Infinitism in Epistemology
This article provides an overview of infinitism in epistemology. Infinitism is a family of views in epistemology about the structure of knowledge and epistemic justification. It contrasts naturally with coherentism and foundationalism. All three views agree that knowledge or justification requires an appropriately structured chain of reasons. What form may such a chain take? Foundationalists opt for non-repeating finite chains. Coherentists (at least linear coherentists) opt for repeating finite chains. Infinitists opt for non-repeating infinite chains. Appreciable interest in infinitism as a genuine competitor to coherentism and foundationalism developed only in the early twenty-first century.
The article introduces infinitism by explaining its intuitive motivations and the context in which they arise. Next it discusses the history of infinitism, which is mostly one of neglect, punctuated by brief moments of hostile dismissal. Then there is a survey of arguments for and against infinitism.
For the most part, philosophers have assumed that knowledge requires justified belief. That is, for some proposition (statement, claim or sentence) P, if you know that P, then you have a justified belief that P. Knowledge that P thus inherits its structure from the structure of the constituent justified belief that P. If the justified belief is inferential, then so is the knowledge. If the justified belief is “basic,” then so is the knowledge. These assumptions are taken for granted in the present article.
Table of Contents
- Historical Discussion of Infinitism
- Contemporary Arguments for Infinitism
- Common Objections to Infinitism
- References and Further Reading
We often provide reasons for the things we believe in order to justify holding the beliefs. But what about the reasons? Do we need reasons for holding those reasons? And if so, do we need reasons for holding those reasons that were offered as reasons for our beliefs? We’re left to wonder:
Does this regress ever end?
Infinitism is designed to answer that question. Given that one of the goals of reasoning is to enhance the justification of a belief, Q, infinitism holds that there are two necessary (but not jointly sufficient) conditions for a reason in a chain to be capable of enhancing the justification of Q:
- No reason can be Q itself, or equivalent to a conjunction containing Q as a conjunct. That is, circular reasoning is excluded.
- No reason is sufficiently justified in the absence of a further reason. That is, there are no foundational reasons.
If both (1) and (2) are true, then the chain of reasons for any belief is potentially infinite, that is, potentially unlimited.
The reason for accepting (1), and thereby rejecting circular reasoning as probative, that is, as tending to prove, is that reasoning ought to be able to improve the justificatory status of a belief. But if the propositional content of a belief is offered as a reason for holding the belief, then no additional justification could arise. Put more bluntly, circular reasoning begs the question by positing the very propositional content of the belief whose justificatory status the reasoning is designed to enhance.
Condition (1) is generally accepted, although some coherentists seem to condone the sort of circular reasoning that it proscribes (for example, Lehrer 1997). However, these coherentists might not actually be denying (1). Rather, they might instead be claiming that it is epistemically permissible to offer a deliverance of a cognitive faculty as a reason for believing that the faculty produces justified beliefs. On this alternative reading, these coherentists don’t deny (1), because (1) concerns the structure, not the source, of probative reasons. For example, suppose you employ beliefs produced by perception as reasons for believing that perception is reliable. This need not involve employing the proposition “perception is reliable” as one of the reasons.
Condition (2) is much more controversial. Indeed, denying (2) is a component of the dominant view in epistemology: foundationalism. Many foundationalists claim that there are beliefs, so-called “basic beliefs” or “foundational beliefs,” which do not require further reasons in order to function effectively as reasons for “non-basic” or “non-foundational” beliefs. Basic beliefs are taken to be sufficiently justified to serve as, at least, prima facie reasons for further beliefs in virtue of possessing some property that doesn’t arise from, or depend on, being supported by further reasons. For example, the relevant foundationalist property could be that the belief merely reports the contents of sensations or memories; or it could be that the belief is produced by a reliable cognitive faculty. The general foundationalist picture of epistemic justification is that foundational beliefs are justified to such an extent that they can be used as reasons for further beliefs, and that no reasons for the foundational beliefs are needed in order for the foundational beliefs to be justified.
Infinitists accept (2) and so deny that there are foundational beliefs of the sort that foundationalists champion. The motivation for accepting (2) is the specter of arbitrariness. Infinitists grant that in fact every actually cited chain of reasons ends; but infinitists deny that there is any reason which is immune to further legitimate challenge. And once a reason is challenged, then on pain of arbitrariness, a further reason must be produced in order for the challenged reason to serve as a good reason for a belief.
In addition to denying the existence of so-called basic beliefs, infinitism takes reasoning to be a process that generates an important type of justification — call it “reason-enhanced justification.” In opposition to foundationalism, reasoning is not depicted as merely a tool for transferring justification from the reasons to the beliefs. Instead, a belief’s justification is enhanced when sufficiently good reasons are offered on its behalf. Such enhancement can occur even when the reasons offered have not yet been reason-enhanced themselves. That is, citing R as a reason for Q can make one’s belief that Q reason-enhanced, even though R, itself, might not yet have been reason-enhanced.
As mentioned above, infinitists reject the form of coherentism – sometimes called “linear coherentism” – that endorses question-begging, circular reasoning. But by allowing that reasoning can generate epistemic justification, infinitists partly align themselves with another, more common form of coherentism – often called “holistic coherentism.” Holistic coherentism also accepts that reasoning can generate reason-enhanced justification (see BonJour 1985, Kvanvig 2007). As the name “holistic coherentism” indicates, epistemic justification is taken to be a property of entire sets of beliefs, rather than a property of individual beliefs. Holistic coherentism holds that individual beliefs are justified only in virtue of their membership in a coherent set of beliefs. On this view, justification does not transfer from one belief to another, as foundationalists or linear coherentists would claim; rather, the inferential relationships among beliefs in a set of propositions generates a justified set of beliefs; individual beliefs are justified merely in virtue of being members of such a set. Sosa (1991, chapter 9) raises serious questions about whether holistic coherentism is ultimately merely just a disguised version of foundationalism; and if Sosa is correct, then some of the objections to foundationalism would apply to holistic coherentism as well.
The argument pattern for infinitism employs the epistemic regress argument and, thus, infinitists defend their view in a manner similar to the way in which foundationalism and coherentism have been defended. This is the pattern:
- There are three possible, non-skeptical solutions to the regress problem: foundationalism, coherentism and infinitism.
- There are insurmountable difficulties with two of the solutions (in this case, foundationalism and coherentism).
- The third view (in this case, infinitism) faces no insurmountable difficulties.
- Therefore, the third view (in this case, infinitism) is the best non-skeptical solution to the regress problem.
The term ‘epistemic infinitism’ was used by Paul Moser in 1984, and the phrase “infinitist’s claim” was used by John Post in 1987. Both philosophers rejected infinitism.
Infinitism was well known by the time of Aristotle – and he rejected the view. The empiricist and rationalist philosophers of the 17th and 18th centuries rejected the view. Contemporary foundationalists and coherentists reject the view.
Indeed, it is fair to say that the history of infinitism is primarily a tale of neglect or rejection, with the possible exception of Charles Pierce (Aikin 2011, pp. 80–90; see also “Some Questions Concerning Certain Faculties Claimed for Man” in Peirce 1965, v. 5, bk. 2, pp. 135–155, esp. pp. 152–3). Some have questioned whether Peirce was defending infinitism (BonJour 1985, p. 232, n. 10; Klein 1999, pp. 320–1, n. 32). There has been some recent interest in infinitism, beginning when Peter Klein published the first in a series of articles defending infinitism (Klein 1998). But it clearly remains in the early 21st century a distinctly minority view about the structure of reasons.
Ever since Aristotle proposed objections to infinitism and defended foundationalism, various forms of foundationalism have dominated Western epistemology. For example, consider the epistemologies of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries; this is the formative period in which modern philosophy shaped the issues addressed by contemporary epistemologists. Both the empiricists and rationalists were foundationalists, although they clearly disagreed about the nature of foundational reasons.
Consider this passage from Descartes’s Meditation One, where he explains his method of radical doubt:
But in as much as reason already persuades me that I ought no less carefully to withhold my assent from matters which are not entirely certain and indubitable than from those which appear to me manifestly to be false, if I am able to find in each one some reason to doubt, this will suffice to justify rejecting the whole. And for that end it will not be requisite that I should examine each in particular, which would be an endless undertaking; for owing to the fact that the destruction of the foundations of necessity brings with it the downfall of the rest of the edifice, I shall only in the first place attach those principles upon which all my former opinions rest. (Descartes 1955 , p. 145)
After producing a “powerful” reason for doubting all of his former beliefs based on his senses, Descartes begins his search anew for a foundational belief that is beyond all doubt and writes in Meditation Two:
Archimedes, in order that he might draw the terrestrial globe out of its place, and transport it elsewhere demanded only that one point should be fixed and unmovable; in the same way I shall have the right to conceive high hopes if I am happy enough to discover one thing only which is certain. (Descartes 1955 , p. 149)
He then happily produces what he takes—at least at that point in the Meditations – to be that one, foundational proposition:
So that after having reflected well and carefully examined all things we must come to the definite conclusion that this proposition: I am, I exist, is necessarily true each time I pronounce it, or that I mentally conceive it. (Descartes 1955 , p. 150)
Regardless of the success or failure of his arguments, the point here is that Descartes clearly takes it as given that both he and the empiricist, his intended foil, will accept that knowledge is foundational and that the first tasks are to identify the foundational proposition(s) and to uncover the correct account of the nature of the foundational proposition(s). Once that is accomplished, the second task is to move beyond it (or them) to other beliefs by means of truth-preserving inferences. The Meditations presupposes a foundationalist model of reasons without any hint of argument for foundationalism.
Now consider this passage from Hume:
In a word, if we proceed not upon some fact present to the memory or senses, our reasonings would be merely hypothetical; and however the particular links might be connected with each other the whole chain of inferences would have nothing to support it, nor could we ever, by its means arrive at the knowledge of any real existence. If I ask you why you believe a particular matter of fact which you relate, you must tell me some reason; and this reason will be some other fact connected with it. But as you cannot proceed after this manner in infinitum, you must at last terminate with some fact which is present to your memory or senses or must allow that your belief is entirely without foundation. (Hume 1955 , pp. 59–60)
Setting aside an evaluation of the steps in Hume‘s argument for foundationalism, notice that he too simply discards infinitism with the stroke of a pen: “But as you cannot proceed in this manner in infinitum …”. To Hume, infinitism seemed so obviously mistaken that no argument against it was needed.
So why did infinitism come to be so easily and so often rejected?
The short answer is: Aristotle. His arguments against infinitism and for foundationalism were so seemingly powerful that nothing else needed to be said. We can divide Aristotle’s objections to infinitism into three types. Each pertains to the infinitist solution to the regress problem.
- Misdescription Objection: Infinitism does not correctly describe our epistemic practices; but foundationalism does.
- Finite Mind Objection: Our finite minds are not capable of producing or grasping an infinite set of reasons.
- Unexplained Origin Objection: Infinitism does not provide a good account of how justification is generated and transferred by good reasoning; but foundationalism does.
We will return Aristotle’s objections below, in section 4.
There are three main contemporary arguments for infinitism.
Infinitism has been defended on the grounds that it alone can explain two of epistemic justification’s crucial features: it comes in degrees, and it can be complete (Fantl 2003). This argument concerns propositional justification, rather than doxastic justification. Propositional justification is a matter of having good reasons; doxastic justification is typically thought to be a matter of properly believing based on those reasons.
For purposes of this argument, understand infinitism as the view that a proposition Q is justified for you just in case there is available to you an infinite series of non-repeating reasons that favors believing Q. And understand foundationalism as the view that Q is justified for you just in case you have a series of non-repeating reasons that favors believing Q, terminating in a properly basic foundational reason “that needs no further reason.” And further suppose that infinitism and foundationalism are the only relevant non-skeptical alternatives for a theory of epistemic justification, so that if skepticism about justification is false, then either infinitism or foundationalism is true.
The features argument is based on two features of justification. First, justification comes in degrees. We can be more or less justified in believing some claim. An adequate theory of justification must respect this, and explain why justification comes in degrees. Call this the degree requirement on an acceptable theory of justification. Second, it’s implausible to identify adequate justification with complete justification. Adequate justification is the minimal degree of justification required for knowledge. Complete justification is maximal justification, beyond which justification cannot be increased or strengthened. An adequate theory of justification should explain how justification could be complete. Call this the completeness requirement on an acceptable theory of justification.
Infinitism satisfies the degree requirement by pointing out that length comes in degrees, which justification may mirror. Other things being equal, the longer the series of reasons you have for believing Q, the better justified Q is for you (as long as the shorter set is a proper subset of the longer set). Infinitism can satisfy the completeness requirement by offering an account of complete justification: Q is completely justified for you just in case you have an infinite array of adequate reasons (Fantl 2003: 558). To have an infinite array of reasons favoring Q, for each potential challenge to Q, or to any of the infinite reasons in the chain supporting Q, or to any of the inferences involved in traversing any link in the chain, you must have available a further infinite series of reasons. In short, it requires having an infinite number of infinite chains.
Can foundationalism meet the degree and completeness requirements? To assess this, we need first to explain how foundationalists understand foundational reasons. Traditional foundationalists contend that foundational reasons are self-justifying, because their mere truth suffices to justify them. The claims “I am thinking” and “There is at least one proposition that is neither true nor false” are plausible candidates for self-justifying reasons. Metajustificatory foundationalists deny that the mere truth of a foundational reason ensures its foundational status. Instead, they say, foundational reasons must have some other property, call it ‘F’. Metajustificatory foundationalists disagree among themselves over what F is. Some say it is reliability, others say it is coherence, and yet others say it is clear and distinct perception or social approval. The important point to recognize is that metajustificatory foundationalism can’t “require that a believer have access to the metajustificatory feature as a reason for the foundational reason,” because that would undermine its putative status as foundational (Fantl 2003: 541). It would effectively require a further reason for that which supposedly stood in no need of it.
Having divided all foundationalists into two jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive groups, the argument against foundationalism goes like this:
- All foundationalist theories are either traditional or metajustificatory. (Premise)
- Traditional foundationalism can’t satisfy the degree requirement. (Premise)
- Metajustificatory foundationalism can’t satisfy the completeness requirement. (Premise)
- So no foundationalist theory can satisfy both the degree and completeness requirements (From 1–3)
- An adequate theory of justification must satisfy both the degree and completeness requirements. (Premise)
- So no foundationalist theory of justification is adequate. (From 4–5)
The argument is valid. Line 1 is trivially true, given the way the categories are defined. Line 2 is supported on the grounds that all self-justifying reasons are by definition true, and their truth justifies them. But truth doesn’t come in degrees. So traditional foundationalism lacks the resources to satisfy the degree requirement. Truth isn’t flexible enough.
Line 3 is supported on the grounds that the foundationalist will have to analyze complete justification along these lines:
Q is completely justified for you iff you have a non-repeating series of reasons for Q, ultimately founded on a reason that exemplifies the metajustificatory feature [F] to the highest possible degree. (Fantl 2003: 546)
But any such proposal must fail for a simple reason: no matter what F is, if you gain a reason to think that the foundational reason completely exemplifies F, and that exemplifying F is epistemically important, then Q will thereby become better justified for you. To see why, for the sake of argument suppose that we accept a reliabilist version of metajustificatory foundationalism, according to which Q is completely justified for you if and only if you have a non-repeating series of reasons for Q, ultimately founded on a perfectly reliable reason. Now if you gain a reason to believe that the reason is perfectly reliable, then Q will thereby become better justified for you. But then metajustificatory foundationalism hasn’t satisfied the completeness requirement after all, because it will be possible for you to increase your justification for Q beyond what the maximal exemplification of F would allow. But this violates the definition of complete justification. So metajustificatory foundationalism can’t meet the completeness requirement.
In response, foundationalists have pointed out that the reasoning in support of line 2 of the argument is undermined to the extent that a degree-theoretic conception of truth is plausible — that is, to the extent it’s plausible that truth comes in degrees. Foundationalists have also responded that the supporting reasoning for line 3 overlooks the possibility of adequate justification being over-determined. The more reasons you have that independently adequately justify Q for you, the better justified Q is for you. A natural foundationalist proposal, then, is that Q is completely justified for you if and only if it is infinitely over-determined that Q is adequately justified for you (Turri 2010).
There are at least two regress arguments for infinitism: the enhancement argument and the interrogation argument. Each concerns a very specific epistemic status closely connected to reasons and reasoning. Neither purports to establish that infinitism is true about all interesting epistemic statuses. Although infinitists take skepticism seriously, for the purposes of these two arguments, we’ll simply assume that skepticism is false.
The enhancement argument begins by asking a question (Klein 2005): What sort of reasoning could enhance the justification of a non-evident proposition, in a context where its truth has been legitimately questioned? What structural form would the reasons offered in the course such reasoning take? We can divide all answers to that question into three groups. Enhancement coherentists answer that some repeating chains could enhance justification; enhancement foundationalists answer that no repeating chain could enhance justification, but some finite and non-repeating chains could; enhancement infinitists answer that no repeating or finite chain could enhance justification, but some infinite and non-repeating chains could.
The enhancement argument for infinitism is that neither coherentism nor foundationalism provides a satisfactory answer to the question posed, whereas infinitism does. Given that these three answers exhaust the (non-skeptical) alternatives, it follows that infinitism is the only satisfactory account of the epistemic status in question, which for convenience we can call rational enhancement of justification.
The objection to enhancement coherentism is that repeating chains are objectionably question-begging and so can’t rationally enhance justification. If Corrie believes Q, and someone asks her, “Why believe Q?”, and she responds by citing a chain of reasoning that relies on Q itself, then in that context she has clearly done nothing to rationally enhance her justification for Q. Her response simply presupposes the claim in question, so how could it rationally enhance her justification?
Enhancement foundationalists claim that some reasons are special: the foundational enhancers. Foundational enhancers can rationally enhance the justification for believing other things, even though they are not rationally supported by further reasons in turn. This is why some finite chains can rationally enhance justification: a foundational enhancer appropriately terminates the affair.
The objection to enhancement foundationalism is that all finite chains are objectionably arbitrary at their terminus. Suppose that Fontana believes A, and someone asks him, “Why believe A?”, and he responds by citing some reason B. But B is not a foundational enhancer, and Fontana is in turn asked, “Why believe B?” This continues until Fontana reaches the point where he cites a reason that, according to him, is a foundational enhancer. Let Z be this purported foundational enhancer. Fontana’s interlocutor presses further, “Why think that foundational enhancers are likely to be true?” In response to this last question, Fontana has three options: affirm, deny, or withhold. If he denies, then using Z as a reason is arbitrary and the reasoning can’t rationally enhance A for him. If he withholds, then, from his own point of view, he should not use Z as the basis for further beliefs. If it is not good enough to affirm in and of itself, then it isn’t proper to use it as a basis for affirming something else. If he affirms, then there is no immediate problem, but this is because the reasoning has continued, and what was supposed to be a foundational enhancer turned out not to be one.
Enhancement infinitism avoids the problems faced by coherentism and foundationalism. It endorses neither circular reasoning nor arbitrary endpoints.
The enhancement argument for infinitism can be understood as follows:
- If skepticism about rational enhancement is false, then either coherentism, foundationalism or infinitism is the correct theory of rational enhancement. (Premise)
- Skepticism about rational enhancement is false. (Premise)
- Coherentism isn’t the correct theory. (Premise)
- Foundationalism isn’t the correct theory. (Premise)
- So infinitism is the correct theory of rational enhancement. (From 1–4)
Line 1 is true because the way that coherentism, foundationalism and infinitism are characterized exhausts logical space. Every rationally enhancing chain is either circular or not. If it is circular, then it’s a coherentist chain; if it isn’t, then either it is finite or infinite. If it is finite, then it is a foundationalist chain; if it is infinite, then it is an infinitist chain. Line 2 is assumed without defense in the present context, as mentioned above. Lines 3 and 4 are defended on grounds already explained: line 3 on the grounds that circular reasoning can rationally enhance justification, and line 4 on the grounds that arbitrary reasoning can’t do so either.
The interrogation argument concerns “the most highly prized form of true belief” (Plato, Meno, 98a), which is the sort of knowledge that human adults take themselves to be capable of and sometimes even attain (Klein 2011). More specifically, the interrogation argument concerns one of the essential requirements of this sort of knowledge, namely, full justification.
A key idea in the infinitist’s discussion here is that distinctively human knowledge is distinguished by the importance of reasoning in attaining full justification: we make our beliefs fully justified by reasoning in support of them. The reasoning is partly constitutive of full justification, and so is essential to it. A mechanical calculator might know that 2+2=4, and a greyhound dog might know that his master is calling, but neither the calculator nor the greyhound reasons in support of their knowledge. Their knowledge is merely mechanical or brute. Adult humans are capable of such unreasoned knowledge, but we are also capable of a superior sort of knowledge involving full justification, due to the value added by reasoning.
The interrogation argument is motivated by a specific version of the regress problem, which emerges from an imagined interrogation. Suppose you believe that Q. Then someone asks you a legitimate question concerning the basis of your belief that Q. You respond by citing reason R1. You are then legitimately asked about your basis for believing R1. You cite reason R2. Then you are legitimately asked about your basis for believing R2. A pattern is emerging. How, if it all, can the reasoning resolve itself such that you’re fully justified in believing Q? Either the process goes on indefinitely, which suggests that the reasoning you engage in is fruitless because another reason is always needed; or some reason is repeated in the process, which means that you reasoned circularly and thus fruitlessly; or at some point the reasoning ends because the last reason cited isn’t supported by any other reason, which suggests that the reasoning is fruitless because it ends arbitrarily. No matter how the reasoning resolves itself, it seems, you’re no better offer for having engaged in it. Thus, it can seem doubtful that any reasoning will result in a fully justified belief.
This is essentially the argument given by Sextus Empiricus (1976, lines 164-170, p. 95) to motivate a version of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. What are we to make of this problem? The infinitist agrees that circular reasoning is fruitless, and that finite reasoning ends arbitrarily and so is fruitless too. However, the infinitist disagrees with the claim that reasoning that goes on indefinitely must be fruitless. Every belief is potentially susceptible to legitimate questioning, and interrogation can, in principle, go on indefinitely. You need to be able to answer legitimate questions, and so you need available to you an indefinite number of answers. Each answer is a further reason. So, far from seeming fruitless, potentially indefinitely long reasoning seems to be exactly what is needed for the reasoning to be epistemically effective and result in full justification.
The interrogation argument for infinitism can be summarized like so:
- Adult human knowledge requires full justification.(Premise)
- Full justification requires proper reasoning. (Premise)
- Proper reasoning requires that there be available an infinite and non-repeating series of reasons. (Premise)
- So adult human knowledge requires that there be available an infinite and non-repeating series of reasons. (From 1–3)
Lines 1 and 2 can be understood as stipulating the epistemic status that the infinitist is interested in, as explained above. Line 3 is defended on the grounds that (a) circular reasoning is illegitimate, and (b) finite chains won’t suffice because every reason offered is potentially susceptible to legitimate interrogation, and full justification requires that an answer to every legitimate question be at least available to you. Foundationalists point to beliefs with an allegedly special foundational property F, which, it is claimed, suites them to put a definitive end to legitimate questioning. But, the infinitist responds, foundationalists always pick properties that they think are truth-conducive, and it is always, potentially at least, legitimate to ask, “Why think that reasons with the property F are truth-conducive?” Once this legitimate question is raised, the foundationalist must abandon the supposed foundational citadel, in search of further reasons. But this looks suspiciously like infinitism in disguise.
The proceduralist argument for infinitism pertains to knowledge. It begins from the premise that knowledge is a “reflective success” (Aikin 2009). Reflective success requires succeeding through proper procedure. Proper procedure requires thinking carefully. Moreover, we can make our careful thinking explicit. To make our careful thinking explicit is to state our reasons. And for a reason to legitimately figure into our careful thinking, we must have a reason for thinking that it is true in turn.
We can encapsulate the proceduralist argument for infinitism like so:
- Knowledge is a reflective success. (Premise)
- Reflective success requires careful thinking. (Premise)
- Careful thinking requires the availability of an infinite series of reasons. (Premise)
- So knowledge requires the availability of an infinite series of reasons. (From 1–3)
Lines 1 and 2 can be understood as characterizing the sort of knowledge that the infinitist is interested in. (Aikin 2005 and 2009 strongly suggests that this is knowledge ordinarily understood, though the matter is not entirely clear.) Line 3 is defended by appeal to a guiding intuition, namely, that if you know, then you can properly answer all questions about your belief and your reasons. But in principle there are an infinite number of questions about your belief and your reasons. And no proper answer will implicate you in question-begging circularity. So, in principle you need an infinite number of answers (Aikin 2009: 57–8). If there were a proper stopping point in the regress of reasons, then beliefs at the terminus would not be susceptible to legitimate challenges from those who disagree. Your opponents would be simply mistaken for challenging you at this point. But it doesn’t seem like there even is a point where your opponents must be simply mistaken for challenging you.
What about the examples featured prominently by foundationalists? For example, what about your belief that 2+2=4, or that you have a headache (when you do have one)? It can easily seem implausible that a challenge to these beliefs must be legitimate. It can easily seem that someone who questioned you on these matters would be simply mistaken. The infinitist disagrees. We always should be able to offer reasons. At the very least, careful thinking requires us to have an answer to the question, “Are our concepts of a headache or addition fit for detecting the truth in such matters?” Even if we think there are good answers to such questions, the infinitist claims, the important point is that we need those answers in order to think carefully and, in turn, gain knowledge.
Infinitism can appear counterintuitive because, as a matter of fact, we never answer very many questions about any of our beliefs, but we ascribe knowledge to people all the time. But this an illusion because we often carelessly attribute knowledge, or attribute knowledge for practical reasons that aren’t sensitive to the attribution’s literal truth.
For most cases of effective reasoning, justified belief or knowledge, infinitism requires more of us than we can muster. We have finite lives and finite minds. Given the way that we are actually constituted, we cannot produce an infinite series of reasons. So skepticism is the immediate consequence of any version of infinitism that requires us to produce an infinite series of reasons (Fumerton 1995; compare BonJour 1976: 298, 310 n. 22).
In a remark in the Posterior Analytics reflecting his general worries about regresses, Aristotle gives a reason for rejecting infinitism: “one cannot traverse an infinite series.” But if one cannot traverse an infinite series of reasons, then if infinitism is the correct account of justification, then skepticism is the correct view. We cannot traverse an infinite series of reasons because we have finite minds. It is useful to quote the passage in full, because it is also a famous passage advocating a regress argument for foundationalism.
Aristotle expresses dissatisfaction with both infinitism and question-begging coherentism, and so opts for foundationalism. He writes:
Some hold that, owing to the necessity of knowing primary premisses, there is no scientific knowledge. Others think there is, but that all truths are demonstrable. Neither doctrine is either true or a necessary deduction from the premisses. The first school, assuming that there is no way of knowing other than by demonstration, maintain that an infinite regress is involved, on the ground that if behind the prior stands no primary, we could not know the posterior through the prior (wherein they are right, for one cannot traverse an infinite series [emphasis added]); if on the other hand – they say – the series terminates and there are primary premisses, yet these are unknowable because incapable of demonstration, which according to them is the only form of knowledge.
And since thus [sic] one cannot know the primary premisses, knowledge of the conclusions which follow from them is not pure scientific knowledge nor properly knowing at all, but rests on the mere supposition that the premisses are true. The other party agree with them as regards to knowing, holding that it is possible only by demonstration, but they see no difficulty in holding that all truths are demonstrated on the ground that demonstration may be circular or reciprocal. (72b5–18)
Aristotle here focuses on “scientific knowledge” and syllogistic “demonstration.” But his remarks are no less plausible when taken to apply to all knowledge and reasoning. Aristotle himself hints at this with his comment about “knowing at all.”
The spirit of Aristotle’s original finite-mind objection is alive and well in contemporary epistemology. Here is a representative example:
The [proposed] regress of justification of S’s belief that p would certainly require that he hold an infinite number of beliefs. This is psychologically, if not logically, impossible. If a man can believe an infinite number of things, then there seems to be no reason why he cannot know an infinite number of things. Both possibilities contradict the common intuition that the human mind is finite. Only God could entertain an infinite number of beliefs. But surely God is not the only justified believer. (Williams 1981, p. 85)
But infinitists have been careful not to claim that we must actually produce an infinite series of reasons. Rather, they typically say that we must have an appropriately structured, infinite set of reasons available to us. About this milder infinitist requirement, it might be worried that it’s not clear that we could even understand an infinite series of reasons. But being able to understand a series of reasons is required for that series to be available — at least in some senses of “available” — to us as reasons. So, even this milder infinitist requirement might lead to skepticism.
Contrary to what was suggested at the end of the previous objection, it seems that we could understand an infinite series, provided that each element in the series was simple enough. And it doesn’t seem impossible for a justificatory chain to include only simple enough elements.
Grant that it’s possible that every element of an infinite series could be comprehensible to us. But what evidence is there that there actually are such series? And what evidence is there that, for at least most of the things that we justifiably believe (or most of the things we know, or most of the acceptable reasoning we engage in), there is a properly structured infinite series available to us? Unless infinitists can convincingly respond to these questions — unless they can offer a proof of concept — then it seems likely that infinitism leads to skepticism.
The objection can be made more poignant by pairing it with the finite mind objection. To handle the finite mind objection, infinitists deny that you need to actually produce the infinite series of reasons in order for your belief to be justified. Just having the reasons available, and producing enough of them to satisfy contextual demands, suffices to justify your belief. But since contextual demands are never so stringent as to demand more than, say, ten reasons, we’re left with no actual example of a chain that seems a promising candidate for an infinite series (Wright 2011: section 3).
At least one example has been given of a readily available infinite chain of reasons, but ironically it is one compatible with foundationalism, offered by a foundationalist in response to infinitism (Turri 2009). (Peijnenburg and Atkinson 2011 sketch some formal possibilities and provide an analogy with heritable traits.)
For any proposition we might believe, both it and its denial can be supported by similar, appropriately structured infinite chains of reasons (Post 1980 32–7; Aikin 2005: 198–9; Aikin 2008: 182–3). Importantly, neither chain of reasons is, in any meaningful sense, more available to us than the other. To appreciate the point, suppose you are inquiring into whether P. An infinite affirming chain could be constructed like so:
Affirmation chain (AC)
Q & (Q → P)
R & (R → (Q & (Q → P)))
S & (S → (R & (R → (Q & (Q → P)))))
whereas an infinite denial chain could be constructed like so:
Denial chain (DC)
Q & (Q → ~P)
R & (R → (Q & (Q → ~P)))
S & (S → (R & (R → (Q & (Q → ~P)))))
It is an equally long way to the top of each chain, but which is, so to speak, the road to epistemic heaven, and which the road to hell? Having one such chain available to you isn’t a problem, but having both available is a touch too much (at least in non-paradoxical cases), and infinitism lacks the resources to eliminate one.
A further worry is that if infinitists embrace additional resources to eliminate one of these chains, those very same resources could in turn form the basis of a satisfactory finitist epistemology (Cling 2004: section 5). Aikin 2008 defends a version of infinitism, “impure infinitism,” intended to address this problem by incorporating elements of foundationalism; and Klein has argued that specifying the conditions for the availability of reasons will eliminate the possibility of both chains being available in non-paradoxical cases.
Aristotle begins the Posterior Analytics with this statement: “All instruction given or received by way of argument proceeds from pre-existent knowledge.” And later in the Posterior Analytics, after having rejected both infinitism and question-begging coherentism as capable of producing knowledge, he writes:
Our own doctrine is that not all knowledge is demonstrative; on the contrary, knowledge of the immediate premisses is independent of demonstration. (The necessity of this is obvious; for since we must know the prior premisses from which the demonstration is drawn, and since the regress must end in immediate truths, those truths must be indemonstrable.) Such, then, is our doctrine, and in addition we maintain that besides scientific knowledge there is an originative source which enables us to recognize the definitions [that is, the first principles of a science].(72b18–24)
What is this “originative source” and how does it produce knowledge not based on reasoning? The answer is a proto-reliabilist one that relies on humans having a “capacity of some sort” (99b33) that produces immediate (non-inferential) knowledge. Although most contemporary reliabilists will not take the foundational propositions employed in demonstration to be the first principles of a science, they will take foundational beliefs to result from the operation of some capacities humans possess that do not employ conscious reasoning (Goldman 2008).
Here is Aristotle’s account of the “originating source” of justified beliefs:
But though sense-perception is innate in all animals, in some perception comes to persist, in others it does not. So animals in which this persistence does not come to be have either no knowledge at all outside of the act of perceiving, or no knowledge of objects of which no impression persists; animals in which it does come into being have perception and can continue to retain the sense-impression in the soul; and when such persistence is frequently repeated a further distinction at once arises between those which out of persistence of such sense impressions develop a power of systematizing them and those which do not. So out of sense perception comes to be what we call memory, and out of frequently repeated memories of the same thing develops experience; for a number of memories constitute a single experience. From experience … originate the skill of the craftsman and the knowledge of the man of science. (99b36–100a5)
Thus, Aristotle holds that foundationalism can explain how justification can arise in basic beliefs and how it is transmitted through reasoning to non-foundational beliefs. This, he claims, contrasts with infinitism and question-begging coherentism, which have no way of explaining how justification arises. He seems to assume that reasoning cannot originate justification, but can merely transmit it. If each belief were to depend on another for its justification, then there would be no originative source, or starting point, that generates the justification in the first place.
Writing in the second century AD, Sextus Empiricus wondered how we might show that believing a proposition is better justified than the alternatives of either disbelieving it or suspending judgment. He employed the “unexplained origin objection” to reject an infinitist attempt to show how believing could be better justified. He argues that infinitism must lead to suspension of judgment.
The Mode based upon regress ad infinitum is that whereby we assert that the thing adduced as a proof of the matter proposed needs a further proof, and this another again, and so on ad infinitum, so that the consequence is suspension [of judgment], as we possess no starting-point for our argument.(1976, I:164–9)
The unexplained origin objection remains popular today. Carl Ginet, a contemporary foundationalist, puts it this way:
A more important, deeper problem for infinitism is this: Inference cannot originate justification, it can only transfer it from premises to conclusion. And so it cannot be that, if there actually occurs justification, it is all inferential. (Ginet 2005, p. 148)
Jonathan Dancy, another contemporary foundationalist, makes a similar point:
Suppose that all justification is inferential. When we justify belief A by appeal to belief B and C, we have not yet shown A to be justified. We have only shown that it is justified if B and C are. Justification by inference is conditional justification only; A’s justification is conditional upon the justification of B and C. But if all justification is conditional in this sense, then nothing can be shown to be actually non-conditionally justified. (Dancy 1985, p. 55)
In the Metaphysics, Aristotle writes:
There are … some who raise a difficulty by asking, who is to be the judge of the healthy man, and in general who is likely to judge rightly on each class of questions. But such inquiries are like puzzling over the question whether we are now asleep or awake. And all such questions have the same meaning. These people demand that a reason shall be given for everything; for they seek a starting point, and they seek to get this by demonstration, while it is obvious from their actions that they have no such conviction. But their mistake is what we have stated it to be; they seek a reason for things for which no reason can be given; for the starting point of demonstration is not demonstration. (1011a2–14)
The point of this objection is that, assuming that skepticism is false, infinitism badly misdescribes the structure of reasons supporting our beliefs, as revealed by or expressed in our actual deliberative practices. Our actual practices do not display what infinitism would predict (again, assuming that skepticism is false).
Of the three objections to infinitism presented by Aristotle, this one has gained the least traction in contemporary epistemology. This might be because it rests on two easily challenged assumptions: (i) a theory of justification can be tested by determining whether our actual deliberations meet its demands; (ii) our actual deliberations meet foundationalism’s demands. Regarding (i), can we test an ethical theory by determining whether our actual behavior meets its demands? (Let us hope not!) If not, then why should we accept (i)? Regarding (ii), would a foundationalist accept the following as a foundational proposition: “The train schedule says so”? Such claims often end deliberation about when the next train departs. But it’s not the sort of proposition that foundationalists have taken to be basic.
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Peter D. Klein
Rutgers University, New Brunswick
U. S. A.
University of Waterloo
Last updated: September 2, 2013 | Originally published: September 1, 2013