When we think about a piano, something in our thoughts picks out a piano. When we talk about cigars, something in our speech refers to cigars. The picking out, referring to, or being about things when we think and speak, is intentionality. In a word, intentionality is aboutness.

Many mental states exhibit intentionality. If I believe that the weather is rainy today, this belief of mine is about today’s weather, and my belief that it is rainy. Desires are similarly directed at, or about things: if I desire a mosquito to buzz off, my desire is directed at the mosquito, and the possibility that it depart. Imaginings seem to be directed at particular imaginary scenarios, while regrets are directed at events or objects in the past, as are memories. And perceptions seem to be, similarly, directed at or about the objects we perceptually encounter in our environment. We call mental states that are directed at things in this way ‘intentional states’.

The major role played by intentionality in affairs of the mind led Brentano (1884) to regard intentionality as “the mark of the mental”; a necessary and sufficient condition for mentality. But some non-mental phenomena seem to display intentionality too–pictures, signposts, and words, for example. Nevertheless, the intentionality of these phenomena seems to be derived from the intentionality of the mind that produces them. A sound is only a word if it has been conferred with meaning by the intentions of a speaker or perhaps a community of speakers; while a painting, however abstract, seems only to have a subject matter insofar as its painter intends it to. Whether or not all mental phenomena are intentional, then, it certainly seems to be the case that all intentional phenomena are mental in origin.

The root of the word ‘intentional’ reflects the notion that it expresses, deriving from the Latin intentio, meaning ‘directed at’. Intentionality has been studied since antiquity and has generated numerous debates that can be broadly categorized into three areas that are discussed in the following sections:

Section 1 concerns the intentional relation: the relation between intentional states and their objects. Here we aim to answer the question “What determines why any given intentional state is about one thing and not another?” For example, what makes a thought about a sheep about that sheep? Does the thought look like the sheep? Or does it perhaps have a causal origin in an encounter with the sheep?

Section 2 explores the nature of the objects of intentional states. Are these objects independent of us, or somehow constituted by the nature of our minds? Do they have to exist, or can we have thoughts about non-existent objects like The Grinch?

Section 3 explores the nature of intentional states themselves. For example, are intentional states essentially rational states, such that only rational creatures can have them? Or might intentional states be necessarily conscious states? And is it possible to give a naturalized theory of intentionality that appeals only to facts describable in the natural sciences?

This article explores these questions, and the dominant theories that have been designed to answer them.

Table of Contents

  1. The Intentional Relation
    1. Formal Theories of Intentionality
    2. Problems for Forms, and the Causal Alternative
  2. Intentional Objects
    1. Intentional Inexistence
    2. Thinking About Things that Do Not Exist
    3. Direct versus Indirect Intentionality
  3. Intentional States
    1. Intentionality and Reason
    2. Intentionality and Intensionality
    3. Intentionality and Consciousness
    4. Naturalizing Intentionality
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Intentional Relation

When thinking about horses, what is it about this thought that makes it about horses and not, say, sheep? That is, in what relation do intentional states stand to their objects? This is an alternative phrasing of the same question “What is the intentional relation?” There have been many answers proposed to this question, and a broad division can be discerned in the history of philosophy between what can be called ‘formal’ and ‘causal’ theories.

a. Formal Theories of Intentionality

One answer to the question is that mental states refer to the things that they do because of the intrinsic features of those mental states. The earliest version of this theory is based on Plato’s theory of forms. Plato held that apart from the matter (hyle) they are composed of, all things have another aspect, which he called their ‘form’ (morphê). All horses, for example, although individually made of different material, have something in common–and this is their form. The exact meaning of Plato’s ‘form’ is a controversial issue. On one reading, two things have the same form or are ‘conformal’ if they share the same shape; on a broader interpretation, two things are conformal if there is a one-to-one mapping between the essential features of the two–as there is between a building and an architect’s blueprint for the building. Plato held that when we think about an object, we have the form of the object in our mind, so that our thought literally shares the form of the object. Aristotle further developed this theory, arguing that in perception (sensu) the form of an object perceived is transmitted from the object to the mind of the perceiver. In the Middle Ages Thomas Aquinas defended and elaborated Aristotle’s theory, and in the Early Modern period the theory finds an heir in the work of the ‘British Empiricists’ Locke and Hume. Locke and Hume argued that ‘ideas’, which they considered to be the fundamental components of thought, refer to their objects because they are images of those objects, impressed on the mind through the action of the perceptual faculties.

Although images or shapes may play a role in thought, it is generally accepted that they cannot provide a complete account of intentionality. The relation between an image and its object is a relation of resemblance. But this presents a difficulty that was first raised against the formal theory by Ockham in the Middle Ages (King, 2007). The problem is that the relation of resemblance is ambiguous in a way that the intentional relation cannot be. An image of a man walking up a hill also resembles a man walking backwards down a hill (Wittgenstein, 1953), whereas a thought about a man walking up a hill is not also a thought about a man walking backwards down a hill. Similarly, while an image of Mahatma Gandhi resembles Mahatma Gandhi, it also resembles everyone who resembles Mahatma Gandhi (Goodman, 1976). Thoughts about Mahatma Gandhi on the other hand, are not thoughts about everyone who looks like Mahatma Gandhi.

An alternative formal model that seems to avoid this problem appeals to the use of descriptions (Frege 1892, Russell 1912). This view holds that when thinking about something, the thinker must have in mind a description that uniquely identifies that thing. Descriptions seem to avoid the problem of ambiguity faced by images. There may be many people who resemble Mahatma Gandhi, but probably only one person that satisfies the description ‘the Indian Nationalist leader assassinated on the 30th of January 1948’. Since the ‘descriptivist’ account takes concepts to refer to their objects by describing them, with the features of a concept somehow corresponding to the features of its object, the descriptivist theory is arguably also a formal theory of intentionality.

In addition to answering the question why an intentional state refers to one object and not another, the formal approach is also helpful in explaining how thinkers understand what it is they are thinking about. One thing that we seem to be able to do when we have mental states that are directed at particular objects is to reflect upon different aspects of those objects, reason about them, describe them, and even make reliable predictions about them. For example, if I understand what horses are, and what sheep are, I ought to be in a position to tell you about their differences, and perhaps make good predictions about their behavior. If intentional states are conformal with their objects, we have some explanation for such understanding being possible, since the form of the object the intentional state is directed at should be available to the thinker when reflecting upon their own thoughts.

There is another reason for expecting that thoughts have a formal component: Frege (1892) argued that it is rational to have multiple thoughts about the same object, without realizing that we are thinking about the same object. For example, the Ancient Greeks believed that Hesperus and Phosphorus were two distinct stars in the sky, one of which appeared in the morning and the other in the evening. In fact, the Ancient Greeks’ stars Hesperus and Phosphorus are the same object, the planet Venus, which changes from being visible after sunset to being visible before sunrise depending on its orbit around Earth. And so the Ancient Greeks held simultaneous yet contradictory beliefs about the same object, Venus, without realizing it.

Frege argued that our concepts must vary in more ways than in what they refer to. They also vary, he proposed, in what he called their ‘sense’, meaning that two concepts could refer to the same object while differing in sense. He described the sense as the ‘mode of presentation’ of the object that a concept picks out. It can be argued that by ‘mode of presentation’ he meant the object’s description: while the reference of the thinker’s hesperous and phosphorus concepts might be the same, their sense of Hesperous as ‘the star that appears in the evening’ and their sense of Phosphorous as ‘the star that appears in the morning’ would logically mean that they refer to different objects.

If intentional relation is held to be conformality it can be explained (i) why a thought refers to what it does, (ii) how we can have introspective knowledge of the things we think about, and (iii) how two or more of our concepts could pick out the same thing without our knowing. But there are problems facing the formal approach that have led others to investigate alternative explanations.

b. Problems for Forms, and the Causal Alternative

The formal theory of intentionality faces two major objections.

The first objection, sometimes called ‘the problem of ignorance and error’, is that the descriptions we have at our disposal of the objects we think about might be insufficient to uniquely identify those objects. Putnam (1975) articulated this objection using a thought-experiment. Suppose that you are thinking of water. For the descriptive theory to hold true, you must have at your disposal a description that uniquely distinguishes water from all other things. For most of us–chemists aside–such a description may amount to something like ‘the clear drinkable liquid in the rivers, lakes, and taps around here’. But suppose, suggests Putnam, that there is another planet far away from here that looks to its inhabitants just like Earth looks to us. On that planet, Twin-Earth, there is a clear drinkable liquid that the inhabitants of the planet refer to (coincidentally) as ‘water’, but is a different chemical substance from the water that is H2O on Earth; its chemical composition is XYZ. If this were true, we should expect that the description most people on Earth are in a position to give of water will be just the same as the description the inhabitants of the other planet give of XYZ. But, by hypothesis, when we think about water we are thinking of the substance on our planet, H2O, and when they think of what they call ‘water’, they are thinking of a different thing–XYZ. As a result, it would seem that descriptions are not sufficient to explain what we are thinking of, since a member of either of these inhabitant groups will give the same description for what they call ‘water’, even though their thoughts pick out different substances. This is the ‘ignorance’ component of ‘the problem of ignorance and error’; we do not always have enough descriptive knowledge of the objects we think about to uniquely identify them. The cases where beliefs held about things prove to be false explains the ‘error’ component of the problem. For example, many people believe tomatoes are vegetables when they are, in fact, fruit; as a result, the description they give of ‘tomato’ may include the claim that tomatoes are vegetables. If these people are indeed thinking of tomatoes, so the argument goes, it cannot be as a result of their being in possession of a description that picks out  tomatoes in the accurate sense of their being fruit.

The second difficulty for the formal accounts, specifically directed at the descriptive account, is that descriptions do not identify the essential nature of the things they pick out, whereas many words and concepts do (Searle 1958, Kripke 1980). The description someone might offer of Hesperus could be ‘the brightest celestial object in the evening sky’. But it is plausible to suppose that Hesperus could have existed without having been visible in the evening. It could have drifted into a different orbital pattern, or have been occluded by a belt of asteroids, and therefore never have been visible in the evening. This description does not, therefore, capture an essential feature of Hesperus. The term ‘Hesperus’ in our thoughts, on the other hand, does pick out an essential feature of Hesperus–being Hesperus. That this is an important difference can be seen when we realize that concepts and descriptions seem to behave differently in thoughts about counterfactual possibilities–or, alternative ways the world could have turned out. For example, the thought ‘Hesperus could have failed to have been the brightest celestial object in the evening sky’, is clearly true–this could have been the case had it drifted into a different orbital pattern. But the thought ‘Hesperus could have failed to have been Hesperus’, is not true: there is no way the world could have turned out such that Hesperus could have failed to have been itself. So now we have a further reason for thinking that concepts are not cognitively equivalent to descriptions–since they behave differently in thoughts about counterfactual possibility.

As an alternative to descriptions, images, or forms of any sort, Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1980) propose a ‘causal’ model of intentionality. Using this alternative model, our concepts do not have intrinsic formal features that determine what they refer to. Rather, a concept picks out the thing that originally caused it to occur in the mind of a thinker, or the thing it is causally related to in the mind-independent world. For example, if I have a concept that picks out horses, this concept must have initially been caused to occur in me by a physical encounter with horses. If I have a concept that picks out water, the concept must have been caused to occur in me by a causal interaction with water. And if I have a concept that picks out Hesperus, this concept must have a causal origin in my apprehension of Hesperus, perhaps as it appeared as the brightest planet in the evening sky.

We can see how the causal theory could be used to address two major objections to the formal theory. Firstly, on the causal account, the ‘water’ thoughts of those on Earth can be distinguished from the ‘water’ thoughts of those on Twin-Earth: the substance Earthlings are interacting with when they have ‘water’ thoughts is H2O, while the substance that Twin-Earthlings are interacting with is XYZ–explaining why the thoughts of each thinker refer to different things, even though the descriptions they might offer of those things are identical. Similarly, I can causally interact with water, or tomatoes, even if I have false beliefs about these things, so the causal model allows that the descriptions I might offer of the things I think about can be false. Secondly, if we reject the claim that the term ‘Hesperus’ as it appears in my thoughts is cognitively equivalent to a description, we have avoided the concern that the description does not identify an essential property of the object.

However, the causal model has trouble explaining some of the things the formal model was designed to explain (see last paragraph of Section 1a above). Firstly, the causal model has trouble explaining ii), how we can reflect on the objects of our thoughts, and say something about them. If concepts have no formal component that somehow describes their objects this becomes mysterious. The causal model also fails to explain iii), how we can have multiple thoughts about the same thing without realizing. While formal models can explain this by holding that different concepts can be cognitively equivalent to different descriptions of the same thing, the causal model has trouble explaining this. Since the thoughts of an Ancient Greek about hesperus, and the thoughts of an Ancient Greek about phosphorous have a causal origin in the same object, namely Venus, the causal relation that stands between these concepts and their object is identical in each case; logically there ought to be no difference between the concepts on the causal model.

It can be argued that the formal and causal models each provide plausible explanations for single, different, sets of phenomena, but can be viewed as flawed when applied to other sets.

The ‘two-dimensional’ accounts of intentionality (Searle 1983, Chalmers 1996, 2006, Lewis 1997, Jackson 1998) was proposed as a theory that draws on aspects of both the formal and causal models. Using this approach, although it is necessary to know what environment a thinker is causally connected to in order to know what her thoughts refer to, this need not rule out that her concepts also have a formal component. The trick is to find a formal component that does not run into the problems raised by the causal theorist. To deal with the problem of error, for example, it has been proposed that the formal component of a concept might be a description of the appearances of the object the concept refers to (Searle 1983). Although the thinker may be wrong that the things her tomato concept picks out are vegetables, it would seem that she cannot be mistaken that they are apparently red shiny edible objects–since she cannot be wrong about how the world appears to her. Such content would therefore avoid the problem of error–these descriptions could not turn out to be false. To deal with the problem of ignorance, where her descriptive knowledge fails to uniquely determine which thing she is thinking of, it has been proposed to write the causal origin of her experience into the formal component. So, as an inhabitant of Earth, my concept water might be cognitively equivalent not just to ‘the apparently clear drinkable liquid in the lakes and rivers’, which fails to distinguish the water on Earth from the water on Twin-Earth, but to “the stuff causing my current experiences of an apparently drinkable liquid in the lakes and rivers” (Searle 1983). This description, it would seem, does indeed distinguish water from Twin-Earth water, since only water is the causal source of my experiences (because I am on Earth, not Twin-Earth). And to get descriptions to behave the same way as concepts in thoughts about counterfactual possibility, it has been proposed to include the specification ‘actual’ in the descriptive content of a concept (Davies and Humberstone 1980). Although it is true that ‘the brightest celestial object in the evening sky could have failed to have been Hesperus’, it seems not to be true that ‘the actual thing that is the brightest celestial object in the evening sky could have failed to have been Hesperus’. By including ‘actual’ in the description, we can therefore get the description to behave in the same way as the concept in counterfactual thoughts. In sum, the descriptive content of a concept like water may be expressed as ‘the actual stuff causing my current experience of an apparently clearly drinkable liquid in the lakes and rivers’. This ‘two-dimensional’ accounts of intentionality, conceived to account for the phenomena that formal models explain without running into the objections raised by causal theorists about earlier formal accounts, led to additional defense of the causal approach (Soames 2001, 2005 and Recanati, 2013) as part of a debate also discussed by Chalmers (2006).

2. Intentional Objects

Having considered the debate about what determines the object of any intentional state, we can now consider issues that arise when we consider the objects themselves. Do they all have something in common that makes them appropriate as objects of intentional states? Might there be non-existent intentional objects? Do our thoughts connect directly with these objects or only indirectly, via our senses?

a. Intentional Inexistence

Franz Brentano set the tone for much of the debate over intentionality in the 20th century. One of his claims was that the objects of intentional states have a special type of existence, which he termed ‘intentional inexistence’; one interpretation of this term is that intentional objects have a special sort of existence as objects of intentions.

This idea had a particularly strong influence on the work of Edmund Husserl, who founded a branch of philosophy of mind known as phenomenology. Husserl proposed that the objects of thought must have particular characteristics, for example in the mind of the thinker they must be coherently linked with other concepts and ideas (a feature he refers to as their ‘noematic’ character). If our ideas of the objects we encounter in experience conflict too severely with the constraints that our understanding of how the world works imposes on the character of our experience, those ideas will disintegrate in a ‘noematic explosion’. An example of a neomatic explosion is the optical illusion: if we are presented with an object that appears to be a cube sitting on a flat surface, we will approach the object with certain expectations, for example that if we turn our heads to one side we will see the side of the cube now out of view, if we grab hold of it our grasp will be resisted, and so on. If the object is subsequently discovered to be an image painted in such a way that it only appears as a cube from a certain angle, our current concept of the object as a solid form will disintegrate. It is in this sense that Husserl at least took the objects of thought to have a special sort of existence as objects of thought (Føllesdal 1992, Mooney 2010).

Husserl (1900) proposed that we can study the nature of the constraints that the character of our mind places on the possible objects of thought through a method he calls ‘phenomenological reduction’, which involves uncovering the conditions of our awareness of objects through reflection on the most general features of experience. The approach inherits a great deal from Kant’s transcendental idealism, since in both cases the thinker is required to recognize that his mind may impose a very specific character on objects as he encounters them in experience–a character that cannot be assumed to have been imposed on his experience by facts about the external world.

b. Thinking About Things that Do Not Exist

Another interpretation of Brentano’s claim that objects of intentional states have an intentional inexistence is that intentional objects do not exist.

It can be argued that many objects of thought are indeed non-existent, for example characters from literary works of fiction (The Grinch, Sherlock Holmes), whilst other objects may or may not be non-existent depending on the thinker’s beliefs, for example Faeries, and Hell.

But deep puzzles arise when we consider what it means to say something about a non-existent object. Can we, for example, coherently state that Santa Claus has flying reindeer? If he does not exist, how can it be true that he has flying reindeer?  Can we indeed even coherently state that Santa Claus does not exist? If he does exist, our statement is false. But if he does not exist, then it seems that our claim is not about anything–and hence apparently meaningless. Another way of putting the puzzle involves the use of definite descriptions. It seems reasonable to make the following statement:

(1)     The fairy king does not exist

But, upon further consideration, statement (1) is quite puzzling, because the appearance of the definite article ‘the’ in that statement seems to presuppose that there is such a thing as the fairy king to which we refer.

Russell proposed a two-step approach to solving this puzzle which involves analyzing definite descriptions to show how we can use these to express claims about things that do not exist, and then demonstrating that most terms we use to make negative existential claims are actually definite descriptions in disguise.

The first step is accomplished by Russell’s analysis of the logical structure of definite descriptions. He takes definite descriptions to have the logical form ‘a unique thing that has the properties F and G’. For example, from statement (1) above, the definite description ‘the fairy king’ on Russell’s reading is logically equivalent to the description ‘a unique thing that is both a king and a fairy’. This eliminates the term ‘the’ from the description and with it the presupposition that there is a fairy king. Using Russell’s approach, statement (1) above is the logical equivalent to:

(2)     There is no unique thing that is a king and a fairy

Having now given clarity to the definition of the claim and its objects, the claim can now be evaluated as true if no unique thing exists that is both a king and a fairy, or false if there is a unique thing that is a king and a fairy.

The second step of Russell’s approach is to hold that most referring terms in ordinary language are actually disguised definite descriptions; the term ‘Santa Claus’ could therefore be viewed as an alternative description for something else, perhaps ‘the man with the flying reindeer’. Following Russell’s methodology, the claim that ‘Santa Claus does not exist’ is equivalent to the denial that a unique individual that has the properties of being a man and having flying reindeer exists.

Are there any terms, in language or thought, on this account, that are not descriptions? Russell’s view is that the simplest terms in thought, from which definite descriptions are composed, are not descriptions but singular terms, whose meaning is simply the object they refer to. These are demonstrative terms like ‘that’ and ‘this’, and our concepts of sensible properties like colors, sounds and smells. The meaning of these terms are fixed by what Russell called ‘acquaintance’–they are conferred with meaning as a result of a direct interaction between the thinker and thing referred to, for example when we point at a color and simply think to ourselves ‘that color’. These terms are only meaningful if there are objects in the physical world to which they refer.

Russell’s view can therefore be seen as being inconsistent with an interpretation of Brentano’s claim that concludes that intentional objects do not exist.

c. Direct versus Indirect Intentionality

Even supposing that many objects of thought do exist, a further question arises as to whether the objects that we encounter in experience are products of our minds, or mind-independent objects. The view that the objects of experience are mind-dependent can be motivated by two complementary considerations. First, it seems reasonable to suppose that two different persons’ experiences in the same mind-independent environment can be different. A color-blind person and a person with perfect color vision might have visually very different experiences in the same environment. Conversely, it seems that one person’s experiences in two very different mind-independent environments could be the same, for example the visual experience of observing an oasis in the desert may be identical to the visual experience of observing a mirage, even though the environments are different.

These considerations have led many to argue that our experiences–even those of ordinary objects–are mediated by ‘sense data’. According to Sense-Data theory, what we immediately experience are not mind-independent objects, but sense data that are produced in part by our minds. This may allow us to explain the two puzzles considered above. If what we encounter in experience are sense data and not mind-independent objects, then two people could have very different experiences in the same mind-independent environment, and correlatively, one person could have two indistinguishable experiences in two very different mind-independent environments.

This ‘indirect’ theory of perception can result in questions being asked about our knowledge of the world.

If we take the view that a person only experiences the sense data, this would logically suggest that many of the beliefs widely held about the world around us are false, for example that an observer saw red ketchup when, in fact, the red color was part of the sense data that was experienced as a result of looking at the ketchup. It would similarly suggest that people have never had a direct experience with the world, for example never seen waterfalls, smelled flowers, or heard the voices of our friends, but have only experienced sense data of these things.

An early reply to these concerns was ‘naïve realism’, (Moore, 1903) which proposed that there are no sense data or any other kind of representations mediating our experiences of the objects around us. Critics of this response argue that it does not explain hallucinations or variations between different individuals’ experiences of the same objects.

Between the extremes of Sense-Data theory and naïve realism lies ‘disjunctivism’ (Hinton 1967, Snowdon 1981, McDowell 1994, Martin 2002). The disjunctivist holds that the argument for the indirect theory of perception based on hallucinations is fallacious. Although the experiences of the oasis and the mirage might well be indistinguishable for the subject of the experience, this need not imply that the experiences are really the same. Rather, since one experience is the product of an encounter with an oasis, and the other is not, there is a difference between the experiences–it is just one that the subject is unable to identify. As a result, the disjunctivist holds that when we have veridical experiences, we have direct encounters with objects in the world, and when we have hallucinations, what we experience are sense data produced by our mind.

3. Intentional States

Having considered the debates about what determines the object of any intentional state, and the nature of the objects of intentional states, we can now examine if there are broad conditions for a state to count as intentional in the first place. Are only rational creatures capable of intentional states? Are intentional states essentially conscious states? Can we provide an account of intentional states in natural terms?

a. Intentionality and Reason

The centrality of reason to the intentional is an important strand in Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason (1787), and has informed an influential line of thinking adopted in the works of Sellars (1956), Strawson (1959) and Brandom (1996). Kant argues that in the apprehension of any object, an individual must have a range of concepts at her disposal that she can use to rationally assess the nature of the object apprehended. In order to apprehend a material object, for example, a thinker must understand what causation is. If she does not understand what causation is, she will not understand that if the material object were to be pushed, it would move. Or if it were picked up and thrown against a wall, it would not go straight through the wall or disappear, but would be caused by the solidity of the wall to bounce backward.  Without having the capacity to understand any of these issues, Kant argued, it would not be true to say that an individual apprehends the material object. The appeal to the necessity of reason for concept-possession is often raised in conjunction with the claim that our intentional states are all interdependent. For example, since I cannot have the concept material object, without the concept cause, then the two concepts depend on one another–and this may be the case for all our concepts, leading to a view known as ‘concept holism’.

Critics of this view argue that if our concepts are interdependent in this way, then when one concept changes, all the other concepts change with it, that is to say if, for example, I can only comprehend the concept horse if I have the concept animal, then if my animal concept changes in some way, my horse concept will also change.

The logical conclusion of taking this view is that as a thinker’s day-to-day experience of the world progresses and their beliefs change, all their related concepts will change. For example,  although it might seem to me that I had thoughts about horses both yesterday and today, this would not be true since the concept that occurred in my thoughts yesterday would not be the same concept as occurred in my thoughts today.

‘Concept atomism’ is an alternative to viewpoint to concept holism, and holds that our concepts do not stand in essential relations to one another, but only in relation to the external objects to which they refer (Fodor and Lepore 1992). The concept holist counterargument is that it is impossible to possess the concept horse without having the concept animal.

b. Intentionality and Intensionality

Another feature of intentional states that is sometimes thought to be essential is ‘intensionality’ (with an ‘s’) in which the objects of thought are presented to a thinker from a certain point of view, or ‘mode of presentation’ (Frege), as discussed in Section 1a above.

The connection between intentionality and intensionality can be witnessed when we try to describe someone’s intentional states without reference to their point of view. For example, in DC Comics’ Superman stories, Lois Lane believes she loves Superman, but does not believe she loves her colleague Clark Kent. It is reasonable to argue that a true description of Lois Lane’s belief about Superman can be represented as:

(1)     Lois Lane believes that she loves Superman

However, Lois Lane does not know that Clark Kent is Superman in disguise, and it could be argued that the following statement that is created when substituting the name ‘Clark Kent’ for the name ‘Superman’ is false:

(2)     Lois Lane believes that she loves Clark Kent

If Superman walks into the room in his Clark Kent disguise, Lois will not light up as she does when he walks in without the disguise. If Lois is told that Clark Kent is in trouble, she will not infer that the man she loves in is in trouble. A natural explanation for these facts is that the belief reported in 1) is not the same as the belief reported in (2). Since inferences about the beliefs of others may be false if we do not take into consideration the mode of presentation under which the objects of those beliefs are held by the belief holder, it is logical to suggest that intensionality may be an essential feature of intentional states.

Another phenomenon that suggests a relationship between intentionality and intensionality is that we cannot infer from the fact that someone has a belief about x, that x exists. This is unusual, since for most cases of predication (ascription of a property to an object), we can infer from the statement that we have ascribed a property to an object that the object exists. For example, if the claim that the sun is bright is true, it would seem to follow that there must be such a thing as the sun. That is, predication ordinarily permits existential generalization: if a property is truly predicated of an object, then some object with that property exists (Fa → ∃xFx). However, from the fact that I believe the sun is bright, it does not logically follow that there is such a thing as the sun; neither the assertion nor the denial of a report of an intentional state entails that the proposition the intentional state is about is true or false.

Chisholm (1956) proposed that an intentional state is any state whose description has these three features: failure to preserve truth given the inter-substitution of co-referring terms, failure to allow existential generalization entailment, and failure to entail the truth of the object proposition.

However, critics argue that these criteria do not seem to hold up for all intentional states because it does not seem possible to have knowledge of things that do not exist, nor of propositions that are not true, for example if the thinker knows Fa, then an object with the property F must exist, and if the thinker knows that p, then p must be true. Knowledge ascriptions therefore do not satisfy the second and third conditions proposed by Chisholm, even though it could be argued that they are intentional states. If can further be argued that perceptual states are intentional states, and do not obviously satisfy any of Chisholm’s conditions: you cannot perceive something that does not exist, and you cannot perceive that p is the case if p is not the case, and additionally it is possible to intersubstitute co-referring terms in descriptions of perceptions.

For example, if it is true that Jimi Hendrix saw Bob Dylan at the 1969 Woodstock Festival, then it is true that Jimi Hendrix saw Robert Zimmerman at Woodstock because Robert Zimmerman had legally changed his name to his stage name of ‘Bob Dylan’ by that time. Hendrix might not have believed that he saw Robert Zimmerman, or have known that he saw Robert Zimmerman, but nevertheless, if he saw Bob Dylan, he saw Robert Zimmerman.

c. Intentionality and Consciousness

A state of a creature is a conscious state if there is something it is like for the creature to be in that state, for example there is something that it feels like for a person to have their hand pressed onto a hot grill, but there is not anything it feels like for a cheese sandwich to be pressed onto a hot grill. Do these conscious states have an essential connection to intentionality? Might intentionality depend on consciousness, or vice versa?

Some views take conscious states to be a kind of intentional state–thus holding that consciousness depends on intentionality. There are established prima facie grounds for holding this view, for example it is not obvious how I could be conscious of a horse being before me without my conscious state being directed at, or about, the horse. The idea that conscious states are a species of intentional state can be explored in various ways. We might say that conscious content is simply intentional content that is available for rational evaluation, so that if I am conscious that it is raining, I have a mental state about the rain that I can reflect upon (Dennett 1991). Or we could say that conscious states always represent the world as being in such-and-such a way, so that if I am conscious that it is raining, I have a mental state that represents the world as being rainy right now (Tye 1995). Or, that conscious states are states that are naturally selected to indicate to a subject that her environment is in such and such a way, and again therefore intentional (Dretske 1995).

However the view that there are ‘raw feels’ in our conscious experience that do not say anything at all about the world also carries considerable weight. For example, you might think that when you’re conscious of the warmth of the sun on your face you can indeed reflect upon the fact and judge that it is sunny where you are, but that the warm feeling itself does not prove that it is sunny. The warm feeling may result in a judgment that ‘it is sunny’, but the judgment, although formed on the basis of the feeling, is nevertheless distinct from the feeling (Ryle 1949, Sellars 1956, Peacocke 1983). On this view, conscious states are not intentional in themselves, since they do not in themselves represent the world as being in any particular way, even if they can be used to make judgments about the world.

On the other hand, we might think that intentional states depend on consciousness. We might suppose that it is difficult to make sense of the claim that we could have mental states about the world without the world seeming any way at all to us. Searle (1983) proposed that our notion of the mind involves the notion of consciousness, and dismissed the possibility of unconscious mental states. He went on to argue that the beliefs or desires that a person is not currently consciously entertaining must at least have the potential to become conscious in order to be properly understood as mental states.

Counterarguments to the theory that intentionality depends on consciousness include ‘epiphenomenalism’ which proposes that there is no essential role for consciousness to play in our lives: that consciousness is caused by, but itself plays no causal role in, other mental events. We may happen to have conscious experiences concurrent with some of the events in our lives (such as intentional events), and they may even stand in constant conjunction with those events, but this in itself is not evidence that a creature could not exist that carries out the same activities with no conscious experiences at all.

d. Naturalizing Intentionality

The historic tradition of holding that the mind is an immaterial substance outside the boundaries of space and time was increasingly challenged from the 20th century in an effort to give an account of intentionality that can be exhaustively described in the terms in which the laws of nature and processes of the natural sciences are expressed, including causal relations and natural selection.

Attempts to naturalize intentionality face a number of objections, including the theory that if intentional states are held to depend on consciousness (Section 1a), and we hold that it is not possible to give a naturalized account of consciousness, then it follows that we cannot naturalize intentionality, Another challenge relates to causal relations, as discussed in Section 3b, where at least some intentional states can be seen to have the property of intensionality: it does not follow from the fact that I believe p that p is the case, and it does not follow from the fact that I do not believe p that p is not the case. In other words, this theory holds that our concepts do not always co-vary with the objects they represent.

Dretske (1981) countered previous oppositions to causal theory of intentionality (Section 1b) when he argued that causal relations can, in fact, exhibit intensionality, thereby suggesting that it is possible to naturalize intentionality.

He argued that a compass indicates the location of the North Pole because the North Pole causes the compass needle to point at it: the compass is a ‘natural indicator’ of the North Pole, and therefore exhibits natural intentionality. He further proposed that a compass also exhibits intensionality because its needle points to the location of polar bears whose natural domain is the North Pole. If, however, polar bears move south, the compass will not continue to indicate their location which led Dretske to suggest that the compass exhibits intensionality: the compass can fail to indicate the location of polar bears, even though the location of polar bears is the North Pole, just as Lois Lane’s superman concept can fail to indicate Clark Kent, even though Clark Kent is Superman.

Opponents to this argument counter that the relationship between the location of polar bears and the North Pole is very different to the relationship between Superman and Clark Kent: the location of the polar bears can fail to be where the North Pole is located, but Clark Kent cannot fail to be located where Superman is located. That is, the foundation of Dretske’s argument relates to an object that merely happens to be co-instantiated with its reference on some occasions, but is not proven where a concept fails to trigger in response to what is necessarily identical to its reference.

Another attempt to allow for these cases within a causal theory appeals to the notion of a natural function or telos (Mathen and Levy 1984, Millikan 1984, Dretske 1995, Papineau 1993). For example, if the heart organ has been selected by evolution to pump blood, then we can say that its correct natural function is to pump blood. If the heart malfunctions and ceases to pump blood it is no longer fulfilling its correct natural function; what distinguishes the correct from the incorrect activities of the heart is whether the heart is performing the function that evolution selected it for.

The teleological theory of intentionality proposes that this same mechanism distinguishes the correct and incorrect triggers of a concept. This account faces several objections, including the hypothesis that it precludes the possibility of a creature having thoughts whose mental states did not come into being through natural selection (Davidson 1987). In Davidson’s scenario, the creature would have no intentional states since its brain states would have no natural history, even though it would be physically and behaviorally indistinguishable from a thinking person.

Another theory to identify correct from incorrect triggers of a concept considers the terms of their dependency in their relationship: ‘asymmetric dependence’ proposes that  incorrect triggers of a concept only cause the concept to trigger because the correct triggers do, but not vice versa (Fodor 1987).

Critics of the theory of asymmetric dependence have used Putnam’s Twin-Earth thought experiment (Section 1b above) to illustrate the grounds of their following objection. If an Earthling travelled to Twin-Earth their water concept would logically be triggered by the watery looking stuff there, presumably falsely, because it is ordinarily indistinguishable from Earth water and looks, tastes and smells exactly the same way. If, however, Twin-Earth water did not trigger their water concept, it would not be logical to expect that Earth water would trigger their water concept on Earth.  Fodor dismissed the premise of this reasoning on the grounds that Twin-Earth does not exist (1998).

Philosophers continue in the 21st century to search for a widely accepted solution to the problem presented by intensionality for naturalizing intentionality.

4. References and Further Reading

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  • Chalmers, D. (2006). “Foundations of Two-Dimensional Semantics”. In M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia (eds). Two-Dimensional Semantics: Foundations and Applications. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chisholm, R. M. (1956). Perceiving: a Philosophical Study, chapter 11, selection in D. Rosenthal (ed.), The Nature of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Davidson, D. (1980). Essays on Events and Actions, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Davidson, D. (1987). “Knowing One’s Own Mind”. In Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 60: 441–58.
  • Dennett, D.C (1991). Consciousness Explained. Boston: Little Brown.
  • Dretske, F. (1981). Knowledge and the Flow of Information, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dretske, F. (1995). Naturalizing the Mind. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dreyfus, H.L. (ed.) (1982). Husserl, Intentionality and Cognitive Science, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Evans, G. (1979). “Reference and Contingency”. The Monist, 62, 2 (April, 1979), 161-189.
  • Fodor, J.A. (1975). The Language of Thought, New York: Crowell.
  • Fodor, J.A. (1987). Psychosemantics, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, J.A. (1998). Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, J. A. and Lepore, E. (1992). Holism: A Shopper’s Guide. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Føllesdal, D. (1982). “Husserl’s notion of Noema,” in H.L. Dreyfus (ed.), The Nature of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Frege, G. (1892/1952). “On sense and reference”. In P. Geach and M. Black (eds.), Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, Oxford: Blackwell, 1952.
  • Goodman, N. (1968). Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • Haugeland, J. (1981). “Semantic Engines: an Introduction to Mind Design”. In J. Haugeland (ed.), Mind Design, philosophy, Psychology, Artificial Intelligence, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1981.
  • Hinton, J.M., (1967). “Visual Experiences”. Mind, 76: 217–227.
  • Husserl, E. (1900/1970). Logical Investigations, (Engl. Transl. by Findlay, J.N.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kaplan, D. (1979). “Dthat”. In P. French, T. Uehling, and H. Wettstein (eds.), Contemporary Perspectives in the Philosophy of Language, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • King, P. (2007). “Rethinking Representation in the Middle Ages”. In Representation and Objects of Thought in Medieval Philosophy, edited by Henrik Lagerlund, Ashgate Press: 81-100.
  • Kim, J. (1993). Mind and Supervenience, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kripke, S. (1972/1980). Naming and Necessity, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Martin, M.G.F. (2002). “The Transparency of Experience”. Mind and Language, 17: 376–425.
  • Mohan, M. & Levy, E. (1984). “Teleology, Error, and the Human Immune System”. Journal of Philosophy 81 (7):351-372.
  • McDowell, J. (1994). Mind and World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGinn, C. (1989). Mental Content, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGinn, C. (1990). Problems of Consciousness, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Mill, J.S. (1884). A System of Logic, Ratiocinative and Inductive: Being a Connected View of the Principles of Evidence and the Methods of Scientific Investigation, New York: Harper.
  • Millikan, R.G. (1984). Language, Thought and Other Biological Objects, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Mooney, T. (2010). “Understanding and Simple Seeing in Husserl”. Husserl Studies, 26: 19-48.
  • Moore, G.E. (1903). “The Refutation of Idealism”. Mind 12 (1903) 433-53.
  • Papineau, D. (1993). Philosophical Naturalism. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Peacocke, C. (1983). Sense and Content: Experience, Thought and their Relations, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Putnam, H. (1974). “The meaning of ‘meaning’,” in H. Putnam, Philosophical Papers, vol. II, Language, Mind and Reality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975.
  • Russell, B. (1905/1956). “On denoting,” in R. Marsh (ed.), Bertrand Russell, Logic and Knowledge, Essays 1901-1950, New York: Capricorn Books, 1956.
  • Russell, B. (1911). The Problems of Philosophy,. (New York: Holt).
  • Ryle, G. (1949). The Concept of Mind. Oxford University Press.
  • Searle, J. (1958). “Do Proper Names have Sense?”, Mind 67: 166-173.
  • Searle, J. (1983). Intentionality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Searle, J, (1994). “Intentionality (1),” in Guttenplan, S. (ed.) (1994) A Companion Volume to the Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Sellars, W. (1956/1997). “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind”. In Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind: with an Introduction by Richard Rorty and a Study Guide by Robert Brandom, R. Brandom (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Snowdon, P.F., (1981). “Perception, Vision and Causation”. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, 81: 175–92.
  • Soames, S. (2005). Reference and Description: The Case against Two-Dimensionalism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Strawson, P. (1959). The Bounds of Sense. Oxford University Press.
  • Tye, M. (1995). Ten Problems of Consciousness, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (1953). Philosophical Investigations. Oxford: Blackwell.


Author Information

Cathal O’Madagain
Ecole Normale Superieure, Paris