In its most generic sense, “Indian Materialism” refers to the school of thought within Indian philosophy that rejects supernaturalism. It is regarded as the most radical of the Indian philosophical systems. It rejects the existence of other worldly entities such an immaterial soul or god and the after-life. Its primary philosophical import comes by way of a scientific and naturalistic approach to metaphysics. Thus, it rejects ethical systems that are grounded in supernaturalistic cosmologies. The good, for the Indian materialist, is strictly associated with pleasure and the only ethical obligation forwarded by the system is the maximization of one’s own pleasure.
The terms Lokāyata and Cārvāka have historically been used to denote the philosophical school of Indian Materialism. Literally, “Lokāyata” means philosophy of the people. The term was first used by the ancient Buddhists until around 500 B.C.E. to refer to both a common tribal philosophical view and a sort of this-worldly philosophy or nature lore. The term has evolved to signify a school of thought that has been scorned by religious leaders in India and remains on the periphery of Indian philosophical thought. After 500 B.C.E., the term acquired a more derogatory connotation and became synonymous with sophistry. It was not until between the 6th and 8th century C.E. that the term “Lokāyata” began to signify Materialist thought. Indian Materialism has also been named Cārvāka after one of the two founders of the school. Cārvāka and Ajita Kesakambalin are said to have established Indian Materialism as a formal philosophical system, but some still hold that Bṛhaspati was its original founder. Bṛhaspati allegedly authored the classic work on Indian Materialism, the Bṛhaspati Sῡtra. There are some conflicting accounts of Bṛhaspati’s life, but, at the least, he is regarded as the mythical authority on Indian Materialism and at most the actual author of the since-perished Bṛhaspati Sῡtra. Indian Materialism has for this reason also been named “Bṛhaspatya.”
Traces of materialism appear in the earliest recordings of Indian thought. Initially, Indian Materialism or Lokāyata functioned as a sort of negative reaction to spiritualism and supernaturalism. During the 6th and 7th centuries C.E. it evolved into a formal school of thought and remains intact, though consistently marginalized.
Vedic thought, in the most comprehensive sense, refers to the ideas contained within the Samhitas and the Brāhamaṇas, including the Upaniṣads. Historians have estimated that the Vedas were written and compiled between the years 1500 B.C.E. and 300 B.C.E. It is difficult to point to one philosophical view in the Upaniṣads, at least by Western standards; however they are considered by scholars to comprise all of the philosophical writing of the Vedas. The Vedas exemplify the speculative attitude of the ancient Indians, who had the extreme luxury of reflecting on the whence and whither of their existence. The ancient Indians, also called Aryans, flourished due to the bounty of food and resources provided by the land. Free from the burdens of political conflict and social upheaval, they were able to ponder the origin of the universe and the purpose of life. Their meditations on such subjects have been recorded in the literature of the Vedas.
The Vedic period marked the weakest stage of the development of Indian Materialism. In its most latent form, Materialism is evident in early Vedic references to a man who was known as Bṛhaspati and his followers. The literature suggests that Bṛhaspati did not attempt to forward a constructive system of philosophy but rather characteristically refuted the claims of others schools of thought. In this sense, followers of Bṛhaspati were not only skeptical but intentionally destructive of the orthodoxies of the time. It is thought that any mention of “unbelievers” or “scoffers” in the Vedas refers to those who identified with Bṛhaspati and his materialist views. Thus, Materialism in its original form was essentially anti-Vedic. One of Bṛhaspati’s principal objections to orthodoxy was the practice of repeating verses of sacred texts without understanding their meaning. However, Bṛhaspati’s ideas (“Bṛhaspatya”) would not become a coherent philosophical view without any positive import. His followers eventually adopted the doctrine of “Svabhava,” which at this point in history signified the rejection of 1) the theory of causation and 2) the notion that there are good and evil consequences of moral actions. “Svabhava” enhanced Bṛhaspatya by providing it with the beginnings of a metaphysical framework. In the concluding portions of the Vedas there are violent tales of the opposition of the Bṛhaspatya people to the spiritualism of the time. Interestingly, the following anecdote from the Taittiriya Brāhmaṇa implies that the gods were impervious to the destructive efforts of Bṛhaspati:
Once upon a time Bṛhaspati struck the goddess Gāyatrī on the head. The head smashed into pieces and the brain split. But Gāyatrī is immortal. She did not die. Every bit of her brain was alive. (Dakshinaranjan, 12)
The term “Svabhava” in Sanskrit can be translated to “essence” or “nature.” Bṛhaspati used the term to indicate a school of thought that rejected supernaturalism and the ethical teachings that followed from supernaturalist ideologies. Bṛhaspati and his followers were scorned and ridiculed for not believing in the eternal nature of reality and for not revering the gods and the truths they were supposed to have espoused. It is interesting to note that while other schools have incorporated the “Svabhava” as a doctrine of essences or continuity of the soul, the use of the term by Bṛhaspati was specifically meant to represent his association with the philosophical naturalism. Naturalism, in this sense, rejects a Platonic notion of essences and the dualism that is exemplified in Platonic philosophy as well as some of the Indian spiritualistic schools. This brand of dualism is that which asserts that there are two categorically different realms of reality: the material and the immaterial. Supernaturalism in general embraces this doctrine and holds that the latter realm is not encompassed by “nature.” In contrast to this, Naturalism rejects the existence of the immaterial realm and suggests that all of reality is encompassed by nature. Widely varying schools of Naturalism exist today and do not necessarily embrace the mechanistic materialism that was originally embraced by the Cārvāka.
The major work of the Epic Period of Indian history (circa 200 B.C.E. to 200 C.E.) is the Mahābhārata. The Great War between the Kurus and the Pandavas inspired a many-sided conversation about morality. Conversation developed into intellectual inquiry and religion began to be replaced by philosophy. It was around the beginning of this period that the Bṛhaspati school began to merge with the philosophical naturalism of the time. Naturalism rejected the existence of a spiritual realm and also rejected the notion that the morality of an action can cause either morally good or evil consequences. Naturalist underpinnings helped to further shape Indian Materialism into a free-standing philosophical system. The term Lokāyata replaced Bṛhaspatya and scholars have speculated that this was due to the desire for a distinction between the more evolved philosophical system and its weaker anti-Vedic beginnings. The Lokāyata remained oppositional to the religious thought of the time, namely, Jainism and Buddhism, but it was also positive in that it claimed the epistemological authority of perception. Furthermore, it attempted to explain existence in terms of the four elements (earth, air, fire, water). While there is little certainty about the formal development of the Lokāyata school during the Epic Period, it is suspected that its adoption of naturalistic metaphysics led to its eventual association with scientific inquiry and rationalistic philosophy. Materialism stood out as a doctrine because it rejected the theism of the Upaniṣadic teachings as well as the ethical teachings of Buddhism and Jainism. It stood for individuality and rejected the authority of scripture and testimony.
The Lokāyata adopted its hedonistic values during the development of the Brāhmaṇical systems of philosophy (circa 1000 C.E.). As a reaction against the ascetic and meditative practices of the religious devout, Indian Materialism celebrated the pleasures of the body. People began gratifying their senses with no restraint. Pleasure was asserted as the highest good and, according to the Lokāyata, was the only reasonable way to enjoy one’s life. Some scholarship suggests that during this stage of its development Indian Materialism began to be referred to as “Cārvāka” in addition to the “Lokāyata.” This is contrary to the more popular view that the school was named Cārvāka after its historical founder helped to establish the Lokāyata as a legitimate philosophy. The term Cārvāka literally means “entertaining speech” and is derived from the term charva, which means to chew or grind with one’s teeth. It is possible that Cārvāka himself acquired the name due to his association with Indian Materialism, which then led to the school acquiring the name as well. This is one of many areas of the history of Indian Materialism that remains open to debate.
The perceived value of Lokāyata from within the Indian Philosophical community is as relevant a topic as its philosophical import. If nothing else, the etymology of the term Lokāyata is evidence of the consistent marginalization of Indian Materialism. Because of its association with hedonistic behavior and heretical religious views, followers of the spiritualistic schools of Indian philosophy (Jainism, Buddhism, Hinduism) are reticent on the subject of the materialistic tendencies present in their own systems; however, some scholars, such as Daya Krishna, have suggested that materialism is, in varying degrees, present in all Indian philosophical schools. This is not to say that materialism replaces other ideologies—it is to say rather that notions about the priority of this-worldliness appear even in some spiritualistic schools. While matter does not take priority over the spiritual realm in every sense, its significance is elevated more so than in other major world religions. This observation, for some, carries little weight when examining the philosophical import of the various Indian schools of thought; however, it seems relevant when considering the evolution of Indian thought. The original meaning of Lokāyata as prevalent among the people has become true in the sense that it is pervasive in Indian philosophical thought at large. This is not to say that materialism is widely accepted or even that its presence is overtly acknowledged, but it is difficult to deny its far-reaching influence on Indian Philosophy as a whole.
The most significant influence that Materialism has had on Indian thought is in the field of science. The spread of Indian Materialism led to the mindset that matter can be of value in itself. Rather than a burden to our minds or souls, the Materialist view promoted the notion that the body itself can be regarded as wondrous and full of potential. Evidence in this shift in perspective can be seen by the progress of science over the course of India’s history. Materialist thought dignified the physical world and elevated the sciences to a respectable level. Moreover, the Materialist emphasis on empirical validation of truth became the golden rule of the Scientific Method. Indian Materialism pre-dated the British Empiricist movement by over a millennium. Whereas the authority of empirical evidence carried little weight in Ancient India, modern thought began to value the systematic and cautious epistemology that first appeared in the thought of the Lokāyata.
Regardless of its positive influence on Indian thought, the fact remains that Indian Materialism is often regarded as blatant heresy against the Spiritualistic schools. It rejects the theism of Hinduism as well as the moralism of Buddhist and Jain thought. The anti-orthodox claims of the Materialists are seen as heretical by the religious masses and fly in the face of the piety promoted by most religious sects. However, it is questionable whether the formal ethics of Materialism are truly practiced to their logical extent by those who claim to belong to the school. It is suspected by many scholars that Indian Materialism today stands for an atheistic view that values science in place of supernaturalism. More than anything, Materialists have historically expressed a view that has not found favor among the established religious and social authorities.
There are no existing works that serve as the doctrinal texts for the Lokāyata. The available materials on the school of thought are incomplete and have suffered through centuries of deterioration. Mere fragments of the Bṛhaspati Sῡtra remain in existence and because of their obscure nature provide little insight into the doctrine and practices of ancient Indian Materialists. Clues about the history of Indian Materialism have been pieced together to formulate at best a sketchy portrayal of how the “philosophy of the people” originated and evolved over thousands of years.
Epistemological thought varies in Indian philosophy according to how each system addresses the question of “Pramānas” or the “sources and proofs of knowledge.” (Mittal 41) The Lokāyata (Cārvāka) school recognized perception (pratkaysa) alone as a reliable source of knowledge. They therefore rejected two commonly held pramānas: 1) inference (anumana) and 2) testimony (sabda). Because of its outright rejection of such commonly held sources of knowledge, the Lokāyata was not taken seriously as a school of philosophy. The common view was that Cārvākas merely rejected truth claims and forwarded none of their own. To be a mere skeptic during the time amounted to very low philosophical stature.
However, there are additional accounts of the Lokāyata that suggest that the epistemology was more advanced and positivistic than that of mere skepticism. In fact, it has been compared to the empiricism of John Locke and David Hume. The Cārvākas denied philosophical claims that could not be verified through direct experience. Thus, the Lokāyata denied the validity of inferences that were made based upon truth claims that were not empirically verifiable. However, logical inferences that were made based on premises that were derived from direct experience were held as valid. It is believed that this characterization of the epistemology of the Lokāyata most accurately describes the epistemological position of contemporary Indian Materialism.
Cārvākas were, in a sense, the first philosophical pragmatists. They realized that not all sorts of inference were problematic; in order to proceed through daily life inference is a necessary step. For practical purposes, the Lokāyata made a distinction between inferences made based on probability as opposed to certainty. The common example used to demonstrate the difference is the inference that if smoke is rising from a building it is probably an indication that there is a fire within the building. However, Cārvākas were unwilling to accept anything beyond this sort of mundane use of inference, such as the mechanical inference forwarded by the Buddhists. The Lokāyata refused to accept inferences about what has never been perceived, namely god or the after-life.
The ontology of the Lokāyata rests on the denial of the existence of non-perceivable entities such as God or spiritual realm. Critics of this school of thought point to the fallacy of moving from the premise “the soul cannot be known” to the conclusion “the soul does not exist.” Again, there is a pragmatic tendency in this sort of thinking. It seems that followers of the Lokāyata were not concerned with truths that could not be verified; however they were not entirely skeptical. The Lokāyata posited that the world itself and all material objects of the world are real. They held that all of existence can be reduced to the four elements of air, water, fire and earth. All things come into existence through a mixture of these elements and will perish with their separation. Perhaps the most philosophically sophisticated position of Indian Materialism is the assertion that even human consciousness is a material construct. According to K. K. Mittal, the ontology of the Lokāyata is strictly set forth as follows:
Mittal reports (ibid.), apparently two schools of thought within the Lokāyata arose out of these tenets. One forwarded the position that there can be no self or soul apart from the body; another posited that a soul can exist alongside a body as long as the body lives, but that the soul perishes with the body. The latter view adopted the position that the soul is pure air or breath, which is a form of matter. Therefore, the Lokāyata collectively rejects the existence of an other-worldly soul, while sometimes accepts the notion of a material soul.
To speculate as to why the universe exists would be an exercise in futility for an Indian Materialist. The purpose and origin of existence is not discoverable through scientific means. Furthermore, the speculation about such matters leads to anxiety and frustration, which reduce pleasure and overall contentment. There is no teleology implicit in Indian Materalism, which is evidenced in the school’s position that the universe itself probably came into existence by chance. Although there can be no certainty about the origin of the universe, the most probable explanation is that it evolved as a result of a series of random events.
There is also no doctrine of Creation in the Lokāyata. The principles of karma (action) and niyati (fate) are rejected because they are derived from the notion that existence in itself is purposeful. The fundamental principle of Indian Materialism was and remains “Svabhava” or nature. This is not to suggest that nature itself has no internal laws or continuity. It would be a misinterpretation of Indian Materialism to suppose that it forwards a cosmology of chaos. Rather, it resembles most closely the naturalism forwarded by the American philosopher John Dewey. While it posits no “creator” or teleology, Indian Materialism regards nature itself as a force that thrives according to its own law.
The most common view among scholars regarding the ethic of Indian Materialism is that it generally forwards Egoism. In other words, it adopts the perspective that an individual’s ends take priority over the ends of others. Materialists are critical of other ethical systems for being tied to notions of duty or virtue that are derived from false, supernaturalist cosmologies. Indian Materialism regards pleasure in itself and for itself as the only good and thus promotes hedonistic practices. Furthermore, it rejects a utilitarian approach to pleasure. Utilitarianism regards pleasure (both higher and lower) as the ultimate good and therefore promotes the maximization of the good (pleasure) on a collective level. Indian Materialism rejects this move away from pure egoism. The doctrine suggests that individuals have no obligation to promote the welfare of society and would only tend to do so if it were to ultimately benefit them as well.
It is interesting to note that the Cārvāka school has been maligned by virtually all schools of Indian philosophy not merely for its rejection of the supernatural but probably more so for its insistent rejection of anything beyond Egoistic ethics. In fact, some scholars hold that Indian Materialism is purely nihilistic. That is to say that an Egoistic or Hedonistic ethic are not even essential elements of the system, but certainly serve as accurate descriptions for the held values and practices of the Cārvāka people. This view holds that the axiology of the Cārvāka was purely negative. It claims nothing more than the rejection of both what we think of now as a Platonic notion of “The Good” along with any notion of “god” or “gods.”
The term “nāstika” is used by almost all schools of Indian Philosophy as a critical term to refer to another school of thought that has severely breeched what is thought to be acceptable in terms of both religious beliefs and ethical values. The greatest recipient of this term is the Cārvāka school. Commonly degraded to the same degree, the term “Cārvāka” and the more general term “nāstika” are sometimes used interchangeably simply to denote a brand of thinking that does not fall in line with the classical schools of Indian thought. The chief insult that is imported by the term “nāstika” is that the recipient of the title has strayed dangerously away from a path toward enlightenment. Ethical practices and one’s spiritual education in Indian culture are inextricably tied to one another. Those who identify with the Indian Materialist school are criticized by the prominent Indian philosophical schools of thought because they are viewed as largely ignorant of both metaphysical and moral truths. This sort of ignorance is not perceived as a grave threat to the greater good of society, but rather to the individual who is bereft of spiritual and moral knowledge. That Indian Philosophy as a whole shows concern for the individual beliefs and practices of its members is in stark contrast to the cultural and individual relativism that is largely embraced by the West.
Abigail Turner-Lauck Wernicki
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 7, 2010 | Originally published: