from philosophical study, Ibn Rushd suggests that this is because the student was dominated by their passions, had a bad teacher or suffered some natural deficiency. Ibn Rushd illustrates this by quoting a saying of the Prophet Muhammad, when asked by a man about his brother’s diarrhea. The Prophet suggested that the brother should drink honey. When the man returned to say that his brother’s diarrhea had worsened, the Prophet replied, “Allah has said the truth, but your brother’s abdomen has told a lie” (Bukhari 7.71.588).
Not all people are able to find truth through philosophy, which is why the Law speaks of three ways for humans to discover truth and interpret scripture: the demonstrative, the dialectical and the rhetorical. These, for Ibn Rushd, divide humanity into philosophers, theologians and the common masses. The simple truth is that Islam is the best of all religions, in that, consistent with the goal of Aristotelian ethics, it produces the most happiness, which is comprised of the knowledge of God. As such, one way is appointed to every person, consistent with their natural disposition, so that they can acquire this truth.
For Ibn Rushd, demonstrative truth cannot conflict with scripture (i.e. Qur’an), since Islam is ultimate truth and the nature of philosophy is the search for truth. If scripture does conflict with demonstrative truth, such conflict must be only apparent. If philosophy and scripture disagree on the existence of any particular being, scripture should be interpreted allegorically. Ibn Rushd contends that allegorical interpretation of scripture is common among the lawyers, theologians and the philosophers, and has been long accepted by all Muslims; Muslims only disagree on the extent and propriety of its use. God has given various meanings and interpretations, both apparent and hidden, to numerous scriptures so as to inspire study and to suit diverse intelligences. The early Muslim community, according to Ibn Rushd, affirmed that scripture had both an apparent meaning and an inner meaning. If the Muslim community has come to a consensus regarding the meaning of any particular passage, whether allegorical or apparent, no one can contradict that interpretation. If there is no consensus about a particular passage, then its meaning is free for interpretation. The problem is that, with the international diversity and long history of Islam, it is all but impossible to establish a consensus on most verses. For no one can be sure to have gathered all the opinions of all scholars from all times. With this in mind, according to Ibn Rushd, scholars like al-Ghazzali should not charge philosophers with unbelief over their doctrines of the eternity of the universe, the denial of God’s knowledge of particulars, or denial of bodily resurrection. Since the early Muslims accepted the existence of apparent and allegorical meanings of texts, and since there is no consensus on these doctrines, such a charge can only be tentative. Philosophers have been divinely endowed with unique methods of learning, acquiring their beliefs through demonstrative arguments and securing them with allegorical interpretation.
Therefore, the theologians and philosophers are not so greatly different, that either should label the other as irreligious. And, like the philosophers, the theologians interpret certain texts allegorically, and such interpretations should not be infallible. For instance, he contends that even the apparent meaning of scripture fails to support the theologian’s doctrine of creation ex nihilo. He highlights texts like 11:7, 41:11 and 65:48, which imply that objects such as a throne, water and smoke pre-existed the formation of the world and that something will exist after the End of Days.
A teacher, then, must communicate the interpretation of scripture proper for his respective audiences. To the masses, Ibn Rushd cautions, a teacher must teach the apparent meaning of all texts. Higher categories of interpretations should only be taught to those who are qualified through education. To teach the masses a dialectical or demonstrative interpretation, as Ibn Rushd contends Ghazzali did in his Incoherence, is to hurt the faith of the believers. The same applies to teaching a theologian philosophical interpretations.
Ibn Rushd, shortly after writing his Decisive Treatise, wrote a treatise on the doctrine of God known as Al-Kashf ‘an Manahij al-Adilla fi ‘Aqaid al-Milla (the Exposition of the Methods of Proof Concerning the Beliefs of the Community). His goal was to examine the religious doctrines that are held by the public and determine if any of the many doctrines expounded by the different sects were the intention of the “lawgiver.” In particular he identifies four key sects as the targets of his polemic, the Asharites, Mutazilites, the Sufis and the “literalists,” claiming that they all have distorted the scriptures and developed innovative doctrines not compatible with Islam. Ibn Rushd’s polemic, then, becomes a clear expression of his doctrine on God. He begins with examining the arguments for the existence of God given by the different sects, dismissing each one as erroneous and harmful to the public. Ibn Rushd contends that there are only two arguments worthy of adherence, both of which are found in the “Precious Book;” for example, surahs 25:61, 78:6-16 and 80:24-33. The first is the argument of “providence,” in which one can observe that everything in the universe serves the purpose of humanity. Ibn Rushd speaks of the sun, the moon, the earth and the weather as examples of how the universe is conditioned for humans. If the universe is, then, so finely-tuned, then it bespeaks of a fine tuner – God. The second is the argument of “invention,” stemming from the observation that everything in the world appears to have been invented. Plants and animals have a construction that appears to have been designed; as such a designer must have been involved, and that is God.
From establishing the existence of God, Ibn Rushd turns to explaining the nature and attributes of God. Beginning with the doctrine of divine unity, Ibn Rushd challenges the Asharite argument that there cannot, by definition, be two gods for any disagreement between them would entail that one or both cannot be God. This, of course, means that, in the case of two gods, at least one’s will would be thwarted in some fashion at some time by the other; and such an event would mean that they are not omnipotent, which is a essential trait of deity. Ibn Rushd’s critique turns the apologetic on its head, contending that if there were two gods, there is an equal possibility of both gods working together, which would mean that both of their wills were fulfilled. Furthermore, Ibn Rushd adds, even disagreement would not thwart divine will, for alternatives could occur giving each god its desire. Such arguments lead to absurdity and are not fit for the masses. The simple fact is that reason affirms divine unity, which, by definition, is a confession of God’s existence and the denial of any other deity.
Ibn Rushd maintains, as did most of his theologian contemporaries that there are seven divine attributes, analogous to the human attributes. These attributes are: knowledge, life, power, will, hearing, vision and speech. For the philosopher, the attribute of knowledge occupied much space in his writing on the attributes of God. He contends, especially in his Epistle Dedicatory and his Decisive Treatise that divine knowledge is analogous to human knowledge only in name, human knowledge is the product of effect and divine knowledge is a product of cause. God, being the cause of the universe, has knowledge based on being its cause; while humans have knowledge based on the effects of such causes.
The implication of this distinction is important, since Ibn Rushd believes that philosophers who deny God’s knowledge of particulars are in error. God knows particulars because he is the cause of such things. But this raises an important question: does God’s knowledge change with knowledge of particulars? That is, when events or existents move from non-existence to existence, does God’s knowledge change with this motion? Change in divine knowledge would imply divine change, and for medieval thinkers it was absurd to think that God was not immutable.
Ghazzali answered this dilemma by saying that God’s knowledge does not change, only his relationship with the object. Just like a person sitting with a glass of water on their left side does not fundamentally change when that same glass is moved to their right side. Ibn Rushd felt that Ghazzali’s answer did not solve the dilemma, stating that a change in relationship is still change. For Ibn Rushd, then, the solution came in his contention that divine knowledge is rooted in God being the eternal Prime Mover—meaning that God eternally knows every action that will be caused by him. God, therefore, does not know that event when it occurs, as humans would, because he has always known it.
As for the other traits, Ibn Rushd next turns to the attribute of life, simply stating that life necessarily flows from the attribute of knowledge, as evidenced in the world around us. Divine will and power are defined as essential characteristics of God, characteristics that define God as God. This is because the existence of any created being implies the existence of an agent that willed its existence and had the power to do so. (The implication of this, Ibn Rushd notes, is that the Asharite concept that God had eternally willed the existence of the world, but created it at some particular point in time, is illogical.)
In regards to divine speech, Ibn Rushd is aware of the great theological debate in Islam about whether the Qur’an, the embodiment of God’s speech, is temporally created or eternal. Ibn Rushd contends that the attribute of divine speech is affirmed because it necessarily flows from the attributes of knowledge and power, and speech is nothing more than these. Divine speech, Ibn Rushd notes, is expressed through intermediaries, whether the work of the angels or the revelations given to the prophets. As such, “the Qur’an…is eternal but the words denoting it are created by God Almighty, not by men.” The Qur’an, therefore, differs from words found elsewhere, in that the words of the Qur’an are directly created by God, while human words are our own work given by God’s permission.
Ibn Rushd concludes by discussing divine hearing and vision, and notes that scripture relates these attributes to God in the sense that he perceives things in existing things that are not apprehended by the intellect. An artisan would know everything in an artifact he had created, and two means of this knowledge would be sight and sound. God, being God, would apprehend all things in creation through all modes of apprehension, and as such would have vision and hearing.
Turning from the attributes of God to the actions of God, where he delineates his view of creation, Ibn Rushd in his Tahafut al-Tahafut clearly deals with the charge against the philosopher’s doctrine on the eternity of the physical universe in his polemic against al-Ghazzali. Ghazzali perceived that the philosophers had misunderstood the relationship between God and the world, especially since the Qur’an is clear on divine creation. Ghazzali, sustaining the Asharite emphasis on divine power, questioned why God, being the ultimate agent, could not simply create the world ex nihilo and then destroy it in some future point in time? Why did there need to be some obstacle to explain a delay in God’s creative action? In response to this, Ghazzali offered a number of lengthy proofs to challenge the philosopher’s assertions.
Ibn Rushd, who often labeled Ghazzali’s arguments dialectical, sophistical or feeble, merely replied that the eternal works differently than the temporal. As humans, we can willfully decide to perform some action and then wait a period of time before completing it. For God, on the other hand, there can be no gap between decision and action; for what differentiates one time from another in God’s mind? Also, what physical limits can restrict God from acting? Ibn Rushd, in the first discussion, writes about how Ghazzali confused the definition of eternal and human will, making them univocal. For humans, the will is the faculty to choose between two options, and it is desire that compels the will to choose. For God, however, this definition of will is meaningless. God cannot have desire because that would entail change within the eternal when the object of desire was fulfilled. Furthermore, the creation of the world is not simply the choice between two equal alternatives, but a choice of existence or non-existence. Finally, if all the conditions for action were fulfilled, there would not be any reason for God not to act. God, therefore, being omniscient and omnipotent would have known from the eternal past what he had planned to create, and without limit to his power, there would no condition to stop the creation from occurring.
Ghazzali’s argument follows the typical Asharite kalam cosmological argument, in that he argues the scientific evidence for the temporal origin of the world, and reasons from that to the existence of a creator. Ghazzali’s first proof contends that the idea of the infinite number of planetary revolutions as an assumption of the eternity of the world is erroneous since one can determine their revolution rates and how much they differ when compared one to another. Ibn Rushd weakly maintains that the concept of numbered planetary revolutions and their division does not apply to eternal beings. To say that the eternal can be divided is absurd since there can be no degrees to the infinite. Oliver Leaman explains how Ibn Rushd accepted accidental but not essential infinite series of existents. There can be an infinite chain of human sexual generation, but those beings that are essentially infinite have neither beginning nor end and thus cannot be divided.
In his Decisive Treatise Ibn Rushd summarily reduces the argument between the Asharite theologians and the ancient philosophers to one of semantics. Both groups agree that there are three classes of being, two extremes and one intermediate being. They agree about the name of the extremes, but disagree about the intermediate class. One extreme is those beings that are brought into existence by something (matter), from something other than itself (efficient cause) and originate in time. The second, and opposite, class is that which is composed of nothing, caused by nothing and whose existence is eternal; this class of being is demonstratively known as God. The third class, is that which is comprised of anything or is not preceded by time, but is brought into existence by an agent; this is what is known as the world. Theologians affirm that time did not exist before the existence of the world, since time is related to the motion of physical bodies. They also affirm that the world exists infinitely into the future. As such, since the philosophers accept these two contentions, the two groups only disagree on the existence of the world in the eternal past.
Since the third class relates to both the first and second classes, the dispute between the philosophers and the theologians is merely how close the third class is to one of the other two classes. If closer to the first class, it would resemble originated beings; if closer to the second class, it would resemble more the eternal being. For Ibn Rushd, the world can neither be labeled pre-eternal nor originated, since the former would imply that the world is uncaused and the latter would imply that the world is perishable.
Ibn Rushd finds pre-existing material forms in Quranic texts such as 11:9, where he maintains that one finds a throne and water pre-existing the current forms of the universe; he contends that the theologians’ interpretation of such passages are arbitrary. This is because nowhere in the Qur’an is the idea of God existing as pure being before the creation of the world to be found.
The debate for Ibn Rushd and Ghazzali centers, ultimately, upon the idea of causation. Ghazzali, the dedicated Asharite, wants to support the position that God is the ultimate cause of all actions; that no being in the universe is the autonomous cause of anything. For instance, a spark put on a piece of wood does not cause fire; rather God causes the fire and has allowed the occasion of spark and wood to be the method by which he creates fire. God, if he so desired, could simply will fire not to occur when a spark and wood meet. For Ghazzali, this is the explanation of the occurrence of miracles: divine creative actions that suspend laws habitually accepted by humans. Ghazzali, in his Tahafut, speaks of the decapitated man continuing to live because God willed it so.
Ibn Rushd, the consummate Aristotelian, maintains in his Tahafut Aristotle’s contention that a full explanation of any event or existence needs to involve a discussion of the material, formal, efficient and final cause. Ibn Rushd, then, insists that Ghazzali’s view would be counter-productive to scientific knowledge and contrary to common-sense. The universe, according to the human mind, works along certain causal principles and the beings existing within the universe contain particular natures that define their existence; if these natures, principles and characteristics were not definitive, then this would lead to nihilism (i.e. the atheistic materialists found in the Greek and Arab worlds). As for the idea of cause and effect being a product of habitual observation, Ibn Rushd asks if such observations are a product of God’s habit or our own observations. It cannot, he asserts, be the former, since the Qur’an speaks of God’s actions as unalterable. If the latter, the idea of habit applies only to animate beings, for the habitual actions of inanimate objects are tantamount to physical laws of motion.
Metaphysics, for Ibn Rushd, does not simply deal with God or theology; rather it concerns itself with different classes of being and the analogical idea of being. It is, thus, a science that distinguishes inferior classes of being from real being. Ibn Rushd, the adamant Aristotelian, puts his own slant on Aristotle’s metaphysics. Ibn Rushd’s classification of being begins with accidental substances, which are physical beings, then moves to being of the soul / mind and finally discusses whether the substance existing outside the soul, such as the sphere of the fixed stars, is material or immaterial. This hierarchy, notes Charles Genequand, differs from Aristotle’s hierarchy of material beings, beings of the soul / mind and unchangeable entities. The first and third categories of both thinkers are somewhat similar in that they encompass a straight demarcation between material and immaterial being. Ibn Rushd’s second class of being, however, includes both universals and mathematical beings; and as such cannot be the bridge between physics and metaphysics as it is in Aristotle. Rather, he contended that all autonomous beings, whether material or not, constitute a single category. This was likely a response to the more materialistic interpretations of Aristotle, such as that of Alexander of Aphrodisias, for Ibn Rushd did not see physics and the metaphysical at opposite sides of the spectrum.
Substance, not beings of the mind, was the common link between physics and metaphysics for Ibn Rushd. Substance, therefore, has an ontological, though not necessarily temporal, priority over other parts of being. Since, then, metaphysics covers both sensible and eternal substances, its subject matter overlaps with that of physics. In the cosmos, then, there are two classes of eternal things, the essentially eternal and the numerically eternal. This division represents the separation between the celestial realm and the physical universe, where the living beings in the latter are bound to an eternal cycle of generation and corruption, while the former are immortal animals. Ibn Rushd does not contend that celestial bodies cause the world, rather the motion of these bodies are the “principle” of what occurs on earth.
This point is more fully developed in Ibn Rushd’s discussion regarding spontaneous generation: the idea that certain beings are created by external agents without being subject to the cycle of generation and corruption. This was a common subject of debate throughout later Greek and medieval philosophy. If beings like insects spontaneously generated from rotting food are externally generated, therein lies proof for a created universe and Asharite occasionalism, neither of which Ibn Rushd maintains. His solution is the Aristotelian doctrine of emanation, which states that no being is created but merely is the principle that unites matter and form. Since Ibn Rushd asserts that physical generation is the product of both seed, which contains forms in potentiality, and solar heat, the sun being a heavenly being; spontaneous generation, in which the seed is absent, is merely the effect of solar heat upon the basic elements (i.e. earth and water).
In the cosmological sphere, according to physics, one finds things that are both moving and moved at once and things that are only moved. Therefore, there must be something that imparts motion but is never moved; this is the Prime Mover (i.e. God). Physics, thus, provides the proof for the existence of a Prime Mover, and metaphysics is concerned with the action of this mover. The Prime Mover is the ultimate agent for Ibn Rushd and it must be eternal and pure actuality. It did not merely push the universe into existence and remain idle thereafter, for the universe would slip into chaos. Ibn Rushd acknowledges that the idea of actuality being essentially prior to potentiality counters common sense, but to accept the opposite would entail the possibility of spontaneous movement or negation of movement within the universe.
How, then, is the Prime Mover the principle of motion and causation in the cosmos without being moved itself? Ibn Rushd contends that the Prime Mover moves the cosmos, particularly the celestial bodies, by being the object of desire. Celestial beings have souls, which possess the higher power of intellect and desire, and these beings desire the perfection of God, thereby they move accordingly. Desire in the celestial beings, according to Ibn Rushd, is not the real faculty it is in humans. Since these beings have no sense perception, desire is united with intellect causing a desire for what rationally is perfection – the Prime Mover.
Ibn Rushd rejects the Arab Neoplatonic doctrine of emanation because it simply implies a temporal succession of one being producing another, which is impossible for eternal beings. By this rejection, however, Ibn Rushd recognizes a problem within his system. If God is intellectually present within the celestial bodies, there is no need for them to move in an effort to acquire this perfection. Ibn Rushd responds with an analogy of a cabinet-maker, who has the idea of a cabinet existing in his mind, but his body needs to move in order to imprint this idea upon matter. Celestial beings move in likewise matter, in order to obtain perfection, which produces the physical universe. Furthermore, this effort to obtain perfection in the celestial bodies, which is in imitation of God, effects the order of the universe.
With the Prime Mover, the celestial bodies and the physical world, Ibn Rushd has a three level cosmological view. He illustrates his cosmological order by using the analogy of the state, where everyone obeys and imitates the king. All smaller social units in the kingdom, like the family, are subordinate to the head, which is ultimately under the authority of the king. There is a hierarchy among the spheres of celestial beings, based on their “nobility” (sharaf) and not, as Avicenna held, on their order in emanation. Of course, the order of nobility parallels emanation’s order, for the hierarchical order is that which we see in the universe, the fixed stars, the planets, the moon and the earth. Like a king, the Prime Mover imparts motion only to the First Body (the sphere of the fixed stars), which becomes the intermediary for the other bodies. This leads to the other spheres (i.e. planets) to desire both the Prime Mover and the First Body, which, according to Ibn Rushd, explains how the celestial bodies move from east to west at one time and from west to east at another time. It is the desire of one that moves the planets in one way, and the desire of the other that moves them in the opposite direction.
Ultimately, as H. Davidson notes, Ibn Rushd has a cosmos in which the earth is its physical center. Surrounding the earth, at different levels, are the celestial spheres, which contain celestial bodies (e.g. the sun, moon, stars and planets), which all revolve around the earth. The motion of these spheres is attributed to immortal intelligences, governed by a primary immutable and impersonal cause. Each sphere exists in its own right, though somehow the intelligence is caused by the Prime Mover, and it is through their contemplation of the Prime Mover they receive perfection equivalent to the position they hold in the cosmological hierarchy. As such, God no longer is restricted to being a cause of one thing. The active intellect is the last sphere in the hierarchy, but is not the product of another, and like the other intelligences its cognition is fixed on God. This idea has significant influence on Ibn Rushd’s doctrine of the human soul and intellect.
Like Aristotle, Ibn Rushd views the study of the psyche as a part of physics, since it is related specifically to the generable and corruptible union of form and matter found in the physical world and passed from generation to generation through the seed and natural heat. Ibn Rushd’s views on psychology are most fully discussed in his Talkbis Kitab al-Nafs (Aristotle on the Soul). Here Ibn Rushd, as M. Fakhry comments, divided the soul into five faculties: the nutritive, the sensitive, the imaginative, the appetitive and the rational. The primary psychological faculty of all plants and animals is the nutritive or vegetative faculty, passed on through sexual generation, as noted above. The remaining four higher faculties are dependent on the nutritive faculty and are really perfections of this faculty, the product of a nature urging to move higher and higher.
The nutritive faculty uses natural heat to convert nutrients from potentiality to actuality, which are essential for basic survival, growth and reproduction of the living organism. , This faculty is an active power which is moved by the heavenly body (Active Intellect). Meanwhile, the sensitive faculty is a passive power divided into two aspects, the proximate and the ultimate, in which the former is moved within the embryo by the heavenly body and the latter is moved by sensible objects. The sensitive faculty in finite, in that it is passive, mutable, related to sensible forms and dependent upon the animal’s physical senses (e.g. touch or vision). A part of these senses, notes Fakhry, is the sensus communis, a sort of sixth sense that perceives common sensibles (i.e. objects that require more than one sense to observe), discriminates among these sensibles, and comprehends that it perceives. Benmakhlouf notes that the imaginative faculty is dependent on the sensitive faculty, in that its forms result from the sensible forms, which Fakhry contends are stored in sensus communis. It differs from the sensitive faculty, however, by the fact that it “apprehends objects which are no longer present…its apprehensions are often false or fictitious,” and it can unite individual images of objects perceived separately. Imagination is not opinion or reasoning, since it can conceive of unfalsified things and its objects are particular not universal, and may be finite because it is mutable (moving from potentiality to actuality by the forms stored in the sensus communis). The imaginative faculty stimulates the appetitive faculty, which is understood as desire, since it imagines desirable objects. Fakhry adds that the imaginative and appetitive faculties are essentially related, in that it is the former that moves the latter to desire or reject any pleasurable or repulsive object.
The rational faculty, seen as the capstone of Ibn Rushd’s psychology by Fakhry, is unlike the imaginative faculty, in that it apprehends motion in a universal way and separate from matter. It has two divisions, the practical and theoretical, given to humans alone for their ultimate moral and intellectual perfection. The rational faculty is the power that allows humanity to create, understand and be ethical. The practical is derived from the sensual and imaginative faculties, in that it is rooted in sensibles and related to moral virtues like friendship and love. The theoretical apprehends universal intelligibles and does not need an external agent for intellectualization, contrary to the doctrine of the Active Intellect in Neoplatonism.
In its effort to achieve perfection, the rational faculty moves from potentiality to actuality. In doing so it goes through a number of stages, know as the process of intellectation. Ibn Rushd had discerned, as seen in his Long Commentary on De Anima, five distinct meanings of the Aristotelian intellect. They were, first and foremost, the material (potential) and the active (agent) intellects.
There is evidence of some evolution in Ibn Rushd’s thought on the intellect, notably in his Middle Commentary on De Anima where he combines the positions of Alexander and Themistius for his doctrine on the material intellect and in his Long Commentary and the Tahafut where Ibn Rushd rejected Alexander and endorsed Themistius’ position that “material intellect is a single incorporeal eternal substance that becomes attached to the imaginative faculties of individual humans.” Thus, the human soul is a separate substance ontologically identical with the active intellect; and when this active intellect is embodied in an individual human it is the material intellect. The material intellect is analogous to prime matter, in that it is pure potentiality able to receive universal forms. As such, the human mind is a composite of the material intellect and the passive intellect, which is the third element of the intellect. The passive intellect is identified with the imagination, which, as noted above, is the sense-connected finite and passive faculty that receives particular sensual forms. When the material intellect is actualized by information received, it is described as the speculative (habitual) intellect. As the speculative intellect moves towards perfection, having the active intellect as an object of thought, it becomes the acquired intellect. In that, it is aided by the active intellect, perceived in the way Aristotle had taught, to acquire intelligible thoughts. The idea of the soul’s perfection occurring through having the active intellect as a greater object of thought is introduced elsewhere, and its application to religious doctrine is seen. In the Tahafut, Ibn Rushd speaks of the soul as a faculty that comes to resemble the focus of its intention, and when its attention focuses more upon eternal and universal knowledge, it become more like the eternal and universal. As such, when the soul perfects itself, it becomes like our intellect. This, of course, has impact on Ibn Rushd’s doctrine of the afterlife. Leaman contends that Ibn Rushd understands the process of knowing as a progression of detachment from the material and individual to become a sort of generalized species, in which the soul may survive death. This contradicts traditional religious views of the afterlife, which Ibn Rushd determines to be valuable in a political sense, in that it compels citizens to ethical behavior.
Elsewhere, Ibn Rushd maintains that it is the Muslim doctrine of the afterlife that best motivates people to an ethical life. The Christian and Jewish doctrines, he notes, are too focused upon the spiritual elements of the afterlife, while the Muslim description of the physical pleasures are more enticing. Of course, Ibn Rushd does not ultimately reject the idea of a physical afterlife, but for him it is unlikely.
A number of other problems remain in Ibn Rushd’s doctrine of the soul and intellect. For instance, if the material intellect is one and eternal for all humans, how is it divided and individualized? His immediate reply was that division can only occur within material forms, thus it is the human body that divides and individualizes the material intellect. Nevertheless, aside from this and other problems raised, on some of which Aquinas takes him to task, Ibn Rushd succeeded in providing an explanation of the human soul and intellect that did not involve an immediate transcendent agent. This opposed the explanations found among the Neoplatonists, allowing a further argument for rejecting Neoplatonic emanation theories. Even so, notes Davidson, Ibn Rushd’s theory of the material intellect was something foreign to Aristotle.
The events surrounding Ibn Rushd towards the end of his life, including his banishment, signaled a broader cultural shift in the Islamic world. Interest in philosophy was primarily among the elite: scholars, royal patrons and civil servants. Nevertheless, its presence among the ruling elite spoke of the diversity of what it meant to be “Muslim.” As interest in philosophy waned in the Muslim world after Ibn Rushd, his writings found new existence and intellectual vigor in the work of Christian and Jewish philosophers. The twelfth and thirteenth centuries saw an intellectual revival in the Latin West, with the first great universities being established in Italy, France and England. Within the walls of the University of Paris, a group of philosophers came to identify themselves with the Aristotelian philosophy presented by Ibn Rushd, particularly certain elements of its relation to religion. Later known as the “Averroists,” these Christian philosophers sparked a controversy within the Roman Catholic Church about the involvement of philosophy with theology. Averroists, their accusers charged, had promoted the doctrines of one intellect for all humans, denial of the immortality of the soul, claimed that happiness can be found in this life and promoted the innovative doctrine of “double truth”. Double truth, the idea that there are two kinds of truth, religious and philosophical, was not held by Ibn Rushd himself but was an innovation of the Averroists.
Among Jewish thinkers, however, Ibn Rushd had a more positive impact. His thoughts on Aristotle and the relationship between philosophy and religion, particularly revelation, inspired a renewed interest in the interpretation of scripture and the Jewish religion. Key Jewish philosophers, such as Maimonides, Moses Narboni and Abraham ibn Ezra, became associated with Ibn Rushd in the West, even though they took Ibn Rushd’s doctrines into novel directions. As such, Leaman notes, the category of a Jewish “Averroist” cannot be given to these philosophers, for their relationship with Ibn Rushd’s thought was one of critique and integration into their own philosophical systems. Nevertheless, without the work of the Spanish-Muslim philosopher, much of what occurred in medieval philosophy would have not existed. He became an example of how religions are dynamic and evolving traditions, often shaped by epistemological influences from other traditions.
H. Chad Hillier
University of Toronto
Last updated: January 5, 2010 | Originally published: