Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology

The internalism-externalism (I-E) debate lies near the center of contemporary discussion about epistemology. The basic idea of internalism is that justification is solely determined by factors that are internal to a person. Externalists deny this, asserting that justification depends on additional factors that are external to a person. A significant aspect of the I-E debate involves setting out exactly what counts as internal to a person.

The rise of the I-E debate coincides with the rebirth of epistemology after Edmund Gettier’s famous 1963 paper, “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” In that paper, Gettier presented several cases to show that knowledge is not identical to justified true belief. Cases of this type are referred to as “Gettier cases,” and they illustrate “the Gettier problem.” Standard Gettier cases show that one can have internally adequate justification without knowledge. The introduction of the Gettier problem to epistemology required rethinking the connection between true belief and knowledge, and the subsequent discussion generated what became the I-E debate over the nature of justification in an account of knowledge. Internalists maintained that knowledge requires justification and that the nature of this justification is completely determined by a subject’s internal states or reasons. Externalists denied at least one of these commitments: either knowledge does not require justification or the nature of justification is not completely determined by internal factors alone. On the latter view, externalists maintained that the facts that determine a belief’s justification include external facts such as whether the belief is caused by the state of affairs that makes the belief true, whether the belief is counterfactually dependent on the states of affairs that makes it true, whether the belief is produced by a reliable belief-producing process, or whether the belief is objectively likely to be true. The I-E discussion engages a wide range of epistemological issues involving the nature of rationality, the ethics of belief, and skepticism.

Table of Contents

  1. The Logic of the I-E Debate
    1. Knowledge and Justification
    2. Justification and Well-foundedness
    3. The Meaning of ‘Internal’
    4. Taking Stock
  2. Reasons for Internalism
    1. The Socratic/Cartesian project
    2. Deontology (The Ethics of Belief)
    3. Natural Judgment about Cases
      1. BonJour’s Norman case
      2. The New Evil Demon Problem
  3. Reasons for Externalism
    1. The Truth Connection
    2. Grandma, Timmy and Lassie
    3. The Scandal of Skepticism
  4. The Significance of the I-E Debate
    1. Disagreement over the Significance of the Thermometer Model
    2. Disagreement over the Guiding Conception of Justification
    3. Disagreement over Naturalism in Epistemology
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Logic of the I-E Debate

The simple conception of the I-E debate as a dispute over whether the facts that determine justification are all internal to a person is complicated by several factors. First, some epistemologists understand externalism as a view that knowledge does not require justification while others think it should be understood as an externalist view of justification. Second, there is an important distinction between having good reasons for one’s belief (that is, propositional justification) and basing one’s belief on the good reasons one possesses (that is, doxastic justification). This distinction matters to the nature of the internalist thesis and consequently the I-E debate itself. Third, there are two different and prominent ways of understanding what is internal to a person. This bears on the nature of the internalist thesis and externalist arguments against internalism. This section explores these complications.

a. Knowledge and Justification

The traditional analysis of knowledge is that knowledge is justified true belief. As Socrates avers in the Meno, knowledge is more than true belief. Superstitious beliefs that just turn out to be true are not instances of knowledge. In the Theatetus Socrates proposes that knowledge is true belief tied down by an account. Socrates’ proposal is the beginning of what epistemologists refer to as the justified true belief (JTB) account of knowledge. A true belief tied down by an account can be understood as a true belief for which one has adequate reasons. On the JTB account having adequate reasons turns a true belief into knowledge.

The JTB account was demolished by Gettier’s famous 1963 article. As explained in the introduction Gettier cases demonstrate that knowledge is more than justified true belief. Suppose that Smith possesses a good deal of evidence for the belief that someone in his office owns a Ford. Smith’s evidence includes such things as that Smith sees Jones drive a Ford to work every day and that Jones talks about the joys of owning a Ford. It turns out, however, that (unbeknownst to Smith) Jones is deceiving his coworkers into believing he owns a Ford. At the same time, though, someone else in Smith’s office, Brown, does own a Ford. So, Smith’s belief that someone in his office owns a Ford is both justified and true. Yet it seems to most people that Smith’s belief is not an instance of knowledge.

The Gettier problem led epistemologists to rethink the connection between knowledge and true belief. An externalist position developed that focused on causal relations or, more generally, dependency relations between one’s belief and the facts as providing the key to turning true belief into knowledge (see Armstrong 1973). It is unclear from this move alone whether externalism should be understood as the view knowledge does not require justification or that justification should be understood externally. Some externalists advocate the view that knowledge doesn’t require justification but that nonetheless justification is epistemically important (see Sosa 1991b). Other externalists hold that knowledge does require justification but that the nature of the justification is amenable to an externalist analysis (see Bergmann 2006).

A significant aspect of the issue of how one should understand externalism is whether the term ‘justification’ is a term of logic or merely a place-holder for a necessary condition for knowledge. If ‘justification’ is a term of logic then it invokes notions of consistency, inconsistency, implication, and coherence. On this conception of justification an externalist analysis of the nature of justification is implausible. However, if ‘justification’ is merely a place-holder for a condition in an account of knowledge then the nature of justification might be amenable to an externalist analysis. Externalists have defended both views. Some argue that ‘justification’ is a term of logic and so their position is best understood as the view that justification is not required for knowledge. However, other externalists have argued that ‘justification’ is not a term of logic but a term that occurs in connection with knowledge talk and so is amenable to an externalist account. Many internalists, by contrast, claim that justification is necessary for knowledge and that the notion of justification may be (partially) explicated by the concepts of consistency, implication, and coherence.

b. Justification and Well-foundedness

There is a significant difference between merely having good reasons for one’s belief that the Bears will win the Super Bowl and basing one’s belief on those reasons. Mike Ditka may have excellent reasons for believing the Bears will win; they have a superior defense and an excellent running back. Nevertheless Ditka may believe that the Bears will win based on wishful thinking. In this case it’s natural to make a distinction in one’s epistemic evaluation of Ditka’s belief. Ditka’s belief is justified because he has good reasons for it. But Ditka’s believing the claim as he does is not justified because he bases his belief on wishful thinking and not the good reasons he has. This marks the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification. Other epistemologists refer to the same distinction as that between justification and well-foundedness (see Conee & Feldman 2004).

This leads to a second area of complication in the I-E debate. Internalists claim that every condition that determines a belief’s justification is internal, but causal relations are typically not internal. Since basing one’s belief on reasons is a causal relation between one’s belief and one’s reasons, internalists should not claim that every factor that determines doxastic justification is internal (see 1c below for further discussion of this). Accordingly, internalism should be understood as a view about propositional justification. Moreover, given that one cannot know unless one bases one’s belief on good reasons this implies that internalists will understand the justification condition in an account of knowledge as composed of two parts: propositional justification and some causal condition (typically referred to as “the basing relation”). This considerably complicates the I-E debate because there’s not a straightforward disagreement between internalist and externalist views of doxastic justification, since externalists typically avoid dissecting the justification condition. Common forms of externalism build in a causal requirement to justification, for example, one’s belief that p is produced by a reliable method. Nevertheless it is important to get the nature of the internalist thesis straight and only then determine the nature of the externalist objections.

c. The Meaning of ‘Internal’

The distinction between propositional and doxastic justification allows us to bring into focus different notions of internal states. Internalism is best understood as the thesis that propositional justification, not doxastic justification, is completely determined by one’s internal states. But what are one’s internal states? One’s internal states could be one’s bodily states, one’s brain states, one’s mental states (if these are different than brain states), or one’s reflectively accessible states. The two most common ways of understanding internalism has been to take internal states as either reflectively accessible states or mental states. The former view is known as accessibilism and it has been championed by Roderick Chisholm and Laurence BonJour (see also Matthias Steup (1999)). The latter view is known as mentalism and it has been defended by Richard Feldman and Earl Conee.

On an accessibilist view every factor that determines whether one’s belief is propositionally justified is reflectively accessible. Since the causal origins of one’s beliefs are not, in general, reflectively accessible they do not determine whether one’s belief is propositionally justified. But whether or not one’s belief that p and one’s belief that q are contradictory is reflectively accessible. Since contradictory beliefs cannot both be justified one can ascertain by reflection alone whether pairs of beliefs lack this devastating epistemic property.

One should note that the above claim that the causal origins of one’s beliefs are not, in general, reflectively accessible is an anti-Cartesian claim. Arguably, Descartes thought that one could always discover the causal origins of one’s beliefs. On the Cartesian view causal relations that hold between beliefs and experiences and beliefs are reflectively accessible. Many scholars, however, believe this view is false. Stemming from Freud’s work many now think that one does not have the kind of access Descartes thought one had to the causal origins of one’s beliefs. Given this an accessibilist view about doxastic justification—that is, propositional justification + the causal origins of one’s belief—is not feasible. Accessibilists should only require that every factor that determines whether one’s belief is propositionally justified is reflectively accessible.

There are varieties of accessibilist views depending on how one unpacks what states count as reflectively accessible. Are these states that one is able to reflectively access now or states that one may access given some time? If accessibilism is not restricted to current mental states then it needs to explain where the cut off is between states that count towards determining justificatory status and those that don’t count. Richard Feldman has a helpful article on this topic in which he defends the strong thesis that it is only one’s current mental states that determine justificatory status (Feldman 2004b).

Another dimension apropos accessibilism is whether the justificatory status of one’s belief needs to be accessible as well. If it does then one’s inability to determine whether or not one’s belief that p is justified demonstrates that p is not justified for one. BonJour (1985, chapter 2), for instance, is commonly cited as defending this strong kind of accessibilism. This strong version of accessibilism is often taken to be the purest form of internalism since internalism is not uncommonly associated with a commitment to higher-order principles such as one knows that p only if one knows that one knows that p. Robert Nozick (1981, p. 281) takes internalism to be the thesis that knowledge implies knowledge of all the preconditions of knowing.

The other prominent view of internal states is that they are mental states. This view is known as mentalism (see Conee & Feldman 2004b). Mentalism, like accessibilism, is a view about propositional justification, not doxastic justification. One’s mental states completely determine the justificatory status of one’s beliefs. Mentalism is connected to accessibilism since according to the Cartesian tradition one can determine which mental states one is in by reflection alone. To the extent that mentalism is distinct from accessibilism it allows that some non-reflectively accessible mental states can determine whether one’s belief is propositionally justified.

A defender of a mentalist view needs to explain which mental states determine justificatory status. Do all mental states—hopes, fears, longings—determine propositional justification or just some mental states, such as beliefs and experiences? Moreover, a defender of mentalism needs to clarify whether both current and non-current mental states can determine justificatory status. A non-current mental state is a mental state that you do not currently host. For instance, you believed a moment ago that 186 is greater than 86 but currently you are not thinking about this.

One of the advantages of mentalism is that it upholds a clear internalist thesis—justification is determined by one’s mental states—without appealing to the problematic notion of access. Many understand the notion of access to be a thinly disguised epistemic term (see, for instance, Fumerton (1995) p. 64). To have access to some fact is just to know whether or not that fact obtains. This is problematic for an accessibilist because he analyzes justification in terms of access and then use the notion of justification to partially explicate knowledge. In short, if ‘access’ is an epistemic term then any analysis of knowledge that rests upon facts about access will be circular. The mentalist escapes this problem. One’s mental states determine justification, and one does not explicate what one’s mental states are by appeal to the problematic notion of access. However, mentalism does face the objection that since it eschews the notion of access it is not a genuine form of internalism (see Bergmann 2006 for a further examination of this issue).

d. Taking Stock

Before we press on to other issues in the I-E debate let us take stock of what has been considered. Internalism is the view that all the factors that determine propositional justification are either reflectively accessible states (that is, accessibilism) or mental states (that is, mentalism). Internalists also hold that doxastic justification, which is propositional justification and a basing requirement, is necessary for knowledge. We can think of internalism as the view that all the factors that determine justification apart from a basing requirement are internal. Let us call these justification determining factors, minus the basing requirement, the J-factors. Externalists about justification deny that the J-factors are all internal. If, however, we view externalism merely as a negative thesis then we lose sight of its distinctly philosophical motivation. Externalists’ positive views are grounded in the intuition that the natural relations between one’s beliefs and the environment matter to a belief’s justification. If, for example, a subject’s belief that there is a tiger behind the tall grass is caused by the fact that there is a tiger there this fact seems significant to determining the justificatory status of that belief, even though this fact may not be reflectively accessible to one. At a certain level of generality, externalism is best viewed as stressing the justificatory significance of dependency relations between one’s belief and the environment.

2. Reasons for Internalism

This section examines prominent reasons for internalism. I will discuss three motivations for internalism: the appeal to the Socratic/Cartesian project; the appeal to deontology; and the appeal to natural judgment about cases. These three motivations are conspicuous in arguments for internalism. After giving each reason I shall consider externalist responses.

a. The Socratic/Cartesian project

One common strategy internalists employ is to emphasize that epistemic justification requires having good reasons for one’s beliefs. As both Socrates and Descartes stressed it’s not rational to believe p without possessing a good reason for believing p. Suppose I believe that the Telecom’s stock will drastically fall tomorrow. It’s reasonable to ask why I think that’s true. Clearly it’s wrong to repeat myself, saying “I believe that’s true because it is true.” So it seems I must have a reason, distinct from my original belief, for thinking that Telecom’s stock will fall. Also I cannot appeal to the causal origins of that belief or to the reliability of the specific belief process. Those sorts of facts are beyond my ken. Whatever I can appeal to will be something I am aware of. Moreover, I can’t merely appeal to another belief, for example, Karen told me that Telecom’s stock will fall. I need a good reason for thinking that Karen is good indicator about these sorts of things. Apart from that supporting belief it’s not rational to believe that Telecom’s stock will fall. So rationality requires good reasons that indicate a belief is true. The appeal to the Socratic/Cartesian project is a way to motivate the claim that it is a basic fact that rationality requires good reasons.

This requirement conflicts with externalism since externalism allows for the possibility that one’s belief is justified even though one has no reasons for that belief. To draw out this commitment let us expand on the above example. Suppose that my belief that Telecom’s stock will fall is based on my beliefs that Karen told me so and that Karen is a reliable indicator of these things. But not every belief of mine is supported by other beliefs I have. These kinds of beliefs are called basic beliefs, beliefs that are not supported by other beliefs. Consider your belief that there’s a cube on the table. What reason do you have for this belief? It might be difficult to say. Yet internalism requires that you have some reason (typically, the content of one’s experience) that supports this belief if that belief is rational. Externalists think that that is just too tall of an order. In fact one of the early motivations for externalism was to handle the justification of basic beliefs (see Armstrong 1973). In general, externalists think that basic beliefs can be justified merely by the belief meeting some external condition. One complication with this, though, is that some externalists think a basic belief require reasons but that reasons should be understood in an externalist fashion (see Alston (1988)). I shall ignore this complication because on Alston’s analysis justification depends on factors outside one’s ken. So, to the extent that one is moved by the internalist intuition, one will think that externalism falls. It allows for justification without good reasons. One should also note that this appeal to the Socratic/Cartesian project supports accessibilism.

A related argument used to support internalism appeals to the inadequacy of externalism to answer philosophical curiosity (see Fumerton 2006). If we take up the Socratic project then we are interesting in determining whether our most basic beliefs about reality are likely to be true. It seems entirely unsatisfactory to note that if one’s beliefs meet some specified external condition then the beliefs are justified; for the natural question is whether one’s belief has met that external condition. This suggests that to the extent that we are interested in whether our beliefs are epistemically justified internalism is the only game in town. Externalist Response One early externalist response was to note that internalists focus on conditions they use to determine justificatory status but that this is conceptually distinct from conditions that actually do determine justificatory status. An adequate definition of albinos may be entirely useless for finding actual albinos (see Armstrong 1973, p. 191). In a similar manner it’s at least conceptually possible that one’s analysis of the nature of justification is not a useful tool for determining whether or not one’s beliefs are justified. What this shows is that internalists need an additional argument from the fact that we can appeal to only internal factors to determine justification to the conclusion that only internal facts determine justification.

Another early response to this internalist tactic is to argue that internalism fails to meet its own demands. Alvin Goldman (1980) presents an argument of this kind, claiming that there is no definite and acceptable set of internalistic conditions that determine what cognitive attitude a subject should have given her evidence. Goldman argues for this conclusion by supposing that there is some set of internalistic conditions and then contenting that there no acceptable way to accommodate this set of conditions within the constraints laid down by internalists. For instance, Goldman reasons that one internalistic constraint is that the correctness of these conditions be reflectively accessible. But, if the correctness of this procedure depends on its ability to get one to the truth more often than not, then since that property isn’t reflectively accessible, internalists shouldn’t understand the correctness of the procedure to consist in its ability to be a good guide to the truth. Goldman then argues that other accounts of the correctness of this procedure likewise fail. So it is not possible for internalism to meet its own severe restrictions. For a similar argument see Richard Foley (1993).

b. Deontology (The Ethics of Belief)

A prominent source of support for internalism is the allegedly deontological character of justification (see Plantinga (1993), chapter 1; this section relies heavily on Plantinga’s discussion). The language of ‘justified’ & ‘unjustified’ invokes concepts like rightness & wrongness, blameless & blameworthy, and dutifulness & neglect. Facts about justification are set in the larger context of one’s duties, obligations, and requirements. Descartes, for instance, explains that false belief arises from the improper use of one’s own will. There is a two-fold implication to this. First, if one governs one’s believing as one ought then one is justified in one’s believings. Second, if one maintains proper doxastic attitudes one will have (by and large) true beliefs. Locke, like Descartes, connects justification with duty fulfillment. Locke maintains that though one may miss truth, if one governs one’s doxastic attitudes in accord with duty then one will not miss the reward of truth (Essay, IV, xvii, 24).

The argument from the deontological character of justification to internalism proceeds as follows. Justification is a matter of fulfilling one’s intellectual duties but whether or not one has fulfilled one’s intellectual duties is entirely an internal matter. One fulfills one’s intellectual duties when one has properly taken into account the evidence one possesses. If Smith scrupulously analyzes all the relevant information about Telecom’s stock prices and draws the conclusion that Telecom’s prices will soar then Smith’s belief is justified. If it later comes to light that the information was misleading this doesn’t impugn our judgment about Smith’s belief at that time. Smith was intellectually virtuous in his believing and drew the appropriate conclusion given the evidence he possessed. In contrast if Jones is an epistemically reckless stock broker who does not study the market before he makes his judgments, but happens to hit on the true belief that Telecom’s stock prices will fall then we do not count his belief as justified since he ignored all the relevant evidence. Jones should have believed otherwise.

The cases of Smith and Jones support the claim that fulfilling one’s intellectual duty is entirely a matter of what one is able to determine by reflection alone. Both Smith and Jones are able to determine that their evidence indicates Telecom’s stock will soar. Smith appropriately believes this and Jones does not. Since externalists would require some other non-reflectively accessible condition externalism is wrong. One should note that this argument supports accessiblism, not mentalism. Externalist Response Externalists have responded to this line of argument in two ways. First, some externalists deny that facts about duties, rights, or blameworthiness are relevant to the sense of justification necessary for knowledge. Second, other externalists deny that the deontological character of justification supports accessibilism. Arguments of the first kind fall into two groups: (a) arguments that a necessary condition for rights, duties, or blameworthiness is not met with respect to belief and (b) arguments that facts about deontology are not relevant to determining epistemic facts. The most common argument for (a) is that beliefs are outside of an individual’s control, and so it does not make sense to consider an individual blameworthy for a belief. This is the issue of doxastic voluntarism. Sosa (2003) and Plantinga (1993) present arguments for (b). The basic idea in these cases is that an individual may be deeply epistemically flawed but nonetheless perfectly blameless in his or her belief. An individual may, for instance, be “hardwired” to accept as valid instances of affirming the consequent; nonetheless, a person’s belief in A on the basis of if A then B and B is not justified.

Michael Bergmann (2006, chapter 4) presents an argument of the second type that the deontological character of justification does not support accessibilism. The basic idea of Bergmann’s argument is that an appeal to the deontological character of justification only supports the requirement that the person not be aware of any reasons against the belief. It does not support the stronger requirement that the person be aware of positive reasons for the belief. Bergmann then argues the weaker requirement is consistent with externalism.

c. Natural Judgment about Cases

A different strategy to support internalism is to appeal to natural judgment about cases. I shall consider two famous thought experiments designed to elicit internalist intuitions: BonJour’s Clairvoyant cases, specifically the case of Norman (BonJour 1980) and the new evil demon problem (Lehrer & Cohen 1983 & Cohen 1984). I shall present the two cases and then offer an externalist response. As Sosa (1991a) explains the two cases are related in that each is the mirror image of the other. In the Norman case there is reliability without internal evidence while in the new evil demon problem there is internal evidence without reliability.

i. BonJour’s Norman case

In BonJour’s (1980) article he presents four clairvoyant cases to illustrate the fundamental problem with externalism. Subsequent discussion has focused mainly on the case of Norman. BonJour describes the Norman case as follows:

Norman, under certain conditions that usually obtain, is a completely reliable clairvoyant with respect to certain kinds of subject matter. He possesses no evidence or reasons of any kind for or against the general possibility of such a cognitive power, or for or against the thesis that he possesses it. One day Norman comes to believe that the President is in New York City, though he has no evidence either for or against his belief. In fact the belief is true and results from his clairvoyant power, under circumstances in which it is completely reliable. (p. 21)

Intuitively it seems that Norman’s belief is not justified. Norman doesn’t have any reasons for thinking that the President is in New York City. Norman just finds himself believing that. Were Norman to reflect on his belief he would come to see that that belief is unsupported. Yet in the situation imagined Norman’s belief is the product of a reliable process. Norman is not aware of this fact. But nonetheless on some externalist analyses Norman’s belief is justified because it is produced by a reliable process.

The Norman case is used to illustrate a general problem with externalism. Externalists hold that the justification of basic beliefs requires only that the specified external condition is met (excluding the complication with Alston’s view, mentioned above). Yet where the subject lacks any internally accessible reason for thinking the belief is true it seems irrational for the subject to maintain that belief. Rationality requires good reasons.

ii. The New Evil Demon Problem

The original evil demon problem comes from Descartes. In the Meditations Descartes entertains the possibility that he is deceived by a powerful demon in believing that (for example,) he has hands. Descartes concludes that he needs to rule out this possibility by providing good reasons for thinking that he is not deceived in this way and that he can take the evidence of his senses at face value. Most epistemologists think Descartes concedes too much by requiring that he rule out this possibility in order to know that he has hands on the basis of the evidence he possesses.

The new evil demon problem is different from Descartes’ evil demon problem. This problem does not require that one rule out the possibility of massive deception in order to have knowledge. Rather the problem is intended to illustrate the inadequacy of externalism. The new evil demon problem was originally developed against reliabilism, the view that a belief’s justification consists in the reliability of the process that produced it. The problem is that there are possible individuals with the same evidence as we possess but whose evidence is not truth indicative. For instance we can conceive of individuals that have been placed in Matrix scenarios in which their brains are stimulated to have all the same experiences we have. When we seem to see a tree, normally a tree is present. However, when these individuals in a Matrix scenario seem to see a tree, there is no tree present. Their experiences are systematically misleading. Nevertheless since they possess just the same evidence that we have, the justificatory status of their beliefs is exactly the same as ours. If our beliefs are justified then so are their beliefs, and if their beliefs are not justified then our beliefs aren’t justified. This intuition reflects the key internalist claim that two individuals that are alike mentally are alike with respect to justification. There’s no difference in justification unless there’s some relevant mental difference. Externalists are committed to denying this symmetry. Since the individuals in the Matrix world fail to meet the relevant external condition their beliefs are unjustified, but since our beliefs meet the external condition our beliefs are justified.

The Externalist Response

Both the Norman case and the new evil demon problem have led to significant modifications to externalism. At a very general level the basic externalist move is that relative to our world Norman’s belief is unjustified and an individual’s belief in the Matrix world is justified. In our world clairvoyance is not a reliable belief-forming method. A clairvoyant’s belief that, for example, today is their lucky day is not caused by the relevant fact. Furthermore, a clairvoyant’s belief is not objectively likely to be true. The externalist thinks that justification tracks these actual facts and so accordingly our judgment of Norman’s belief is that it is unjustified.

Similarly in the new evil demon problem justification tracks the actual facts. Since our perceptual beliefs meet the external condition they are justified. When we consider possible individuals with the same perceptual evidence that we have, we rightly consider their beliefs justified. Granted that their beliefs do not meet the external condition in that world, but in our world such beliefs do meet the external condition.

Alvin Goldman (1993) develops this externalist response to the Norman case. Goldman argues that Norman’s belief is not justified because relative to our list of epistemic virtues and vices clairvoyant beliefs are unjustified. Goldman argues that justification is relative to actual intellectual virtues, where the virtues are understood in a reliabilist fashion. This is a departure from Goldman’s earlier view in which the reliability of a belief forming process in a world determined the justificatory status of the belief. On that view Goldman is saddled with the consequence that Norman’s beliefs is justified and the beliefs of the people in the Matrix world are unjustified. On his (1993) view a belief’s justification is determined by the reliability of processes in our world. Goldman is not saddled with those counterintuitive results but can instead maintain the internalist’s intuition without surrendering externalism. For other instances of this relativization move see Sosa (1991a) and Bergmann (2006).

3. Reasons for Externalism

The following is an examination of three prominent reasons for externalism—the argument from the truth connection, the argument from ordinary knowledge ascriptions, and the argument from the implausibility of radical skepticism. Also included are the main internalist responses.

a. The Truth Connection

A very powerful argument for externalism is that epistemic justification is essentially connected to truth. Epistemic justification differs from prudential or moral justification. One can be prudentially justified in believing that one’s close friend is a good chap. One is prudentially justified in believing that this is true. But it’s possible that one has good epistemic reasons for withholding this belief. So one is not epistemically justified in believing one’s close friend is a good fellow. How should we account for this difference between prudential and epistemic justification? The natural response is to hold that epistemic justification implies that one’s belief is objectively likely to be true whereas prudential justification (or other non-epistemic forms of justification) does not. However, whether one’s belief is objectively likely to be true is not determined by one’s mental states or one’s reflectively accessible states. The objective likelihood of a belief given a body of evidence is a matter of the strength of correlation in the actual world between the truth of the belief and the body of evidence. If one applies some liquid to a litmus paper and it turns red then the objective likelihood that the liquid is acidic is very high. But the strong correlation between red litmus paper and acidity is not reflectively accessible. So, if epistemic justification implies that one’s belief is objectively likely to be true then justification is not determined entirely by one’s internal states.

Internalist Response

Internalists argue that the problem of the truth connection is a problem for everyone. Epistemic justification is essentially connected to the truth in a way that distinguishes it from, say, prudential justification. But it is exceedingly difficult to note exactly what this connection consists of. Internalists stress that the proposed externalist solution that epistemic justification raises a belief’s objective likelihood of truth isn’t as straightforward as it first appears. The intuition in the new evil demon problem illustrates that epistemic justification does not imply that one’s belief is objectively likely to be true. So to generate an argument against internalism from the truth connection one needs to do more than appeal to the intuition of a strong connection between justification and truth. The problem of the truth connection for internalism is an active area of research. See Lehrer & Cohen (1983) for the original discussion of this problem.

b. Grandma, Timmy and Lassie

One of the most powerful motivations for externalism is that we correctly attribute knowledge to unsophisticated persons, children, and some animals. These individuals, though, lack internalist justification. So either knowledge doesn’t require justification or justification should be understood externally. Grandma knows that she has hands even though she can not rehearse an argument for that conclusion and can not even think of anything else to defend the claim that she does have hands. Timmy knows that it’s a sunny day and Lassie knows that there’s water in the bowl. In each case it appears that the subject is justified but lacks any internally accessible reason for the belief. Reflection on these cases, and many others like them, supports the externalist central contention that internalism is too strong. Persons can know without possessing internalistic justification.

The main problem with appeal to cases like Grandma, Timmy, and Lassie is that the details of such cases are open to interpretation. Internalists argue that when the cases are properly unpacked either these are not cases of justification or there is internalist justification (see “Internalist Response” immediately below). In an attempt to strengthen the argument for externalism some externalists appeal to non-standard cases. One non-standard case is the chicken-sexer case. Chicken-sexers are individuals that possess the unique ability to reliably sort male from female chickens. As the case is described chicken-sexers do not know how they sort the chickens. They report not being able to offer the criteria they use to sort the chickens. Nonetheless they are very good at sorting chickens and their beliefs that this is a male, this is a female, etc., are justified even though they lack internalist justification.

Another non-standard case is the case of quiz-show knowledge. The case envisions a contestant, call her Sally, on a popular quiz show that gets all the answers right. When a clue is offered Sally rings in with the correct answer. She’s quite good at this. Intuitively Sally knows the answers to the clues; yet from Sally’s perspective the answers just pop into her head. Moreover, Sally may believe that she does not know the answer.

What should we say about this case? Sally is very reliable. Her answers are objectively likely to be true. We can fill out the case by stipulating her answers are caused in part by the relevant fact. She learned the answer either by direct experience with the relevant fact—she was in Tiananmen Square during the famous protests of 1989—or through a reliable informant. Yet Sally lacks any internal phenomenology usually associated with remembering an answer. The answers just seem to come out of the blue. Moreover, Sally doesn’t take herself to know the answer. Yet given her excellent track record it certainly seems right to say that Sally knows the answer. This is a problematic case for internalists because it appears that no relevant internal condition is present.

Internalist Response

The argument advanced by externalists above is a conjunction of two claims: (i) these individuals have knowledge and (ii) no internalist justification is present. In the cases of Grandma, Timmy, and Lassie one response is to deny that these individuals have knowledge, but that strikes many as incredibly implausible and too concessive to skeptical worries. A much more plausible response is to argue that an internalist justification is present. In the case of Grandma, for instance, she has experiences and memories which attest that she had hands. Though she doesn’t cite that as a reason, it is nonetheless a good reason for her to believe that she has hands. Similar points can be made with respect to Timmy and Lassie. To the extent that our judgments that Timmy and Lassie have knowledge are resilient we can find appropriate experiences that indicate the truth of their beliefs.

In the chicken-sexer case internalists respond by either denying that the subject has knowledge or claiming that there are features of the chicken-sexer’s experience that indicate the sex of the chicken. The quiz-show case is more interesting. Given the description of the case it’s difficult to find a reason available to Sally that will meet internalist strictures. The options for the internalists seem limited. Since it’s not plausible that there’s a relevant internalist justification present, internalists are saddled with the result that Sally lacks knowledge. How plausible is this result? Richard Feldman (2005a) argues that it’s not apparent from the case that (for example) Sally even believes the answer. Sally is encouraged to answer and she goes with whatever pops in her head. Moreover, Feldman observes, the contestant seems to lack any stable belief forming mechanism. Since knowledge entails belief it appears then that Sally lacks knowledge because she lacks belief. Furthermore, as another option, since Sally may take herself not to know the answer she possesses a reason that undermines her knowledge (see Feldman (2005a) for the role of higher-order knowledge to defeat object-knowledge). The upshot is that the case of quiz show knowledge is indecisive against internalism: either Sally lacks the relevant belief or she possesses a reason that defeats her knowledge.

c. The Scandal of Skepticism

Another main motivation for externalism is its alleged virtues for handling skepticism in at least some of its varieties. One powerful skeptical argument begins with the premise that we lack direct access to facts about the external world. For any experiential justification we have for believing some fact about the external world—for example, there’s a magnolia tree—it’s possible to have that same justification even though there’s no such fact. The experience one has is caused by a state of one’s brain and it is possible that science could develop a method to induce in one that brain state even though there are no magnolia trees for hundreds of miles. The skeptic continues to argue that since we lack direct access to facts about the external world we lack non-inferential knowledge (or justification) for believing those facts. The final step of the skeptic’s argument is that we do lack sufficient evidence for inferential knowledge (or inferential justification) for believing those facts. Here the skeptic argues that the evidence we possess for external world beliefs does not adequately favor commonsense over a skeptical thesis. Any appeal to experiential evidence will not decide the case against the skeptic and the skeptic is happy to enter the fray over whether commonsense beats skepticism with regard to the theoretical virtues, for example, coherence and simplicity. Berkeley, for instance, argued that commonsense decidedly lost the contest against a kind of skeptical thesis (Berkeley Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous).

Internalists find this kind of argument very difficult to rebut. Internalists tend to focus on the final step and argue that even though experience does not imply that skepticism is false it nevertheless makes skepticism much less probable than commonsense. This response is intuitive but it brings with it a number of controversial commitments. The ensuing debate is too complex to summarize here. The upshot though is that it is no easy task to maintain this intuitive response. Consequently externalists think they have a distinct advantage over internalism. Externalists tend to think internalism lands in skepticism but that we have good reason to suspect skepticism is false. Externalists eagerly point out that their view can handle the skeptical challenge.

Externalists typically address the skeptic’s argument by denying that lack of direct access with a fact implies lack of non-inferential knowledge (or justification). In terms of an early version of externalism—D.M. Armstrong’s causal theory (Armstrong 1973)—if one’s perceptual belief that p is caused by the fact that makes it true then one knows that p. Other externalists unpack the externalist condition differently (for example, reliability or truth-tracking), but the core idea is that a lack of direct access doesn’t preclude non-inferential knowledge. Externalists press this virtue against internalist views that are saddled with the claim that lack of direct access implies no non-inferential knowledge (or justification). Assuming that the first and final steps of the skeptical argument are good (a very controversial assumption), internalism would imply that we lack knowledge. Externalists thus see their analysis of knowledge as aligning with commonsense (and against the skeptic) that we possess lots of knowledge.

Internalist Response

One internalist response to this reason for favoring externalism is to challenge the claim that internalism lands in skepticism. Some internalists develop views that imply one does have direct access to external world facts (see entry on direct realism). Another internalist move is the abductivist response which challenges the claim that we lack inferential knowledge or justification for believing commonsense. The abductivist response gets its name from Charles Sanders Peirce’s description of abduction as a good form of inductive reasoning that differs from standard inductive inference (for example, enumerative induction—this swam is white, so is the next one, so is this one as well, …, so, the general rule that all swans are white). The abductivists argues, to put it very roughly, that commonsense is the best explanation of the available data that we possess. Accordingly, we do possess inferential justification for believing that skepticism is false.

A different response to this alleged virtue of externalism is to argue that externalism yields only a conditional response to skepticism. If externalists maintain that some external condition, E, is sufficient for non-inferential knowledge or justification then we get the result that if E then one has non-inferential knowledge. For instance, if, for example, perception is reliable then we have perceptual knowledge. But, the internalist argues, we are not able to derive the unconditional claim that we have perceptual knowledge. In order to conclude that we would have to know that E obtains, but it seems all the externalist can do is appeal to some other external condition, E1, and argue that if E1 then we know that E obtains. This strategy looks unpromising (see Stroud 1989).

4. The Significance of the I-E Debate

What is the I-E debate all about? Why has the debate garnered so much attention? This section considers several proposals about the significance of the I-E debate. Most everyone sees the I-E debate as metaepistemological. The I-E debate concerns fundamental questions about epistemology: what is nature and goals of epistemological theorizing. The three proposals I examine in this section need not be exclusive. Each proposal reflects facets of the I-E debate.

a. Disagreement over the Significance of the Thermometer Model

D.M. Armstrong introduced the “thermometer model” in epistemology as a way of grasping his externalist theory (see Armstrong 1973). The “thermometer model” compares non-inferential knowledge with a good thermometer. A good thermometer reliably indicates the temperature, that is, the temperature readings reliably indicate the actual temperature. In a similar manner non-inferential knowledge is a matter of a belief being reliably true. On the thermometer model a belief that is reliably true need not meet any internalist conditions; if the belief stands in the right relation to the truth of what is believed then the belief is an item of knowledge.

The significance of the thermometer model is whether one should understand non-inferential knowledge purely in terms of external conditions. The driving motivation behind this model is that non-inferential knowledge should be understood in just the same naturalistic sense in which one understands a good thermometer. The model aims to remove questions about non-inferential knowledge from what might be called a rationalist framework in which all forms of knowledge are explicated in terms of reasons. Given the rationalist approach to noninferential knowledge one looks for some fact, different from the original belief, that one is aware of and that makes probable (or certain) the truth of one’s belief. The thermometer model cuts to the heart of this rationalistic project.

It is not at all surprising that the thermometer model met heavy resistance. Laurence BonJour argued that stress on the thermometer model would imply that Norman knows that the president is in New York. BonJour observes that the thermometer model has us view epistemic agents merely as “cognitive thermometers”. If they reliably record the facts then they have noninferential knowledge even though from their own perspective their beliefs have little by way of positive support.

The metaepistemological issue about what to make of the thermometer model is closely related to the issue of what to make of ordinary knowledge ascriptions. It is a common practice to ascribe knowledge to individuals that are in many respects like reliable thermometers. The significant question is what to make of this fact. Do such individuals meet internalistic conditions? Are our ascriptions of knowledge correct in cases in which individuals don’t meet any internalistic conditions? These are areas of ongoing research. The issues here are discussed in the contextualism literature.

b. Disagreement over the Guiding Conception of Justification

Another way to view the I-E debate is a disagreement over the guiding conception of justification. Alvin Goldman (1980) distinguishes between the regulative and theoretical conceptions of justification. The regulative conception of justification takes as its aim to offer practical advice to cognizers in order to improve their stock of beliefs. This epistemological aim, Goldman notes, is prominent in Descartes. The theoretical conception, by contrast, aims to offer a correct analysis of justification, that is, to specify the features of beliefs that confer epistemic status. Goldman sees our interest in a theory of justification as driven by these two different conceptions.

One way of explaining the significance of the I-E debate is over the role of regulative considerations in an account of justification. The access internalist can be seen as stressing the significance of some regulative conditions for a correct account of justification. This is most clearly seen in the stress on the ethics of belief. If a subject’s belief is justified then, in some sense, the subject has regulated her doxastic conduct appropriately. Externalists, by contrast, want to draw a sharp distinction between regulative and theoretical considerations to get the result that regulative considerations do not enter into one’s account of the nature of justification.

c. Disagreement over Naturalism in Epistemology

Another proposal about the significance of the I-E debate is that it is over the issue of whether to “naturalize” epistemology (see, for instance, Fumerton 1995, p. 66). As we saw above with the “thermometer model” a thread that runs through externalist analyses is the idea that epistemic concepts—justification, evidence, and knowledge—can be understood in terms of nomological concepts. Armstrong’s account of noninferential knowledge invokes the idea of a natural relation that holds between a belief and the true state of affairs believed. When a belief stands in this natural relation to the true state of affairs believed then the belief is an instance of noninferential knowledge. Moreover this natural relation is similar to the relation between a thermometer reading and the actual temperature in a good thermometer. Other externalist analysis invoke different nomological concepts: Goldman’s (1979) account makes use of the idea of reliability; Robert Nozick’s (1981) account appeals to the idea of truth-tracking which he unpacks in terms of causal concepts; and Fred Dretske’s (1981) account makes use of a naturalistic concept of information processing.

It’s important to stress the context in which these externalist accounts arose. As we have seen the recognition that the traditional justified true belief (JTB) account of knowledge failed led epistemologists to rethink the connection between true belief and knowledge. It is widely recognized that the traditional JTB account was largely explicated within a rationalist understanding of justification. Justification, on this tradition, invoked concepts such as implication, consistency, coherence, and more broadly, reasons of which the subject was aware. The introduction of the Gettier problem led epistemologists to question whether this traditional assumption was correct. Externalist analyses attempted to explain how natural relations like causation and reliability could provide the key to understanding noninferential knowledge.

Internalists, by contrast, stress the significance of mental concepts to understanding noninferential knowledge or basic justification. These concepts need not be irreducible to physical concepts. But the key idea for internalism is that mere external facts which a subject lacks awareness of are not sufficient for analyzing epistemic concepts. As Fumerton stresses (Fumerton (1995) p. 67) the key epistemic concepts for internalist are concepts like Descartes’ clarity and distinctness, Russell’s notion of direct acquaintance, or—more elusively—Chisholm’s basic notion of more reasonable than.

There are wide ranging issues with respect to naturalism in epistemology. One main issue is whether the evidential relation is contingent or necessary. Internalism can be understood as the view that the most basic evidential relation is necessary and consequently the theory of evidence is an a priori matter. Externalism, by contrast, can be understood as affirming that evidential relations are contingent (see, for example, Nozick (1981) Chapter 3 section III).

Another issue with respect to naturalism in epistemology is its connection to naturalism in the philosophy of mind. The naturalist aims to understand the mind as a physical system. Since physical systems can be explained without invoking mental concepts a naturalist in epistemology is weary of using questionable mental concepts to elucidate the nature of epistemic concepts. Internalism in epistemology is not necessarily at odds with naturalism as a metaphysical view but the internalist’s preferred concepts tend to come from commonsense psychology rather than the natural sciences. Externalists, by contrast, tend to stress natural concepts like causation, reliability, and tracking because these set up better for a naturalist view in the philosophy of mind.

5. Conclusion

The I-E debate develops out of the ruins of the traditional justified true belief account of knowledge. As Edmund Gettier famously illustrated knowledge is more than justified true belief. Attempts to answer the Gettier problem generated the I-E debate. This debate centers on a diverse group of issues: the significance of ordinary knowledge attributions, the nature of rationality, the ethics of belief, and the role of naturalism in epistemology.

See also “Internalism and Externalism in Mind and Language.”

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. 1983. “What’s Wrong with Immediate Knowledge?” Synthese 55, 73-95.
  • Alston, W. 1986. “Internalism and Externalism in Epistemology.” Philosophical Topics 14, 179-221.
  • Alston, W. 1988. “An Internalist Externalism.” Synthese 74, 265-283.
  • Alston, W. 1995. “How to think about Reliability” Philosophical Topics 23, 1-29.
  • Alston, W. 2005. Beyond “Justification”: Dimensions of Epistemic Evaluation. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Armstrong, D.M. 1973. Belief, Truth and Knowledge. New York: Cambridge.
  • Bergmann, M. 2006. Justification without Awareness. New York: Oxford.
  • BonJour, L. 1980. “Externalist Theories of Empirical Knowledge,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 5, 53-73.
  • Reprinted in Kornblith 2001. Page references are to the Kornblith reprint.
  • BonJour, L. 1985. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Chisholm, R. 1988. “The Indispensability of Internal Justification.” Synthese 74:3, 285-296.
  • Cohen, S. 1984. “Justification and Truth.” Philosophical Studies 46, 279-295.
  • Conee, E., and R. Feldman. 2004a. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. New York: Oxford.
  • Conee, E., and R. Feldman. 2004b. “Internalism Defended” in Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. New York: Oxford, 53-82.
  • Dretske, F. 1971. “Conclusive Reasons,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 49, 1-22.
  • Dretske, F. 1981. Knowledge and the Flow of Information. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Feldman, R. 2004a. “In Search of Internalism and Externalism.” The Externalist Challenge, ed. Richard Schantz. New York: Walter de Gruyter. pp. 143-156.
  • Feldman, R. 2004b. “Having Evidence.” in Conee & Feldman, Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. New York: Oxford, 219-241.
  • Feldman, R. 2005a. “Respecting the Evidence.” Philosophical Perspectives 19, 95-119.
  • Feldman, R. 2005b. “Justification is Internal.” Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. eds. Matthias Steup and Ernest Sosa. Malden, MA: Blackwell. pp. 270-284.
  • Foley, R. 1993. “What Am I to Believe?” in S. Wagner and R. Warner, eds. Naturalism: A Critical Appraisal. University of Notre Dame Press, 147-162.
  • Fumerton, R. 1988. “The Internalism/Externalism Controversy.” Philosophical Perspectives 2, 443-459.
  • Fumerton, R. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Fumerton, R. 2004. “Inferential Internalism and the Presuppositions of Skeptical Arguments.” in The Externalist Challenge, ed. Richard Schantz. New York: Walter de Gruyter. pp.157-167.
  • Fumerton, R. 2006. “Epistemic Internalism, Philosophical Assurance and the Skeptical Predicament.” in Knowledge and Reality: Essays in honor of Alvin Plantinga, pp. 179-191.
  • Gettier, E. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23: 121-3
  • Goldman, A. 1967. “A Causal Theory of Knowing.” The Journal of Philosophy 64, 357-372.
  • Goldman, A. 1979. “What is Justified Belief?” in Justification and Knowledge ed. G.S. Pappas. Dordrecht: D. Reidel. 1-23.
  • Goldman, A. 1980. “The Internalist Conception of Justification,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 5, 27-51.
  • Goldman, A. 1993. “Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology,” Philosophical Issues 3, 271-285.
  • Goldman, A. 1999. “Internalism Exposed.” Journal of Philosophy 96, 271-93.
  • Kornblith, H. 1988. “How Internal Can You Get?” Synthese 74, 313-27.
  • Kornblith, H. (Ed.) 2001. Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Lehrer, K. and S. Cohen. 1983. “Justification, Truth, and Coherence.” Synthese 55, 191-207.
  • Nozick, R. 1981. Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press.
  • Plantinga, A. 1993. Warrant: The Current Debate. New York: Oxford.
  • Sosa, E. 1991a. “Reliabilism and intellectual virtue” in Knowledge in Perspective: Selected Essays in Epistemology. New York: Cambridge University Press, 131-145.
  • Sosa, E. 1991b. “Knowledge and intellectual virtue” in Knowledge in Perspective: Selected Essays in Epistemology. New York: Cambridge University Press, 225-244.
  • Sosa and BonJour, L. 2003. Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Steup, M. 1999. “A Defense of Internalism.” in The Theory of Knowledge: Classical and Contemporary Readings, 2nd ed. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 373-84.
  • Steup, M. 2001. “Epistemic Duty, Evidence, and Internality.” in Knowledge, Truth, and Duty. ed. M. Steup. New York: Oxford.
  • Stroud, B. 1989. “Understanding Human Knowledge in General,” in M. Clay and K. Lehrer, eds., Knowledge and Skepticism. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Stroud, B. 1994. “Scepticism, ‘Externalism’, and the Goal of Epistemology,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 68: 291-307.

Author Information

Ted Poston
Email: poston “at” jaguar1 “dot” usouthal “dot” edu
University of South Alabama
U. S. A.

Last updated: April 26, 2008 | Originally published: