Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Internalism and Externalism in the Philosophy of Mind and Language

This article addresses how our beliefs, our intentions, and other contents of our attitudes are individuated, that is, what makes those contents what they are. Content externalism (henceforth externalism) is the position that our contents depend in a constitutive manner on items in the external world, that they can be individuated by our causal interaction with the natural and social world. In the 20th century, Hilary Putnam, Tyler Burge and others offered Twin Earth thought experiments to argue for externalism. Content internalism (henceforth internalism) is the position that our contents depend only on properties of our bodies, such as our brains. Internalists typically hold that our contents are narrow, insofar as they locally supervene on the properties of our bodies or brains.

Although externalism is the more popular position, internalists such as David Chalmers, Gabriel Segal, and others have developed versions of narrow content that may not be vulnerable to typical externalist objections. This article explains the variety of positions on the issues and explores the arguments for and against the main positions. For example, externalism incurs problems of privileged access to our contents as well as problems about mental causation and psychological explanation, but externalists have offered responses to these objections.

Table of Contents

  1. Hilary Putnam and Natural Kind Externalism
  2. Tyler Burge and Social Externalism
  3. Initial Problems with the Twin Earth Thought Experiments
  4. Two Problems for Content Externalism
    1. Privileged Access
    2. Mental Causation and Psychological Explanation
  5. Different Kinds of Content Externalism
  6. Content Internalism and Narrow Content
    1. Jerry Fodor and Phenomenological Content
    2. Brian Loar and David Chalmers on Conceptual Roles and Two-Dimensional Semantics
    3. Radical Internalism
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Hilary Putnam and Natural Kind Externalism

In “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’” and elsewhere, Putnam argues for what might be called natural kind externalism. Natural kind externalism is the position that our natural kind terms (such as “water” and “gold”) mean what they do because we interact causally with the natural kinds that these terms are about. Interacting with natural kinds is a necessary (but not sufficient) condition for meaning (Putnam 1975, 246; Putnam 1981, 66; Sawyer 1998 529; Nuttecelli 2003, 172; Norris 2003, 153; Korman, 2006 507).

Putnam asserts that the traditional Fregean theory of meaning leaves a subject “as much in the dark as it ever was” (Putnam 1975, 215) and that it, and any descriptivist heirs to it, are mistaken in all their forms. To show this, Putnam insists that Frege accounts for the sense, intension, or meaning of our terms by making two assumptions:

  1. The meaning of our terms (for example, natural kind terms) is constituted by our being in a certain psychological state.
  2. The meaning of such terms determines its extension (Putnam 1975, 219).

Putnam concedes that assumptions one and two may seem appealing, but the conjunction of these assumptions is “…not jointly satisfied by any notion, let alone the traditional notion of meaning.” Putnam suggests abandoning the first while retaining a modified form of the second.

Putnam imagines that somewhere there is a Twin Earth. Earthlings and Twin Earthlings are exact duplicates (down to the last molecule) and have the same behavioral histories. Even so, there is one difference: the substance that we call water, on Twin Earth does not consist of H20, but of XYZ. This difference has not affected how the inhabitants of either planet use their respective liquids, but the liquids have different “hidden structures” (Putnam 1975, 235, 241; Putnam 1986, 288, Putnam 1988, 36). Putnam then imagines it is the year is 1750, before the development of chemistry on either planet. In this time, no experts knew of the hidden structure of water or of its twin, twater. Still, Putnam says, when the inhabitants of Earth use the term “water,” they still refer to the liquid made of H20; when the inhabitants of Twin Earth do the same, they refer to their liquid made of XYZ (Putnam 1975, 270).

The reason this is so, according to Putnam, is that natural kind terms like water have an “unnoticed indexical component.” Water, he says, receives its meaning by our originally pointing at water, such that water is always water “around here.” Putnam admits this same liquid relation “…is a theoretical relation, and may take an indefinite amount of investigation to determine” (Putnam 1975, 234). Given this, earthlings and their twin counterparts use their natural kind terms ((for example, “water,” “gold,” “cat,” and so forth), to refer to the natural kinds of their respective worlds (for example, on Earth, “water” refers to H20 but on Twin Earth it refers to XYZ). In other words, on each planet, twins refer to the “hidden structure” of the liquid of that planet. Thus, Putnam concludes that the first Fregean assumption is false, for while twins across planets are in the same psychological state, when they say “water,” they mean different things. However, understood correctly, the second assumption is true; when the twins say “water,” their term refers to the natural kind (that is, with the proper structural and chemical properties) of their world, and only to that kind.

Natural kind externalism, then, is the position that the meanings of natural kind terms are not determined by psychological states, but are determined by causal interactions with the natural kind itself (that is, kinds with certain structural properties). “Cut the pie any way you like,” Putnam says, “Meaning just ain’t in the head” (Putnam, 1975 227). However, soon after Putnam published “The Meaning of ‘Meaning,’” Colin McGinn and Tyler Burge noted that what is true of linguistic meaning extends to the contents of our propositional attitudes. As Burge says, the twins on Earth and Twin Earth “…are in no sense duplicates in their thoughts,” and this is revealed by how we ascribe attitudes to our fellows (Burge 1982b, 102; Putnam 1996, viii). Propositional attitude contents, it seems, are also not in our heads.

2. Tyler Burge and Social Externalism

In “Individualism and the Mental,” “Two Thought Experiments Reviewed,” “Other Bodies,” and elsewhere Tyler Burge argues for social externalism (Burge, 1979, 1982a, 1982b). Social externalism is the position that our attitude contents (for example, beliefs, intentions, and so forth) depend essentially on the norms of our social environments.

To argue for social externalism, Burge introduces a subject named Bert. Bert has a number of beliefs about arthritis, many of which are true, but in this case, falsely believes that he has arthritis in his thigh. While visiting his doctor, Bert says, “I have arthritis.” After hearing Bert’s complaint, the doctor informs his patient that he is not suffering from arthritis. Burge then imagines a counterfactual subject – let us call him Ernie. Ernie is physiologically and behaviorally the same as Bert (non-intentionally described), but was raised in a different linguistic community. In Ernie’s community, “arthritis” refers to a disease that occurs in the joints and muscles. When Ernie visits his doctor and mentions arthritis, he is not corrected.

Burge notes that although Ernie is physically and behaviorally the same as Bert, he “…lacks some – perhaps all – of the attitudes commonly attributed with content causes containing the word ‘arthritis…’” Given that arthritis is part of our linguistic community and not his, “it is hard to see how the patient could have picked up the notion of ‘arthritis’” (Burge 1979, 79; Burge 1982a, 286; Burge 1982b, 109). Although Bert and Ernie have always been physically and behaviorally the same, they differ in their contents. However, these differences “…stem from differences outside the patient.” As a result, Burge concludes: “it is metaphysically or constitutively necessary that in order to have a thought about arthritis one must be in relations to others who are in a better position to specify the disease” (Burge 1988, 350; Burge 2003b, 683; Burge 2007, 154).

Unlike Putnam, Burge does not restrict his externalism to natural kinds, or even to obvious social kinds. Regardless of the fact that our fellows suffer incomplete understanding of terms, typically we “take discourse literally” (Burge 1979, 88). In such situations, we still have “… assumed responsibility for communal conventions governing language symbols,” and given this, maintain the beliefs of our home communities (Burge 1979, 114). Burge states that this argument

…does not depend, for example, on the kind of word “arthritis” is. We could have used an artifact term, an ordinary natural kind word, a color adjective, a social role term, a term for a historical style, an abstract noun, an action verb, a physical movement verb, or any of other various sorts of words (Burge 1979, 79).

In other papers, Burge launches similar thought experiments to extend his externalism to cases where we have formed odd theories about artifacts (for example, where we believe sofas to be religious artifacts), to the contents of our percepts (for example, to our perceptions of, say, cracks or shadows on a sidewalk), and even to our memory contents (Burge 1985, 1986, 1998). Other externalists—William Lycan, Michael Tye, and Jonathan Ellis among them—rely on similar thought experiments to extend externalism to the contents of our phenomenal states, or seemings (Lycan 2001; Tye 2008; Ellis 2010). Externalism, then, can seem to generalize to all contents.

3. Initial Problems with the Twin Earth Thought Experiments

Initially, some philosophers found Putnam’s Twin Earth thought experiments misleading. In an early article, Eddy Zemach pointed out that Putnam had only addressed the meaning of water in 1750, “…before the development of modern chemistry” (Zemach 1976; 117). Zemach questions whether twins pointing to water “around here” would isolate the right liquids (that is, with H20 on Earth and XYX on Twin Earth). No, such pointing would not have done this, especially long ago; Putnam just stipulates that “water” on Earth meant H20 and on Twin Earth meant XYZ, and that “water” means the same now (Zemach 1976, 123). D. H. Mellor adds that, in point of fact, our “natural kind term meanings are chosen to fit our knowledge, not the other way around” (Mellor 1979, 303; Jackson 1998, 216; Jackson 2003, 61).

In response to this criticism, externalists have since developed more nuanced formulations of the causal theory of reference, downplaying supposed acts of semantic baptism (for example, “this is water”). The theoretical adjustments can then account for how natural kind term meanings can change or diminish the role of referents altogether (Sainsbury 2007). Zemach, Mellor, Jackson, and others infer that Putnam should have cleaved to the first Fregean principle (that our being in a certain psychological state constitutes meaning) as well as to the second. By combining both Fregean principles, earthlings and their twins, mean the same thing after all.

Similarly, Kent Bach, Tim Crane, Gabriel Segal, and others argue that since Bert incompletely understands “arthritis,” he does not have the contents that his linguistic community does (that is, that the disease refers only to the joints). Given his misunderstanding of “arthritis,” Bert would make odd inferences about the disease, but “these very inferences constitute the evidence for attributing to the patient some notion other than arthritis” (Bach 1987, 267). Crane adds that since Bert and Ernie would have “…all the same dispositions to behavior in the actual and counterfactual situations,” they have the same contents (Crane 1991, 19; Segal 2000, 81). However, Burge never clarifies how much understanding Bert needs to actually have arthritis.(Burge 1986, 702; Burge 2003a, 276). Burge admits, “when a person incompletely understands an attitude, he has some other content that more or less captures his understanding” (Burge 1979, 95). If Bert does have some other content ­– perhaps, “tharthritis”– there is little motive to insist that he also has arthritis. Bert and Ernie, it seems, have the same contents.

According to these criticisms, the Twin Earth thought experiments seem to show that twins across planets, or in those raised in different linguistic communities, establish differing contents by importing questionable assumptions such as; that the causal theory of reference is true, that we refer to hidden structural properties, or dictate norms for ascribing contents. Without these assumptions, the Twin Earth thought experiments can easily invoke internalist intuitions. When experimental philosophers tested such thought experiments, they elicited different intuitions. At the very least, these philosophers say, “intuitions about cases continue to underdetermine the selection of the correct theory of reference” (Machery, Mallon, Nichols, and Stich 2009, 341).

4. Two Problems for Content Externalism

a. Privileged Access

René Descartes famously insisted that he could not be certain he had a body: “…if I mean only to talk of my sensation, or my consciously seeming to see or to walk, it becomes quite true because my assertion refers only to my mind.” In this view, privileged access (that is, a priori knowledge) to our content would seem to be true.

However, as Paul Boghossian has argued, externalism may not be able to honor this apparent truism. Boghossian imagines that we earthlings have slowly switched from Earth to Twin Earth, unbeknownst to us. As a result, he proposes that the externalist theory would not allow for discernment of whether contents refer to water or twater, to arthritis or tharthritis (Boghossian 1989, 172; Boghossian 1994, 39). As Burge sees the challenge, the problem is that “…[a] person would have different thoughts under the switches, but the person would not be able to compare the situations and note when and where the differences occurred (Burge 1988, 653; Burge 1998, 354; Burge 2003a, 278).

Boghossian argues that since externalism seems to imply that we cannot discern whether our contents refer to water or twater, arthritis or tharthritis, then we do not have privileged access to the proper contents. Either the approach for understanding privileged access is in need of revision (for example, restricting the scope of our claims to certain a priori truths), or externalism is itself false.

In response, Burge and others claim the “enabling conditions” (for example, of having lived on Earth or Twin Earth) to have water or twater, arthritis or tharthritis, the referential contents need not be known. As long as the enabling conditions are satisfied, first-order contents can be known (for example, “that is water” or “I have arthritis”); this first-order knowledge gives rise to our second-order reflective contents about them. Indeed, our first-order thoughts (that is, about objects) completely determine the second-order ones (Burge 1988, 659). However, as Max de Gaynesford and others have argued, when considering switching cases, one cannot assume that such enabling conditions are satisfied. Since we may be incorrect about such enabling conditions, and may be incorrect about our first-order attitude contents as well, then we may be incorrect about our reflective contents too (de Gaynesford 1996, 391).

Kevin Falvey and Joseph Owens have responded that although we cannot discern among first order contents, doing so is unnecessary. Although the details are “large and complex,” our contents are always determined by the environment where we happen to be, eliminating the possibility of error (Falvey and Owens 1994, 118). By contrast, Burge and others admit that contents are individuated gradually by “how the individual is committed” to objects. and that this commitment is constituted by other factors (Burge 1988, 652, Burge 1998, 352; Burge 2003a, 252). If we were suddenly switched from Earth to Twin Earth, or back again, our contents would not typically change immediately. Externalism, Burge concedes, is consistent with our having “wildly mistaken beliefs” about our enabling conditions (for example, about where we are) and so allows for errors about our first-order contents, as well as reflections upon them (Burge 2003c, 344). Because there is such a potential to be mistaken about enabling conditions, perhaps we do need to know them after all.

Other externalists have claimed that switching between Earth and Twin Earth is not a “relevant alternative”. Since such a switch is not relevant, they say, our enabling conditions (that is, conditions over time) are what we take them to be, such that we have privileged access to our first-order contents, and to our reflections on these (Warfield 1997, 283; Sawyer 1999, 371). However, as Peter Ludlow has argued, externalists cannot so easily declare switching cases to be irrelevant (Ludlow 1995, 48; Ludlow 1997, 286). As many externalists concede, relevant switching cases are easy to devise. Moreover, externalists cannot both rely on fictional Twin Earth thought experiments to generate externalist intuitions yet also object to equally fictional switching cases launched to evoke internalist intuitions. Either all such cases of logical possibility are relevant or none of them are (McCulloch 1995, 174).

Michael McKinsey, Jessica Brown and others offer another set of privileged access objections to externalism. According to externalism, they say, we do have privileged access to our contents (for example, to those expressed by water or twater, or arthritis or tharthritis). Given such access, we should be able to infer, by conceptual implication, that we are living in a particular environment (for example, on a planet with water and arthritis, on a planet twater and tharthritis, and so forth). Externalism, then, should afford us a priori knowledge of our actual environments (McKinsey 1991, 15; Brown 1995, 192; Boghossian 1998, 208). Since privileged access to our contents does not afford us a priori knowledge of our environments (the latter always remaining a posteriori), externalism implies that we possess knowledge we do not have.

Externalists, such as Burge, Brian McLaughlin and Michael Tye, Anthony Brueckner, and others have proposed that privileged access to our contents does not afford any a priori knowledge of our environments. Since we can be mistaken about natural kinds in our actual environment (for example, we may even discover that there are no kinds) the facts must be discovered. Actually, as long as objects exist somewhere, we can form contents about them just by hearing others theorize about them (Burge 1982, 114; Burge 2003c, 344; Brueckner 1992, 641; Gallois and O’Leary-Hawthorne 1996, 7; Ball 2007, 469). Although external items individuate contents, our privileged access to those contents does not afford us a priori knowledge of our environments (such details always remaining a posteriori). However, if we can form contents independent of the facts of our environment (for example, if we can have “x,” “y,” or “z” contents about x, y, or z objects when these objects have never existed around us), then externalism seems to be false in principle. Externalists must explain how this possibility does not compromise their position, or they must abandon externalism (Boghossian 1998, 210; Segal 2000, 32, 55; Besson 2012, 420).

Some externalists, Sarah Sawyer and Bill Brewer among them, have responded to this privilege access objection by suggesting that, assuming externalism is true, we can only think about objects by the causal interaction we have with them. Since this is so, privileged access to our contents allows us to infer, by conceptual implication, that those very objects exist in our actual environments. In other words, externalism affords us a priori knowledge of our environments after all (Sawyer 1998, 529-531; Brewer 2000, 416). Perhaps this response is consistent, but it requires privileged access to our contents by itself determine a priori knowledge of our environments.

b. Mental Causation and Psychological Explanation

Jerry Fodor, Colin McGinn, offer a second objection to externalism based in scientific psychology. When explaining behavior, psychologists typically cite local contents as causes of our behavior. Psychologists typically ascribe twins the same mental causes and describe twins as performing the same actions (Fodor 1987, 30; McGinn 1982, 76-77; Jacob 1992, 208, 211). However, according to externalism, contents are individuated in relation to different distal objects. Since twins across planets relate to different objects, they have different mental causes, and so should receive different explanations. Yet as Fodor and McGinn note, since the only differences between twins across planets are the relations they bear to such objects, those objects are not causally relevant. As Jacob says, the difference between twin contents and behavior seems to drop out as irrelevant (Jacob 1992, 211). Externalism, then, seems to violate principles of scientific psychology, rendering mental causation and psychological explanation mysterious (Fodor 1987, 39; McGinn 1982, 77).

Externalists, such as Burge, Robert van Gulick, and Robert Wilson have responded that, when considering mental causation and psychological explanation, local causes are important. There is still good reason to individuate contents between planets by the relation twins bear to distal (and different) objects (Burge 1989b, 309; Burge 1995, 231; van Gulick 1990; 156; Wilson 1997, 141). Externalists have also noted that any relations we bear to such objects may yet be causally relevant to behavior, albeit indirectly (Adams, Drebushenko, Fuller, and Stecker 1990, 221-223; Peacocke 1995, 224; Williamson 2000, 61-64). However, as Fodor, Chalmers, and others have argued, our relations to such distal and different objects are typically not causal but only conceptual (Fodor 1991b 21; Chalmers 2002a, 621). Assuming this is so, psychologists do not yet have any reason to prefer externalist recommendations for the individuation of content, since these practices do not distinguish the causal from the conceptual aspects of our contents.

5. Different Kinds of Content Externalism

Historically, philosophers as diverse as Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Martin Heidegger, and Ludwig Wittgenstein have all held versions of externalism. Putnam and Burge utilize Twin Earth thought experiments to argue for natural kind and social externalism, respectively, which they extend to externalism about artifacts, percepts, memories, and phenomenal properties. More recently, Gareth Evans and John McDowell, Ruth Millikan, Donald Davidson, Andy Clark and David Chalmers have developed four more types of externalism – which do not primarily rely upon Twin Earth thought experiments, and which differ in their motivations, scopes and strengths.

Gareth Evans, John McDowell adapt neo-Fregean semantics to launch a version of externalism for demonstrative thoughts (for example, this is my cat). In particular, we bear a “continuing informational link” to objects (for example, cats, tables, and so forth) where we can keep track of them, as manifested in a set of abilities (Evans 1982, 174). Without this continuing informational link and set of abilities, Evans says, we can only have “mock thoughts” about such objects. Such failed demonstrative thoughts appear to have contents, but in fact, do not (Evans 1981, 299, 302; McDowell 1986, 146; McCulloch 1989, 211-215). Evans and McDowell conclude that when we express demonstrative thoughts, our contents about them are individually dependent on the objects they represent. In response, some philosophers have questioned whether there is any real difference between our successful and failed demonstrative thoughts (that is, rendering the latter mock thoughts). Demonstrative thoughts, successful or not, seem to have the same contents and we seem to behave the same regardless (Segal 1989; Noonan 1991).

Other externalists – notably David Papineau and Ruth Garrett Millikan – employ teleosemantics to argue that contents are determined by proper causes, or those causes that best aid in our survival. Millikan notes that when thoughts are “developed in a normal way,” they are “a kind of cognitive response to” certain substances and that it is this process that determines content (Millikan 2004, 234). Moreover, we can “make the same perceptual judgment from different perspectives, using different sensory modalities, under different mediating circumstances” (Millikan 2000, 103). Millikan claims that improperly caused thoughts may feel the same as genuine thoughts, but have no place in this system. Therefore, contents are, one and all, dependent on only proper causes. However, some philosophers have responded that the prescribed contents can be produced in aberrant ways and aberrant contents can be produced by proper causes. Contents and their proper causes may be only contingently related to one another (Fodor 1990).

Donald Davidson offers a third form of externalism that relies on our basic linguistic contact with the world, on the causal history of the contents we derive from language, and the interpretation of those contents by others. Davidson insists that

…in the simplest and most basic cases, words and sentences derive their meaning from the objects and circumstances in whose presence they were learned (Davidson 1989, 44; Davidson, 1991; 197).

In such cases, we derive contents from the world directly; this begins a causal history where we can manifest the contents. An instantly created swampman – a being with no causal history – could not have the contents we have, or even have contents at all (Davidson 1987, 19). Since our contents are holistically related to each other as interpreters, we must find each other to be correct in most things. Interpretations, however, change what our contents are and do so essentially (Davidson 1991, 211). Davidson concludes that our contents are essentially dependent on our basic linguistic contact with the world, our history of possessing such contents, and on how others interpret us. In response, some philosophers have argued that simple basic linguistic contact with the world, from which we derive specific contents directly, may not be possible. A causal history may not be relevant to our having contents and the interpretations by others may have nothing to do with content (Hacker 1989; Leclerc 2005).

Andy Clark and David Chalmers have developed what has been called “active externalism,” which addresses the vehicles of content – our brains. When certain kinds of objects (for example, notebooks, mobile phones, and so forth) are engaged to perform complex tasks, the objects change the vehicles of our contents as well as how we process information. When processing information, we come to rely upon objects (for example, phones), such that they literally become parts of our minds, parts of our selves (Clark and Chalmers 1998; Clark 2010). Clark and Chalmers conclude that our minds and selves are “extended” insofar as there is no boundary between our bodies, certain objects, and our social worlds. Indeed, other externalists have broadened active or vehicle externalism to claim that there are no isolated persons at all (Noe 2006; Wilson 2010). Philosophers have suggested various ways to draw a boundary between the mind and objects, against active or vehicle externalism (Adams and Aizawa 2010). Other philosophers have responded that because active or vehicle externalism implies that the mind expands to absorb objects, it is not externalism at all (Bartlett 2008).

These newer forms of externalism do not rely on Twin Earth thought experiments. Moreover, these forms of externalism do not depend on the causal theory of reference, reference to hidden structural properties, incomplete understanding, or dictated norms for ascribing content. Consequently, these newer forms of externalism avoid various controversial assumptions in addition to any problems associated with them. However, even if one or more of these externalist approaches could overcome their respective objections, all of them, with the possible exception of active or vehicle externalism (which is not universally regarded as a form of externalism) must still face the various problems associated with privileged access, mental causation, and psychological explanation.

6. Content Internalism and Narrow Content

Internalism proposes that our contents are individuated by the properties of our bodies (for example, our brains), and these alone. According to this view, our contents locally supervene on the properties of our bodies. In the history of philosophy, René Descartes, David Hume, and Gottlob Frege have defended versions of internalism. Contemporary internalists typically respond to Twin Earth thought experiments that seem to evoke externalist intuitions. Internalists offer their own thought experiments (for example, brain in a vat experiments) to invoke internalist intuitions. For example, as David Chalmers notes, clever scientists could arrange a brain such that it has

…the same sort of inputs that a normal embodied brain receives…the brain is connected to a giant computer simulation of the world. The simulation determines which inputs the brain receives. When the brain produces outputs, these are fed back into the simulation. The internal state of the brain is just like that of a normal brain (Chalmers 2005, 33).

Internalists argue that such brain in vat experiments are coherent; they contend that brains would have the same contents as they do without their having any causal interaction with objects. It follows that neither brains in vats nor our contents are essentially dependent on the environment (Horgan, Tienson and Graham 2005; 299; Farkas 2008, 285). Moderate internalists, such as Jerry Fodor, Brian Loar, and David Chalmers, who accept Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions, insofar as they agree that some contents are broad (that is, some contents are individuated by our causally interacting with objects). However, these philosophers also argue that some contents are narrow (that is, some contents depending only on our bodies) Radical internalists, such as Gabriel Segal, reject externalist intuitions altogether and argue that all content is narrow.

Moderate and radical internalists are classed as internalists because they all develop accounts of narrow content, or attempt to show how contents are individuated by the properties of our bodies. Although these accounts of narrow content differ significantly, they are all designed to have particular features. First, narrow content is intended to mirror our perspective, which is the unique set of contents in each person, regardless of how aberrant these turn out to be. Second, narrow content is intended to mirror our patterns of reasoning – again regardless of aberrations. Third, narrow content is intended to be relevant to mental causation and to explaining our behavior, rendering broad content superfluous for that purpose (Chalmers 2002a, 624, 631). As internalists understand narrow content, then, our unique perspective, reasoning, and mental causes are all important – especially when we hope to understand the precise details of ourselves and our fellows.

a. Jerry Fodor and Phenomenological Content

In his early work, Jerry Fodor developed a version of moderate internalism. Fodor concedes that the Twin Earth thought experiments show that some of our contents (for example, water or twater) are broad. Still, for the purposes of scientific psychology, he argues, we must construct some content that respects “methodological solipsism,” which in turn explains why the twins are psychologically the same. Consequently, Fodor holds that narrow content respects syntax, or does so “without reference to the semantic properties of truth and reference” (Fodor 1981, 240; Fodor 1982, 100). Phenomenologically, the content of “water is wet” is something like “…a universally quantified belief with the content that all the potable, transparent, sailable-on…and so forth, kind of stuff is wet (Fodor 1982, 111).” However, soon after Fodor offered this phenomenological version of narrow content, many philosophers noted that if such content by itself has nothing to do with truth or reference it is hard to see how this could be content, or how it could explain our behavior (Rudder-Baker 1985, 144; Adams, Drebushenko, Fuller, and Stecker 1990, 217).

Fodor responded by slightly changing his position. According to his revised position, although narrow content respects syntax, contents are functions, or “mappings of thoughts and contexts onto truth conditions” (for example, the different truth conditions that obtain on either planet). In other words, before we think any thought in context we have functions that determine that when we are on one planet we have certain contents and when on the other we will have different ones. If we were switched with our twin, our thoughts would still match across worlds (Fodor 1987, 48). However, Fodor concedes, independent of context, we cannot say what narrow contents the twins share (that is, across planets). Still, he insists that we can approach these contents, albeit indirectly (Fodor 1987, 53). In other words, we can use broad contents understood in terms of “primacy of veridical tokening of symbols” and then infer narrow contents from them (Fodor 1991a, 268). Fodor insists that while twins across worlds have different broad contents, they have the same narrow functions that determine these contents.

But as Robert Stalnaker, Ned Block, and others have argued, if narrow contents are but functions that map contexts of thoughts onto truth conditions, they do not themselves have truth conditions – arguably, they are not contents. Narrow content, in this view, is just syntax (Stalnaker 1989, 580; Block 1991, 39, 51). Even if there was a way to define narrow content so that it would not reduce to syntax, it would still be difficult to say what about the descriptions must be held constant for them to perform the function of determining different broad contents on either planet (Block 1991, 53). Lastly, as Paul Bernier has noted, even if we could settle on some phenomenological descriptions to be held constant across planets, we could not know that any tokening of symbols really did determine their broad contents correctly (Bernier 1993, 335).

Ernest Lepore, Barry Loewer, and others have added that even if narrow contents could be defined as functions that map thoughts and contexts onto truth conditions, and even if these were short phenomenological descriptions, parts of the descriptions (for example, water or twater “…is wet,” or arthritis or tharthritis “…is painful” and so forth) might themselves be susceptible to new externalist thought experiments. If we could run new thought experiments on terms like “wet” or “painful,” those terms may not be narrow (Lepore and Loewer 1986, 609; Rowlands 2003, 113). Assuming that this is possible, there can be no way to pick out the truly narrow component in such descriptions, rendering this entire account of narrow content hopeless.

In the early 21st century, proponents of “phenomenal intentionality” defended this phenomenological version of narrow content. Experience, these philosophers say, must be characterized as the complex relation that “x presents y to z,” where z is an agent. In other words, agents are presented with various apparent properties, relations, and so forth, all with unique feels. Moreover, these presentations can be characterized merely by using “logical, predicative, and indexical expressions” (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 301). These philosophers insist the phenomenology of such presentations is essential to them, such that all who share them also share contents. Phenomenal intentionality, then, is narrow (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 302; Horgan and Kriegel 2008, 360). Narrow contents, furthermore, have narrow truth conditions. The narrow truth conditions of “that picture is crooked” may be characterized as “…there is a unique object x, located directly in front of me and visible by me, such that x is a picture and x is hanging crooked (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 313).”

Defenders of phenomenological intentionality insist that although it is difficult to formulate narrow truth conditions precisely, we still share them with twins and brains in vats – although brains will not have many of their conditions satisfied (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 315; Horgan 2007, 5). Concerning the objections to this account, if phenomenology is essential to content, there is little worry that content will reduce to syntax, about what part of content should be held constant across worlds, or about new externalist thought experiments. Externalists, of course, argue that phenomenology is not essential to content and that phenomenology is not narrow (Lycan 2001; Tye 2008; Ellis 2010). Because proponents of phenomenological intentionality hold that phenomenology is essential to content, they can respond that such arguments beg the question against them.

b. Brian Loar and David Chalmers on Conceptual Roles and Two-Dimensional Semantics

Brian Loar, David Chalmers, and others have developed another version of moderate internalism. Loar and Chalmers concede that the Twin Earth thought experiments show that some contents are broad (for example, water, twater or arthritis, tharthritis, and so forth), but also argue that our conceptual roles are narrow. Conceptual roles, these philosophers say, mirror our perspective and reasoning, and are all that is relevant to psychological explanations.

Conceptual roles, Colin McGinn notes, can be characterized by our “subjective conditional probability function on particular attitudes. In other words, roles are determined by our propensity to “assign probability values” to attitudes, regardless of how aberrant these attitudes turn out to be (McGinn 1982 234). In a famous series of articles, Loar adds that we experience such roles subjectively as beliefs, desires, and so forth. Such subjective states, he says, are too specific to be captured in public discourse and only have “psychological content,” or the content that is mirrored in how we conceive things (Loar 1988a, 101; Loar 1988b, 127). When we conceive things in the same way (for example, as twins across worlds do), we have the same contents. When we conceive things differently (for example, when we have different evaluations of a place), we have different contents. However, Loar admits that psychological contents do not themselves have truth conditions but only project what he calls “realization conditions,” or the set of possible worlds where contents “…would be true,” or satisfied (Loar 1988a, 108; Loar 1988b, 123). Loar concedes that without truth conditions psychological contents may seem odd, but they are narrow. In other words, psychological contents project realization conditions and do so regardless of whether or not these conditions are realized (Loar 1988b, 135).

David Chalmers builds on this conceptual role account of narrow content but defines content in terms of our understanding of epistemic possibilities. When we consider certain hypotheses, he says, it requires us to accept some things a priori and to reject others. Given enough information about the world, agents will be “…in a position to make rational judgments about what their expressions refer to” (Chalmers 2006, 591). Chalmers defines scenarios as “maximally specific sets of epistemic possibilities,” such that the details are set (Chalmers 2002a, 610). By dividing up various epistemic possibilities in scenarios, he says, we assume a “centered world” with ourselves at the center. When we do this, we consider our world as actual and describe our “epistemic intensions” for that place, such that these intentions amount to “…functions from scenarios to truth values” (Chalmers 2002a, 613). Epistemic intensions, though, have epistemic contents that mirror our understanding of certain qualitative terms, or those terms that refer to “certain superficial characteristics of objects…in any world” and reflect our ideal reasoning (for example, our best reflective judgments) about them (Chalmers 2002a, 609; Chalmers 2002b, 147; Chalmers 2006, 586). Given this, our “water” contents are such that “If the world turns out one way, it will turn out that water is H20; if the world turns out another way, it will turn out that water is XYZ” (Chalmers 2002b, 159).

Since our “water” contents constitute our a priori ideal inferences, the possibility that water is XYZ may remain epistemically possible (that is, we cannot rule it out a priori). Chalmers insists that given this background, epistemic contents really are narrow, because we evaluate them prior to whichever thoughts turn out to be true, such that twins (and brains in vats) reason the same (Chalmers 2002a, 616; Chalmers 2006, 596). Lastly, since epistemic contents do not merely possess realization conditions or conditions that address “…what would have been” in certain worlds but are assessed in the actual world, they deliver “epistemic truth conditions” for that place (Chalmers 2002a, 618; Chalmers 2002b, 165; Chalmers 2006, 594). Epistemic contents, then, are not odd but are as valuable as any other kind of content. In sum, Chalmers admits that while twins across worlds have different broad contents, twins (and brains) still reason exactly the same, and must be explained in the same way. Indeed, since cognitive psychology “…is mostly concerned with epistemic contents” philosophy should also recognize their importance (Chalmers, 2002a, 631).

However, as Robert Stalnaker and others have argued, if conceptual roles only have psychological contents that project realization conditions, we can best determine them by examining broad contents and then extracting narrow contents (Stalnaker 1990, 136). If this is how we determine narrow contents, they are merely derivative and our access to them is limited. However, Stalnaker says, that if psychological contents have actual truth conditions, then they are broad (Stalnaker 1990, 141). Chalmers, though, has responded that on his version of the position, our a priori ideal evaluations of epistemic possibilities in scenarios yields epistemic intensions with epistemic contents, and these contents have epistemic truth conditions of their own. Given these changes, he says, the problems of narrow content do not arise for him. Still, as Christian Nimtz and others have argued, epistemic contents seem merely to be qualitative descriptions of kinds, and so fall victim to typical modal and epistemological objections to descriptivist theories of reference (Nimtz 2004, 136). Similarly, as Alex Byrne and James Pryor argue, because such descriptions do not yield “substantive identifying knowledge” of kinds, it is doubtful we can know what these contents are, or even that they exist (Byrne and Pryor 2006, 45, 50). Lastly, other externalists have responded that the qualitative terms we use to express capture epistemic contents must be semantically neutral. However, since such neutral terms are not available, such contents are beyond our ken (Sawyer 2008, 27-28).

Chalmers has responded that although epistemic contents can be phrased descriptively, “there is no reason to think that grasping an epistemic intension requires any sort of descriptive articulation by a subject” (Chalmers 2002b, 148). Since this is so, he says, theory is not committed to the description theory of reference. Similarly, Chalmers insists that as long as we have enough information about the world, we do not require substantive identifying knowledge of kinds, but only “…a conditional ability” to identify them (Chalmers 2006, 600). Some philosophers have postulated that repeated contact with actual or hypothetical referents may change and refine it, and others have suggested that this ability may include abductive reasoning (Brogaard 2007, 320). However, Chalmers denies that this objection applies to his position because the conditional ability to identify kinds concerns only our ideal reasoning (for example, our best reflective judgments). Chalmers concedes that our qualitative language must be semantically neutral, but he insists that once we have enough information about the world, “…a qualitative characterization… will suffice” (Chalmers 2006, 603). Such a characterization, he says, will guarantee that twins (and brains in vats) have contents with the same epistemic truth conditions.

c. Radical Internalism

Unlike moderate internalists such as Fodor, Loar, and Chalmers, Gabriel Segal makes the apparently radical move of rejecting Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions altogether (Segal, 2000, 24). Radical internalism offers the virtues of not needing to accommodate externalism, and of avoiding typical criticisms of narrow content. Internalists, Segal says, are not required to concede that some of our contents are broad and then to develop versions of narrow contents as phenomenology, epistemic contents, or conceptual roles beyond this. Indeed, he insists that this move has always been an “unworkable compromise” at best (Segal 2000, 114). Rather, as Segal says, narrow content is…a variety of ordinary representation” (Segal 2000, 19).

Segal notes that when offering Twin Earth thought experiments, externalists typically assume that the causal theory of reference is true, that we refer to hidden structural properties, can have contents while incompletely understanding them, and assume tendentious norms for ascribing contents. Moreover, Segal says, externalists seem unable to account for cases of referential failure (for example, cases of scientific failure), and so their account of content is implausible on independent grounds (Segal 2000, 32, 55). When all this is revealed, he says, our intuitions about content can easily change, and do. Interpreted properly, in this view, the Twin Earth thought experiments do not show that our contents are broad, but rather reveals “psychology, as it is practiced by the folk and the scientist, is already, at root, internalist” (Segal 2000, 122).

Segal describes our narrow contents as “motleys,” or organic entities that can “persist through changes of extension” yet still evolve. Motleys “…leave open the possibility of referring to many kinds,” depending on the circumstances (Segal 2000, 77, 132). Although Segal disavows any general method for determining when contents change or remain the same, he insists that we can employ various charitable means to determine this. When there is any mystery, we can construct neologisms to be more accurate. Neologisms allow us to gauge just how much our fellows deviate from us, and even to factor these deviations out (Segal 2000, 141; Segal 2008, 16). Regardless of these details, motleys are shared by twins (and brains in vats). Segal suggests that we follow the lead of experimental psychologists who track the growth and changes in our concepts by using scientific methods and models, but who only recognize narrow contents (Segal 2000, 155).

Importantly, because Segal rejects Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions, externalists cannot accuse his version of narrow content of not being content, or of being broad content in disguise, without begging the question against him. Still, as Jessica Brown has argued, his account is incomplete. Segal, she notes, assumes a neo-Fregean account of content which she paraphrases as

If S rationally assents to P (t1) and dissents from or abstains from the truth value of P (t2), where P is in an extensional context, then for S, t1 and t2 have different contents, and S associates different concepts with them (Brown 2002, 659).

Brown insists that Segal assumes this neo-Fregean principle, but “…fails to provide any evidence” for it (Brown 2002, 660). Given this lacuna in his argument, she says, externalists might either try to accommodate this principle, or to reject it outright. Externalists have done both. Although Segal does not explicitly defend this neo-Fregean principle, he begins an implicit defense elsewhere (Segal 2003, 425). Externalists, by contrast, have struggled to accommodate this neo-Fregean principle and those externalists who have abandoned it have rarely offered replacements (Kimbrough 1989, 480).

Because Segal bases his radical internalism on rejecting externalist intuitions altogether, its very plausibility rests on this. Externalists typically take their intuitions about content obvious and expect others to agree. Still, as Segal notes, although externalist intuitions are popular, it is reasonable to reject them. By doing this, he hopes to “reset the dialectical balance” between externalism and internalism (Segal 2000, 126). Radical internalism, he says, may not be so radical after all.

7. Conclusion

Externalism and internalism, as we have seen, address how we individuate the content of our attitudes, or address what makes those contents what they are. Putnam, Burge, and other externalists insist that contents can be individuated by our causal interaction with the natural and social world. Externalists seem to incur problems of privileged access to our contents as well as problems about mental causation and psychological explanation. Externalist responses to these issues have been numerous, and have dominated the literature. By contrast, Chalmers, Segal, and other content internalists argue that contents can be individuated by our bodies. Internalists, though, have faced the charge that since narrow content does not have truth conditions, it is not content. Moreover, if such content does have truth conditions it is just broad content in disguise. Internalist responses to these charges have ranged from trying to show how narrow content is not vulnerable to these criticisms, to suggesting that the externalist intuitions upon which the charges rest should themselves be discarded.

Externalists and internalists have very different intuitions about the mind. Externalists seem unable to imagine minds entirely independent of the world (repeatedly claiming that possibility revises our common practices, or is incoherent in some way). By contrast, internalists see the split between mind and world as fundamental to understanding ourselves and our fellows, and so concentrate on questions of perspective, reasoning, and so forth. Given the contrasting intuitions between externalists and internalists, both sides often mischaracterize the other and see the other as clinging to doubtful, biased, or even incoherent conventions. Unless some way to test such intuitions is developed, proponents of both sides will continue to cleave to their assumptions in the debate, convinced that the burden of proof must be borne by the opposition.

8. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Basil Smith
Email: Bsmith108@saddleback.edu
Saddleback College
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 26, 2013 | Originally published: