Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Incarnation

In the Bible's fourth gospel, John tells us "the Word [God the Son] became flesh [incarnate] and dwelt among us" (John 1: 14). The central claim of Christianity is that Jesus of Nazareth was none other than God the Son, who while remaining fully divine, took on a human nature for the sake of our salvation. Philosophical puzzles and problems arise as soon as we begin to unpack these notions. The humans we know best, ourselves, make moral mistakes, have trouble bench pressing three hundred pounds, and lose their car keys. We are morally flawed beings lacking in both power and knowledge. God, on the other hand, is typically understood to be morally perfect, all-knowing and all-powerful. If being truly human includes moral failure and limitations in knowledge and power, and being truly divine requires moral perfection, along with perfect knowledge and power, then the incarnation runs afoul of the law of non-contradiction. This law, which Aristotle calls the most certain principle, states that nothing can both be and not be at the same time and in the same respect (Metaphysics, Bk. IV, Part 3). And so, neither Jesus of Nazareth, nor anyone or anything else, can simultaneously have a property (e.g. be all-powerful) and lack it (e.g. be limited in power).

The apparent conflict between the law of non-contradiction and the metaphysical claim that one person, Jesus of Nazareth, is both human and divine is not news to philosophers of religion. Some of the best philosophical minds in the past and present have wrestled with this problem. Four approaches stand out. Beginning with the most radical approach, some simply reject the law of non-contradiction. If the incarnation runs afoul of the law non-contradiction, so much the worse for that law. Less radically, one might argue that identity is not an all-or-nothing affair, and hold that there is a significant sense in which Jesus of Nazareth and God the Son could be identical without having all of the same properties. In technical terms, making this move requires giving up a principle called the indiscernibility of identicals in favor of a relative account of identity. If, by affirming relative identity, one could hold that Jesus of Nazareth is identical to God the Son, even though they do not have all the same properties, one could affirm both the incarnation and the law of non-contradiction.

Many philosophers have argued that one need not appeal to relative identity to reconcile the incarnation with the law of non-contradiction. Here there are two approaches to consider. First, some argue that the incarnation appears to flout this law because we have misunderstood the kinds of properties required for being truly human and/or truly divine. Second, some hold that the incarnation seems to run afoul of the law of non-contradiction because we have failed to see the way in which God the Son Incarnate possesses properties and their complements. Only if the incarnation required that God the Son Incarnate both be and not be at the same time and in the same respect, would it be incompatible with the law of non-contradiction.  The doctrine does not require this, and therefore is completely compatible with the law of non-contradiction. This article considers these various responses to the philosophical problem of incarnation.

Table of Contents

  1. The Historical Framework
  2. The Incompatibility Problem
  3. Responses to the Incompatibility Problem
    1. Rejecting the Law of Non-contradiction
    2. Rejecting the All-or-Nothing Account of Identity in Favor of Relative Identity
    3. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Human and/or Truly Divine
      1. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Human
        1. Thomas V. Morris’s Distinctions Between Essential and Common Properties, and Full and Mere Humanity
        2. Richard Swinburne’s Rejection of a Human Mind/Soul in Favor of a Human Range of Consciousness
      2. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Divine: the Kenotic Approach
      3. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Divine and Truly Human: Marilyn Adams’ Qualified-Property Approach
    4. Showing that God the Son Incarnate Does Not Possess Any Property and its Complement “in the same respect”: Eleonore Stump’s Borrowed-Property View
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Historical Framework

The word "Incarnation" derives from the Latin (in + carnis), which means "in the flesh." Philosophers writing on the incarnation invariably refer to the classical or orthodox view of the incarnation, and here they have in mind the Chalcedonian Creed (451[MP1] ). Stephen T. Davis is typical: "This is the dogma (the Chalcedonian Creed) I have been calling the classical doctrine of the incarnation. It constituted something of a consensus in Christendom from the time of Chalcedon until recently" (Davis, 2006, 99). The creed defines what it means for God the Son to be incarnate, but does so in a way that allows for considerable metaphysical latitude. In the words of C. Stephen Evans, "This formulation at Chalcedon does not attempt a theoretical understanding of what it means for Jesus of Nazareth to be God Incarnate; it simply lays down some boundaries for what is to count as an orthodox Christian understanding of Jesus' status" (Evans, 2006a,1 ).

In order to stay within the confines of orthodoxy, metaphysical accounts of the incarnation must preserve Jesus Christ's divinity, humanity, and identity with God the Son. In other words, they must be compatible with three theses:

1) Jesus Christ is truly divine; in the language of Chalcedon: ". . . the same perfect in Godhead . . . truly God . . . consubstantial with the Father in Godhead" (Olson, 1999, 231).

2) Jesus Christ is truly human; in the words of the creed: ". . . the same in perfect manhood . . . truly man, the same of a rational soul and body. . .consubstantial with us in manhood; like us in all things except sin. . . " (Olson, 1999, 231).

3) Jesus Christ is a single individual identical to God the Son; in the words of Chalcedon: ". . . made known in two natures without confusion, without change, without division, without separation; the difference of the natures being by no means removed because of the union but rather the property of each nature being preserved, and coalescing in one person (prosopon) and one hypostasis, not parted or divided into two persons, but one and the same Son, only-begotten, the divine Word, the Lord Jesus Christ . . . " (Olson, 1999, 231-232).

We would do well to keep these three theses in mind as we consider "Responses to the Incompatibility Problem." Insofar as a response emphasizes the distinction between the human and divine, the third thesis will be most relevant for its evaluation. For responses that emphasize a reconsideration of the properties required for being truly human, the second thesis will be most pertinent for an assessment of it. And, as an approach focuses on a reconsideration of the constitutive properties of divinity, the first thesis is the most important one for its evaluation.

Finally, it is important to note some of the views these theses rule out. Arius (250-336), bishop of Alexandria, taught that the Son is "God's perfect creature" (Olson, 146) and therefore a lesser being than God the Father. Arian views deny the full divinity of God the Son and therefore are incompatible with the first thesis. Apollinarius, a 4th-century bishop of Laodicea, denied that God the Son Incarnate possessed a human mind as well as a human body. Apollinarian views deny the full humanity of God the Son Incarnate and therefore are incompatible with the second thesis. Nestorianism, taking its name from Nestorius, a 5th-century bishop of Constantinople, holds that in God the Son Incarnate there are two persons, one human and one divine, and is therefore incompatible with the third thesis.

2. The Incompatibility Problem

According to the classical account of the incarnation, Jesus Christ is truly human, truly divine, and a single individual who is identical to God the Son. Suppose that, as a matter of fact, Jesus of Nazareth worked as a carpenter, went fishing on the Sea of Galilee, and was unpopular with some civil and religious leaders. Things could have gone differently. Conceivably, Jesus might have been a potter who never set foot on the beaches of Galilee, and was unknown to the movers and shakers of his time. Either way he would have been truly human.

Characteristics or properties relating to employment, popularity, trips to the sea, and the like are compatible with being human but not essential for having that status. Just what properties are essential for being truly human is, as we shall see, a topic of considerable debate.

John Hick counts limited power and knowledge among the plausible candidates and argues that this spells trouble for the adherent of the Chalcedonian account of the incarnation, for the complements of these properties, unlimited knowledge and power, are essential for being truly divine.

. . . there is an obvious puzzle as to how the same being can jointly
embody those attributes of God and of humanity that are apparently
incompatible. God is eternal, whilst humans have a beginning in time;
God is infinite, humans finite; God is the creator of the universe,
including humanity, whilst humans are part of God's creation; God is
omnipotent, omniscient, omnipresent, whilst humans are limited in power
and knowledge and have a bounded location; and so on. Let us call this
the incompatible-attributes problem (Hick, 1993,102).

The worry, then, is that the classic account of the incarnation is flawed in the most fundamental sense; it runs counter to what Aristotle called the most certain principle: nothing can both be and not be at the same time and in the same respect (Metaphysics, Bk. IV, Part 3). If being truly human and being truly divine are indeed incompatible, then Jesus could no more have fulfilled the conditions of the Chalcedonian account of the incarnation than he could have been a spherical cube.

3. Responses to the Incompatibility Problem

a. Rejecting the Law of Non-contradiction

Toward the end of his journal, A Grief Observed, C.S. Lewis asks "Can a mortal ask questions which God finds unanswerable?" and readily replies in the affirmative.

Quite easily, I should think. All nonsense questions are unanswerable.
How many hours are there in a mile? Is yellow square or round? Probably
half of the questions we ask─half our great theological and metaphysical
problems─are like that (Lewis, 1961, 81).

Though there is no reason to think that Lewis had questions about the incarnation in mind, one could respond to the objection that the Chalcedonian account of the incarnation runs counter to the law of non-contradiction, by arguing that this law no more applies to the incarnation than geometric properties do to colors. Asking if God the Son's human nature is compatible with his divine nature, would be like asking if purple is perpendicular. It is what philosophers call ‘a category mistake,’ the error of applying concepts and distinctions to subjects where they have no purchase. In this regard, Thomas V. Morris cites H. M. Relton as asserting that "the person of Christ is the bankruptcy of human logic;" Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) as holding that the incarnation is "a breach with all thinking," and notes Gareth Moore's reference to those for whom "The doctrine of the incarnation expressed a divine mystery which we mere mortals could not expect to understand, and it was bordering on the blasphemous for any feeble, logic-chopping human intellect to attack it" (Morris, 1986, 24-25).

To evaluate rejecting the law of non-contradiction, as a response to the charge that some essential human and divine properties are incompatible, let's assume, for the sake of the argument, that the law does not apply to the incarnation. Since it tells us that nothing can both be and not be at the same time and in the same respect, making our assumption amounts to holding that God the Son could possess any property (e.g. having unlimited power) and its complement (e.g. having limited power).

If this were so, there could not be any problem with God the Son being truly human and truly divine, no matter how we understand ‘humanity’ and ‘divinity.’ But the same problem-free possibility would also go for God the Son being truly divine and incarnate as a doorknob, the number seven or a piece of toast. Furthermore, apart from the law of non-contradiction, God the Son Incarnate could both have any property (e.g. being human) and its complement (e.g. not being human), at the same time and in the same respect.  However, if having a property does not rule out its absence, then all property distinctions (e.g. being incarnate and not being incarnate) break down. As such, doing away with the law of non-contradiction, in order to defend the doctrine of the incarnation, leads to the loss all meaningful property distinctions, and the significance of theological assertions. What we need is a way to work within the metaphysical constraints of Chalcedon, not a way to shake them off altogether.

b. Rejecting the All-or-Nothing Account of Identity in Favor of Relative Identity

Our first attempt to address the incompatibility problem plaguing the Chalcedonian account of the incarnation rejecting the law of  non-contradiction led to the breakdown of meaningful property distinctions. A less radical approach for responding to the incompatibility problem requires a fresh look at the concept of identity. So far, in our reasoning, we have assumed that Jesus of Nazareth could be identical to God the Son only if Jesus possessed every property had by God the Son, and vice versa. In doing so, we have supposed that identity is an all-or-nothing affair. This view of identity is expressed in a principle Leibniz called the indiscernibility of identicals:

For any property P and any persons X and Y, if X is identical with Y then X has P if and only if Y has P (cf. Plantinga, 1976, 15).

Given both the law of non-contradiction and the indiscernibility of identicals, it is difficult indeed to see how Jesus of Nazereth could be identical to God the Son. Suppose Jesus is limited in power and God the Son is essentially all-powerful. The law of non-contradiction rules out the possibility of Jesus having both unlimited and limited power, and also the possibility of God the Son having both limited and unlimited power. But, the indiscernibility of identicals requires Jesus to have unlimited power in order to be identical to God the Son, and God the Son to have limited power in order to be identical to Jesus. It seems, then, that an acceptance of both the law of non-contradiction and the indiscernibility of identicals rules out the Chalcedonian view that a single individual can be both truly divine and truly human. So, if we want to affirm Chalcedon and retain the law of non-contradiction, it makes sense to consider rejecting the all-or-nothing account of identity expressed by the indiscernibility of identicals.

Some suggest that instead of thinking of identity as sameness in all respects, as in the indiscernibility of identicals, we should think of it as sameness in just some respects. On this account of identity, relative identity, two things, X and Y, can be identical in some respects but not others. So, for example, Senator Barack Obama and President Barack Obama are the same person but not the same official. As an official, Senator Barack Obama is a member of the legislative branch of government, while President Barack Obama, as an official, is a member of the executive branch of government.

The qualifiers in the Obama example, “person” and “official,” are count nouns, nouns we can modify numerically. It makes sense to speak of two persons or officials, but not of two courages or honesties. It follows, then, that while “person” and “official” are count nouns, “courage” and “honesty” are not.

For our present purposes, let’s suppose that Jesus of Nazareth is the same person as God the Son, but the two differ relative to X, where X does duty for some count noun. Let’s suppose that, relative to this count noun, Jesus is limited in knowledge and power and the like, and therefore not all-powerful and all-knowing, while God the Son is all-powerful and all-knowing and the like, and so not limited in power and knowledge.

Such an interpretation seems to be necessary if an appeal to relative identity is to show that Jesus of Nazareth and God the Son can be identical, notwithstanding property differences. However, it requires attributing essential human properties, like limited power, to Jesus but not God the Son, and essential divine properties, like unlimited knowledge, to God the Son but not Jesus of Nazareth. As a result, it is hard to see how an appeal to relative identity can be compatible with Chalcedon's requirement that the divine and human natures be ". . . without division, without separation . . . coalescing in one person (prosopon) and one hypostasis. . . "(Olson, 1999, 231), in keeping with the third Chalcedonian thesis.

c. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Human and/or Truly Divine

It is easy to assume, along with John Hick, that to be truly human God the Son had to be limited in knowledge and power, and, in general, possess the complements of essential divine properties. However, if Hick’s assumptions were unwarranted, then the doctrine of the incarnation would be perfectly compatible with the law of non-contradiction. We should then at least entertain the possibility that incompatibility problems show that our assumptions about the essential properties of humanity and/or divinity are incorrect.

i. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Human

1) Thomas V. Morris’s Distinctions Between Essential and Common Properties, and Full and Mere Humanity

Thomas V. Morris challenges our assumptions regarding the properties necessary for being truly human. He does so, by drawing our attention to two crucialbut commonly overlookeddistinctions. First, Morris asks us to consider the distinction between being fully but not merely X, and being fully and merely X. For example, a cube, like a two-dimensional square, is fully a rectangle, as each one of the cube's faces is a parallelogram with four right angles. However, a cube is not merely a rectangle, for it possesses a higher-level property; it is three-dimensional. A diamond-backed rattlesnake, like a diamond, is fully physical; it has a spatiotemporal location. But, a rattlesnake is not merely physical for it possesses higher-level properties diamonds lack, for example, cellular composition and voluntary motion. Similarly, God the Son Incarnate is fully but not merely human. He has all of the properties individually necessary and jointly sufficient for being human, but also higher-level divine properties.

Second, Morris draws our attention to the distinction between properties commonly possessed by humans and properties essential to humanity. By definition, if a property is essential for being human, all humans must have it. So, essential human properties are necessarily common human properties. However, the reverse does not hold. A property can be common without being essential. Breaking promises is a common human property but is not thereby an essential human property. God the Son's genuine humanity would not have been jeopardized by his faithfully fulfilling all of his promises.

Further, if we neglect these distinctions, we may incorrectly assume that properties commonly possessed by those who are merely human are necessary for being fully human. Morris thinks that this is exactly what we have done. We have assumed that the properties commonly possessed by mere humans, for example, limited knowledge and power, are necessary for being fully human. Once we see that this is not so, the incarnation is no longer an affront to the law of non-contradiction.

Morris's approach is bold and intriguing. Whether or not it is ultimately satisfactory, depends upon the strength of responses to the concerns it raises. First, if we allow, for the sake of the argument, that properties like limited knowledge and power are not essential for being fully human, we might  well ask, "What are essential?" In response, Morris takes a wait-and-see approach, "What essentially constitutes a human body and a human mind we wait upon a perfected science or a more complete revelation to say. We have neither a very full-blown nor a very fine-grained understanding of either at this point" (Morris, 1991, 166).

Second, we might ask "if properties like limited power and knowledge are not essential for being fully human, why are they so common?" Morris suggests that what makes these properties so common is either that they are included in our individual human natures, or they are the result of being merely human, that is, not possessing some additional nature (Morris, 1991, 165). Thus, the reason why Thomas V. Morris and the rest of us is limited in power and knowledge is either that his human nature is not possessed along with some higher nature, or because his individual nature the properties essential for being the particular human that is Thomas V. Morris includes limitations in power and knowledge.

There is a third concern. Morris rightly recognizes that an internally consistent account of the incarnation is not the only desideratum; he also wants an account that squares with the New Testament portrait of Jesus of  Nazareth. Morris must explain how it is that God the Son Incarnate could be, as described in the gospels, limited in power and knowledge (e.g. Mark 13:32; John 4:6), even though he remained omnipotent and omniscient. Morris's answer is that God the Son Incarnate had both a divine and human mind, and sometimes chose to rely only upon the resources of his human mind.

. . .  in the case of God Incarnate we must recognize something like two distinct minds or systems of mentality. There is first what we can call the eternal mind of God the Son, with its distinctively divine consciousness . . . encompassing the full scope of omniscience, empowered by the resources of  omnipotence, and present in power and knowledge throughout the entirety of the creation. And, in addition to this divine mind, there is a distinctly earthly mind with its consciousness that came into existence and developed with the conception, human birth and growth of Christ’s earthly form of   existence. . . . By living out his earthly life from on the resources of the human body and mind, he took on the form of our existence and shared the plight of our   condition (Morris, 1991, 169).

Talk of two minds inevitably raises the specter of two persons and Nestorianism. On a Cartesian view of persons, a human mind is a human person. From this perspective, if the incarnation required both a divine mind and human mind, then in God the Son Incarnate there were two persons, one human and one divine. Morris is aware of the concern and grants that in the case of mere humans, a human mind is a human person, "What we can refer to as my mental system was intended by God to define a person" (Morris, 1991, 174). However, for God incarnate, one who is fully human, but not merely human, having a human mind is not sufficient for being a human person. That individual’s personhood depends upon his ultimate metaphysical status, in this case divinity (Morris, 1991, 174).

2) Richard Swinburne’s Rejection of a Human Mind/Soul in Favor of a Human Range of Consciousness

At the core of Richard Swinburne’s account of the incarnation is the claim that God the Son Incarnate has both a human range of consciousness and a divine range of consciousness. In this way his view is akin to Thomas V. Morris’s. However, there is a crucial difference between their accounts. Morris holds that God the Son Incarnate has two minds, a divine mind and a human mind, each with its own range of consciousness.

Swinburne argues that God the Son Incarnate has a single mind with two ranges of consciousness. Instead of Morris’s two-minds view of the incarnation, Swinburne offers a divided-mind account of the incarnation.

To understand what Swinburne’s divided-mind view amounts to and why he prefers it to Morris’s two-minds view, we need to consider his understanding of humanity. In general, a mental substance, that is, a soul/mind, is human if it has a human body and is capable of “acting, acquiring beliefs, sensations and desires through it” (Swinburne, 1994, 196). Note that on this view, a mental substance is human only if it has a human body.

Richard Swinburne and the rest of us are human. But, by Swinburne’s reckoning, we are not essentially so. This follows from the fact that having a human body is a necessary condition for being human, and it is conceivable that we exist either without a body or with a very different sort of body. But, while no soul is essentially human, one soul became human by choice.

In taking on a human body and acquiring a human range of consciousness, God the Son did not lose omnipotence or omniscience. Indeed, he could not do so, for he is essentially divine, and omnipotence and omniscience belong to the divine nature. Instead, by becoming human, God the Son acquired additional ways of accessing the world; he took on “a way of operating which is limited and feels limited” (Swinburne, 1989, 66). So, we can explain references in the gospels to God the Son’s ignorance and powerlessness, as the results of the Son only relying on his human range of consciousness and abilities.

Because of his divided-mind account of the incarnation, Richard Swinburne steers clear of Nestorianism, for without two minds there cannot be two persons. That said, some may worry that without two minds, there cannot be two natures. If this is so, then Swinburne’s divided-mind view of the incarnation avoids Nestorianism only by taking an Apollinarian position in which God the Son incarnate has a human body but lacks a human mind.

Swinburne is well aware of the apparent problem and has a ready response. His view would be Apollinarian, if, in their talk about taking on a “reasonable soul,” the Fathers of Chalcedon had wished to affirm that God the Son took on an immaterial substance, a Cartesian soul so to speak. But that could not have been their view for then they would have been committed to a position they expressly denied, namely, that in the incarnation there are two beings. Instead, we should understand “soul” in the creed’s reference to “reasonable soul,” in an Aristotelian sense. So understood, to say that God the Son took on a human soul is to claim that he acquired “a human way of thinking and acting” (Swinburne, 1989, 61, note 12). If this reading of Chalcedon is correct, then Swinburne’s account does not entail Apollinarianism.

ii. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Divine: the Kenotic Approach

The counterpart to reconsidering what properties are essential to humanity is a reexamination of the properties essential to divinity. If we have reason to believe contrary to Thomas V. Morris's suggestion that limited knowledge and power are not just common human properties but essential ones, consistency requires that we no longer count omnipotence and omniscience as essential divine properties. There is data in the New Testament that would support revising the list of essential divine properties. The New Testament records tell us that God the Son was sometimes tired (John 4:6) and that he grew in wisdom (Luke 2:52). When these descriptions are considered along side of Philippians 2:7, which tells us that God the Son “emptied himself” in order to become incarnate, it is reasonable to suppose that God the Son Incarnate relinquished properties such as omnipotence and omniscience. This approach to the incarnation is known as the kenotic view, in keeping with the Greek verb keneo, “to empty,” found in Philippians 2:7.

In order for God the Son to be able to give up properties like omnipotence and omniscience, two things need to be true. First, none of these properties could be essential properties of divinity, for God the Son is, by his very nature, divine, and no being can lose an essential property and continue to exist. Second, all of these properties, if possessed by God the Son, or another member of the Trinity, must be compatible with the essential properties of divinity, for God the Son can relinquish only what he can possess, and can possess only properties compatible with his divine nature.

It is important to distinguish God the Son’s relinquishing of properties like omniscience and omnipotence in the kenotic view, with the views of Morris and Swinburne on which God the Son chose not to avail himself of these properties for a period of time. For Morris and Swinburne, omnipotence and omniscience are essential divine properties and therefore ones that God the Son must always have. On the kenotic view these properties are accidental and therefore properties that God the Son can lose. On the kenotic view, there was a period of time during which God the Son could not possibly avail himself of omnipotence and omniscience (Evans, 2006b, 200).

If properties like omnipotence and omniscience are not essential divine properties, one might well ask: in what sense are power and knowledge essential to divinity? The kenotic response is that, it is not omnipotence but omnipotence unless freely given up, not omniscience but omniscience unless freely given up, that are essential properties of divinity. On the kenotic view, God the Son gives up the “omni properties” in order to become incarnate, while retaining the "unless properties.”

If “omni properties” are not essential for divinity, then God the Father and God the Holy Spirit could also give up omnipotence and omniscience. If all three persons of the Trinity did so simultaneously ─ and to the extent God the Son did at the beginning of the incarnation ─ there would be a time when many ordinary humans would surpass God in knowledge and power. This seems sufficient for a reductio ad absurdum of the kenotic view.

Ronald J. Feenstra sees the problematic nature of a complete Trinitarian kenosis, and so suggests a further refinement of essential divine properties, replacing omnipotence unless freely given up with omnipotence unless freely given up for the sake of reconciliation and omniscience unless freely given up with omniscience unless freely given up for the sake of reconciliation. Given this fine-tuning and an assumption that God the Son has accomplished the work of redemption, it would no longer be possible to have an absurd scenario in which many humans surpass all three members of the Trinity in knowledge and power (Feenstra, 2006, 153).

There would, however, be another problem: the kenotic approach would appear ad hoc, inviting the following question: "Apart from rescuing a Chalcedonian account of the incarnation, is there any reason to suppose that God has these fine-tuned kenotic properties?" In response, the kenotic theologian might argue, in keeping with Alvin Plantinga's "Advice to Christian Philosophers" (Plantinga, 1984), that it is perfectly appropriate to begin with what we know about the incarnation and revise our concepts of God and humanity accordingly (Feenstra, 2006, 159).

By the same token, if there is a conflict between special revelation and the kenotic account of the incarnation, the latter must go. C. Stephen Evans, a defender of the kenotic approach, draws our attention to just such an apparent conflict concerning the glorification of God the Son Incarnate and expresses it in the form of a dilemma (Evans 2002, 263-264).

  • ŸEither the glorified God the Son Incarnate reassumes the properties he set aside or not.
  • ŸIf so, these properties are compatible with God the Son’s incarnation, contrary to the kenotic view.
  • ŸIf not, the kenotic view has a deficient account of the glorification of God the Son Incarnate.
  • ŸSo, either the kenotic approach is incorrect in supposing that God the Son’s incarnation requires setting aside certain properties or it is committed to a deficient account of God the Son's glorification.

In response to this dilemma, a kenotic defender could distinguish between incarnation and kenosis, and argue that while kenosis entails incarnation, the reverse is not true. It may be that kenosis was the means by which God the Son became incarnate and subsequently shared our trials and temptations (Feenstra 1989, 148-150). However, kenosis and incarnation are not co-extensive for, while God the Son's kenosis ends at his glorification, his incarnation does not. Evans suggests that ". . . Christ's Incarnation in an ordinary body may have required a kenosis, but the kind of body he possesses in his glorified state may be compatible with the reassumption of all of the traditional theistic properties" (Evans 206b., 201-202). If this is right, then limited power and knowledge are not essential human properties after all. The relevant essential properties are more fine-grained: being limited in power while having an ordinary (unglorified) human body, being limited in knowledge while having an ordinary (ungloried) human body and so forth. So, God the Son gave up the properties like omnipotence and omniscience, not because he had to do so to be truly human─or else the glorified Son of God would not be truly human─but because our redemption required it.

iii. Reconsidering the Properties Required for Being Truly Divine and  Truly Human: Marilyn Adams’ Qualified-Property Approach

Marilyn Adams holds that, barring a miracle, every human individual is  essentially human. In the miracle of the incarnation God the Son, who is essentially divine, acquires a human nature. As a result, God the Son is not only truly divine, but also truly human. However, since God the Son is not essentially human, none of the properties included in his human nature are among his essential properties.

In virtue of possessing a divine nature, God the Son has the property of being uncreated, while in virtue of having a human nature, he possesses the property of being created. Possessing both of these properties appears to be a violation of the law of non-contradiction, which tells us that nothing can both be and not be at the same time and in the same respect. Adams, however, taking her cue from Duns Scotus (1266-1308) (Adams, 2006, 133), argues that there is no incompatibility with the law of non-contradiction. As she sees it, strictly speaking, God the Son Incarnate does not possess the property pair: being created and being uncreated, but rather the pair: uncreated as (qua) divine and created as (qua) human. Further, since God the Son Incarnate is essentially divine and contingently human, he possesses the property of being uncreated, without qualification (simpliciter) and the property of being created, with qualification. Either way we choose to describe the difference between God the Son’s essential possession of his divine properties and contingent possession of his human properties, God the Son does not possess them in the same sense. Therefore there is no violation of the law of non-contradiction.

Adams goes on to note that Richard Cross (Cross, 2002, 204-205) “remains dubious” about this approach (Adams, 2006, 133). Chalcedon requires that God the Son Incarnate be “consubstantial with us in manhood; like us in all things except sin” (Olson, 1999, 231). However, what we possess is the property of being created, simpliciter, a property that God the Son Incarnate cannot possess as he has the property of being uncreated, simpliciter. It seems then that the distinction between properties God the Son Incarnate possesses with and without qualification, keeps the incarnation in line with the law of non-contradiction only by denying a core Chalcedonian claim - God the Son Incarnate is like us, save for sin. In response, Adams argues that the difficulty is only apparent, for the content of God the Son Incarnate’s human nature is the same as our nature; what differs is the way the content is attributed to him.

Commentators needlessly worry that if the Divine Word does not possess human nature in the way we do . . . in such a way that we could not exist without being human ─ then the Divine Word isn’t fully or perfectly human ─ i.e., doesn’t really possess all of what goes into being a human being. What the doctrine requires is that the Divine Word while essentially Divine contingently come to possess human nature in such a way as to be characterized by such features. So far as I know, no one . . . has envisioned the Divine Word possessing human nature essentially in such a way that the Divine Word couldn’t exist without being human (Adams, 2006, 134).

d. Showing that God the Son Incarnate Does Not Possess Any Property and its Complement “in the same respect”: Eleonore Stump’s Borrowed-Property View

Given the law of non-contradiction, God the Son Incarnate cannot both have and lack a property at the same time and in the same respect. To see how God the Son might have a property in one respect, but lack it in another, it is helpful to consider some everyday examples of this sort of thing. An apple, with respect to its skin, has the property of being red, but, with respect to its whitish inside, lacks that property. So, the apple has and lacks the property of being red, but there is no incoherence here because the apple has that property in one respect and lacks it in another (Leftow, 1992, 288). Similarly, a knife, with respect to its cutting edge, has the property of being sharp, but with respect to its handle, lacks that property. So, the knife has and lacks the property of being sharp, but there is no incoherence here for the knife has this property in one respect, but lacks it in another.

On the classical view of the incarnation, God the Son Incarnate is truly human and truly divine. Some, John Hick for example, hold that there cannot be a truly human and truly divine individual because, for example, such a being would have to possess omnipotence, to be fully divine, and lack it, to be fully human. This would indeed be problematic if God the Son Incarnate had to have and lack omnipotence at the same time and in the same respect. However, given that God the Son Incarnate has two natures, he can have some properties with respect to one nature and lack them with respect to the other nature. God Incarnate, with respect to his divine nature, is omnipotent, but with respect to his human nature, is not. God Incarnate, with respect to his human nature, is ignorant of some things, but, with respect to his divine nature, is not.

There is a significant objection to this way of reconciling the classical account of the incarnation with the law of non-contradiction; it only avoids running afoul of the law of non-contradiction by, contrary to Chalcedon, "dividing the natures" of God Incarnate. If one must treat God Incarnate's human and divine natures as watertight compartments in order to avoid contradiction, then one must also give up the Chalcedonian claim that the two natures combine in one person. Or, to put a positive spin on it, if one is going to appeal to God the Son's natures to show that he can possess a property with respect to one nature but not another ─ and stay within the bounds of Chalcedon ─ one will need to show how a property can be had relative to a nature, without being had only by that nature. By way of example, one will need to show that God the Son himself, not just his divine nature, can have the property of omnipotence, even though he is omnipotent only because that property belongs to his divine nature. Also, one would need to show that God the Son himself, can have the property of lacking strength, even though he has that property only because it is a part of his human nature. Though this description of the requisite demonstration has the appearance of an impossibility, Eleonore Stump  argues that with the notion of a "borrowed property" ─ a concept she finds implicit in Thomas Aquinas’s (1225-1274) work on the incarnation (Stump, 2002, 205-206) ─ it is possible to steer clear of contradiction and stay within the confines of Chalcedon.

For an explicit account of borrowed property, Eleonore Stump draws on the work of Lynne Rudder Baker:

Borrowing walks a fine line. On the one hand, if x borrows H from y, then x really has H-piggyback, so to speak . . . If I cut my hand, then I really bleed . . . I borrow the property of bleeding from my body, but I really bleed. But the fact that I am bleeding is none other than the fact that I am constituted by a body that is bleeding. So, not only does x really have H by borrowing it, but also ─ and this is the other hand ─ if x borrows H from y, there are not two independent instances of H: if x borrows H, then x's having H is entirely a matter of having constitution elations to something that has H non-derivatively. [quoted in (Stump 2002), p. 205]

Stump provides an illustration of borrowed properties. She notes that Mark Twain's Letters From the Earth is both comic and serious; as a biting critique of Christianity it is serious and as a satire it is comic. The work as a whole borrows the property of seriousness from its overall aim, while borrowing its comic property from Twain's sarcasm and humor. So, Letters From the Earth is serious, with respect to its attack on Christianity, and comic, with respect to Twain's use of humor. In a like manner, God the Son is omniscient with respect to his divine nature, and limited in knowledge with respect to his human nature. Just as the apparently incompatible properties, being comic and being serious, can be predicated of Letters From the Earth as a whole, when they are taken to be borrowed properties, so property pairs like unlimited knowledge and limited knowledge can be predicated of the person, God the Son, when they are understood as borrowed properties. The person, God the Son, borrows the property of omniscience from his divine nature and the property of limited knowledge from his human nature. As such, God the Son as (qua) divine is omniscient and as (qua) human is limited in knowledge.

4. Conclusion

The claim that God the Son Incarnate is truly human and truly divine appears to run afoul of the law of non-contradiction, which states that nothing can both be and not be at the same time and in the same respect. Four approaches to this incompatibility problem stand out: giving up the law of non-contradiction; adopting a relative account of identity; reconsidering the properties required for being truly human and/or divine; showing that God Incarnate does not possess any property and its complement in the same respect. Versions of the third and fourth approaches include Thomas V. Morris’s two-minds view, Richard Swinburne’s divided-mind account, Ronald J. Feenstra’s kenotic view, Marilyn Adams’ qualified-property perspective, and Eleonore Stump’s borrowed-property account. Significantly, all of these philosophers argue that their positions are compatible with the Chalcedonian Creed.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. 2006. Christ and Horrors. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cross, Richard. 2002. The Metaphysics of God Incarnate. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Davis, Stephen T. 2006. Christian Philosophical Theology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Evans, C. Stephen. 2002. “The Self-Emptying of Love: Some Thoughts on Kenotic Christology” in Davis, Stephen T.; Kendall, Daniel, SJ; O’Collins, Gerald, S.J. eds. The Incarnation. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 246-272.
  • Evans, C. Stephen. 2006a. “Introduction” in C. Stephen Evans ed. Exploring Kenotic Christology: The Self-Emptying of God. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 1-24.
  • Evans, C. Stephen. 2006b. “Kenotic Christology and the Nature of God” in C. Stephen Evans ed. Exploring Kenotic Christology: The Self-Emptying of God. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 190-217.
  • Feenstra, Ronald J. 1989. “Reconsidering Kenotic Christology” in Feenstra, Ronald J. and Plantinga, Cornelius, Jr. eds. Trinity Incarnation and Atonement. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Feenstra, Ronald J. 2006 “A Kenotic Christological Method for Understanding the Divine Attributes” in C. Stephen Evans ed. Exploring Kenotic Christology: The Self-Emptying of God. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 139-164.
  • Hick, John. 1993. The Metaphor of God Incarnate. Louisville, KY: Westminster Press.
  • Leftow, Brian. 1992. “A Timeless God Incarnate ” in eds. Davis, Stephen T.; Kendall, Daniel, SJ; O’Collins, Gerald, S.J. eds. The Incarnation. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 273-299.
  • Lewis, C.S. 1961. A Grief Observed. New York: Bantam Books.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1986. The Logic of God Incarnate. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1991. Our Idea of God. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Olson, Roger E. 1999. The Story of Christian Theology. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1976. The Nature of Necessity. Oxford, Oxford University Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1984. “Advice to Christian Philosophers” in Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 1, Number 3. pp. 253-271.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 2002. “Aquinas’ Metaphysics of Incarnation” in eds. Davis, Stephen T.; Kendall, Daniel, SJ; O’Collins, Gerald, S.J. eds. The Incarnation. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 197-220.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1989. “Could God Become Man?” in ed. Godfrey Vesey, The Philosophy in Christianity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. pp.53-70.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 1994. The Christian God. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Author information

David Werther
Email: dwerther@dcs.wisc.edu
University of Wisconsin, Madison
U. s. A.




Article printed from Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy: http://www.iep.utm.edu/incarnat/

Copyright © The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy. All rights reserved.