The theory of interventionism examines the nature and justifications of interfering with another polity (that is, political organization) or with choices made by individuals. Interventionism is characterized by the use or threat of force or coercion to alter a political or cultural situation nominally outside the intervenor’s moral or political jurisdiction. It commonly deals with a government’s interventions in other governments’ affairs–and is thus an aspect of political philosophy, but it can also be extended to interventions in others’ cultures, religions, lifestyles, and economic activities–and thus can fit into applied ethics, covering such issues as paternalism, imperialism, and topics in business, medical, and environmental ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. A Note on Methodological Considerations
  2. What Does Interventionism Deal With?
  3. Arguments for Interventionism
    1. Epistemological Reasons
    2. Political Realism
    3. Rights Theories
  4. Non-Interventionist Doctrines
  5. Legal Positivism and Non-Interventionism
  6. Isolationism
  7. Economic Interventionism

1. A Note on Methodological Considerations

The context of interventionism requires an epistemological consideration. A methodological individualist will argue that it involves interventions in the lives of individuals; that essentially it does not matter whether the individuals are part of one’s political entity or belonging to another–interventionism applies solely to individuals. A methodological holist on the other hand will identify the object of interventionism as groups–cultural, political, religious, national, and so on. Whilst the methodological individualist will focus on issues that infringe or attempt to alter individuals’ rights or choices, the holist will draw attention to issues affecting groups and their identities. Methodological compatibilism holds that interventions do affect individual rights or choices but individuals also identify themselves with groups who can also be separately affected by interference. For example, demanding that all female bank employees wear blue dresses affects the individual’s choice of clothes in the workplace but also interferes with the banking corporation’s right to determine its own standard of dress.

2. What Does Interventionism Deal With?

Beyond epistemological considerations interventionism commonly deals with the justifications of governments to interfere in (a) the lives of its own civilian population–domestic interventions, and (b) the activities of other nations–foreign interventions. In the case of domestic interventionism that apparatus is the police force (or the army acting as a domestic policing force as with the British army in Northern Ireland 1969-date); in the case of international interventionism it is the army. In either scenario interventionism implies the potential or actual use of coercion.

Reasoning or persuading another group of people that a chosen policy, or a certain tradition, is wrong either morally (given a certain standard) or on consequentialist considerations (the policy will not achieve what it’s meant to achieve) are not examples of interventionism. Reasoning includes all forms of rhetoric, example, persuasion, exhortation, counseling, discourse, and so on. The other group changes policy or tradition only if it desires –is persuaded– to change. They do so voluntarily. On the other hand, it may be claimed that in attempting to persuade others to change their minds is a form of interventionism. But this definition then becomes too broad to be of use–merely speaking to another or judging their behavior in the absence of any threats, coercion, or force, cannot be termed interventionist, for its goal is not to interfere but to explain possible choices.

Breaking diplomatic relations also does not imply the use of force and hence is not a form of interventionism. This is an essentially peaceful attempt to alter another government’s actions in effect by removing acknowledgement of its international political status.

Voluntary decisions on the part of a people may change a nation’s values. Trading in goods and ideas can change a society, yet such changes should not, for the most part, be deemed interventionist. Changes in culture and language that result from the voluntary decisions of many individuals cannot be tied to any form of interventionism, for the policy of interventionism is a policy of threatening or using coercion or force of some description. Whether such examples exist is hard to ascertain, for commonly the expansion of freedom of trade that has led to an exchange of ideas and hence of cultures is historically almost universally connected with imperialist policies that do aim at explicit forms of intervention. Following World War Two (1939-45) when Western imperialism dwindled as a political value, it can be argued that various societies (e.g., Taiwan, Malaysia) voluntarily took up what are referred to as ‘Western values’ through the influence of non-violent commercial ventures. However, critics may point out that previous military interventions could be considered as necessary precursors to changes in the culture of the people.

Coercion is a form of interventionism. Coercion implies offering choices that normally would not be accepted, but which leave the individual to choose the option preferred by the coercer, or by default one that is less acceptable. For example: if a knife is held to your throat and you are given the option to hand over your car keys or die, you are being coerced; if a government demands that you open up your borders to a free trade in opium or face armed conflict (China, Opium Wars with Britain) your nation is being coerced.

Domestic interventions entail restricting the choices of individuals or groups or altering their activities through legislative coercion. Limiting freedom of speech or trade, restricting occupational access to certain religious groups, or enforcing the draft are examples of interventions in the choices of individuals or groups, while increasing beer taxes are examples of altering choices through legislative frameworks; failure to comply may incur penalties.

On the international level, interventionist activities involve threatening, coercing, or forcing another group or nation to alter its behavior or change its government or policies. International interventionism can incorporate direct activities such as the use or threat of war, as well as indirect activities such as assassination, subversion, and economic embargoes of all descriptions (complete or partial blockades, transport restrictions, etc.).

General goals of international interventionism include attempting to change: governments (e.g., Iran, 1979); people’s expectations of governmental activities; general attitudes of just conduct not held as appropriate in the wider international community (e.g., South African Apartheid). Specific goals can include changing a state apparatus or its personnel (the government), to remove a particular statesperson or group, to change specific or general policies, to alter cultural or political beliefs, or even to alter patterns of economic and population distributions.

3. Arguments for Interventionism

Utilitarian or consequentialist prescriptions are open-ended: they could support interventions either generally or in particular circumstances, depending on expected results. Other positions offer more principled cases for interventionism, for example on epistemological grounds, political realism or rights analyses.

a. Epistemological Reasons

Intervening can be justified on grounds of the government possessing better knowledge than individual agents, or from paternalistic reasons, which presume the target agents are incapable of making informed choices themselves. To that extent, governments may legislate a range of programs from ensuring that people take out adequate insurance or invest sufficiently into pensions to requiring health checks or continued education; or economic interventions could be justified on the grounds that economic agents (investors, corporations, banks) do not act in the long term interest of the nation, whereas civil servants who are deemed above the profit motive can take the longer view (as held by John Maynard Keynes 1883-1946, for example).

b. Political Realism

Political realism is defined by the primacy of national interest in international affairs. This can be viewed as either a moral duty or as a description of the ruling state of affairs. Policy prescriptions involve pursuing interventions as they benefit the national interest. The theory implies that states should be left alone to seek and to defend their own interests. In the realist tradition, of which there are many shades, such supporters include Thucydides, Machiavelli, and Hobbes.

Political realism offers a broad interventionist doctrine that can justify intervening for reasons of economic profit as well as for balance of power considerations. The history of the British Empire provides many examples of both justifications (Cf. its interventions in European politics in the War of the Spanish Succession 1702-13 and the War of the Austrian Succession 1740-8), whilst post-war US foreign policy offers more recent case studies (Vietnam War 1961-73 and the Gulf War 1990-91). It is captured by Thucydides’ description of the Pelopennesian War, that it was Spartan “fear of Athenian growth” that caused the war. Realists often invoke consequentialist concerns regarding the developing international state of affairs–that should the foreign power to grow unchecked, a war would ensue, or economic resource bases would be lost, or an invasion could occur. The Schlieffen Plan, prior to the First World War (1914-18) is another useful example of balance of power considerations.

Political realism assumes that interests are to be maintained through the exercise of power, and that the world is characterized by competing power bases (nation states [Hegel], for example, or classes [Marx]). Political realism is essence reduces to the ethical principle that might is right.

c. Rights Theories

Some claim that rights only pertain to individuals, and that nations and governments only acquire any rights or privileges by virtue of the civilians giving them power. Rights theorists thus argue that individual rights supersede or ‘trump’ the rights or privileges of governments. On this basis, interventions in support of rights are morally justifiable. For example, if a foreign government tyrannizes its civilians, an intervention to support their rights can be justified, for the moral status of rights does not end at political borders. However, what needs to be considered is at what point do rights violations justify an intervention, or would an intervention do more harm than good? Second is the argument from hypocrisy–can a nation be justified in intervening in another’s affairs when it does not have a clean slate of its own? Finally, given that rights are being violated, is a government guilty of moral failure if it fails to intervene, and if so, is that moral failure a failure of its duty or of virtuous behavior?

4. Non-Interventionist Doctrines

Non-interventionism is the theory that one does not have any moral justification in intervening in others’ affairs. On a rights based analysis, or from Kantian considerations of duty, this may be considered an absolutist prohibition on the grounds that it either violates others’ rights to freedom or respect due them as individual moral entities. Consequentialists may infer from evidence that interventionism is always counter-productive and should not be practiced. In contemporary ethical analysis, a rule utilitarian may claim that since interventions never work (an empirical, testable hypothesis), ethical considerations aimed at maximizing the greatest good for the greatest number should employ non-interventionism on principle. However, act utilitarians may agree that historically interventions have not worked, but that does not mean that they will not in a future situation, and hence non-interventionism should not be held categorically.

As a political-economical doctrine, non-interventionism includes the economic doctrine of laissez-faire, which holds that governments should not intervene in the economic activities of individuals or corporations. Some thinkers, notably Herbert Spencer (1820-1903) have extended the doctrine to moral issues too, arguing, for example, that intervening in the plight of the poor only makes their condition worse by creating an atmosphere of dependency, rather than leaving them to independently struggle and find their own values. Other supporters of the economic laissez-faire doctrine do not go as far as Spencer; Friedrich von Hayek argues (Constitution of Liberty, 1956) that governments do have responsibilities to the poor resulting from their duty to provide a general framework to ensure the smooth operation of the free market system.

On a broader view, non-interventionism is applied by John Stuart Mill in On Liberty; he claims that responsibility to others only goes so far as ensuring they know of the dangers that may befall them, but does not extend to actually physically restraining those who would knowingly injure themselves. In the international sphere, Mill (“Notes on Intervention” Collected Works) argues for a policy of self-determination: that other people be allowed to make their own mistakes, and hence forge their own paths to freedom; intervening paternalistically on their behalf will not be conducive to their learning the value of freedom in its own right. Such a stance can be used in a variety of issues including freedom of press and expression. For example, John Milton in Areopagitica argues: “And though all the winds of doctrine were let loose to play on the earth, so Truth be in the field, we do injuriously by licensing and prohibiting to misdoubt her strength. Let her and Falsehood grapple; who ever knew Truth put to the worse in a free and open encounter?”

5. Legal Positivism and Non-Interventionism

In the international sphere, legal positivists are commonly non-interventionists. Legal positivists, following Christian Wolff (1679-1754), argue that nation states possess absolute rights to political sovereignty and territorial integrity, which implies that national borders be inviolable. Wolff writes: “Nations are regarded as individual free persons living in a state of nature. For they consist of a multitude of men united into a state. Therefore since states are regarded as individual free persons living in a state of nature, nations must also be regarded in relation to each other as individual free persons living in a state of nature.” (Jus Gentium Methodo Scientifica Pertractatum Trans. Joseph Drake. Clarendon Press: Oxford, 1934, §2, p.9) The positivist theory of international relations implies that interventions would violate international borders; this position itself resolves into an absolutist doctrine that deems interventions should never be condoned and more pragmatic positions that permit some exceptions to the rule.

Positivist exceptions to non-interventionism emanate from humanitarian considerations that overwhelm nominally sacrosanct national borders, if the target state is violating basic human rights to such an extent that it can no longer be deemed a proper representative of its people. The type of interventionism supported depends on the theory of the state entertained.

If governments are viewed as instrumental institutions that exist to uphold the domestic rights of civilians, then a violation of its remit can warrant an intervention on behalf of the citizens. Michael Walzer in Just and Unjust Wars (1977) entertains this position, arguing that only in extreme cases of rights violations “that shock the moral conscience of mankind” (p.107), can interventions be supported. He gives the examples of genocide, mass murder or enslavement. Rights violations above this level, he implies, are not grounds for interventionism (e.g., removal of free movement, freedom of the press, etc).

A Hobbesian case for interventionism can be maintained by those who consider governments the sole and proper moral and legal authorities. Hobbes claims that individuals give up the rights that they possess in the state of nature (except the right of self-preservation) to the state (the ‘Leviathan’). He argues the State should be obeyed, even it is acting quite tyrannically, for the alternative –and the greater evil– is the state of war in which justice and morality do not hold. However, if a state acts to takes its civilians into the state of nature by governing incompetently or unjustly then the people have a right to form a new state. This allows the legal positivist to condone interventions where governments have obviously failed in their obligations and have brought war to the people through their ineptitude.

The third possible justification for the positivist is when a supra-legal body legislates in favor of an intervention. For example, the United Nations has the jurisdiction to pass a resolution of intervention, but it does not condone unilateral interventions. Positivists draw parallels here between governments arbitrating in domestic disputes and a world body acting to dissolve international disputes.

6. Isolationism

Isolationism is the political doctrine of non-involvement in foreign affairs. The state, it is argued, should confine its activities to its own jurisdiction, and therefore, what happens abroad is of no concern. Isolationism can be argued from a consequentialist perspective: that getting involved would only make matters (whatever those matters are) worse; or from an intrinsicist perspective similar to the legal positivist case, that national jurisdiction (and hence moral and political concerns) ends at the political borders.

7. Economic Interventionism

Government intervention in the economy was noted above. Whilst the effects and the principles are the subject matter of economics, philosophers can fruitfully examine the nature of the epistemological arguments used in the debates which involve considerations of methodological individualism versus holism, and a-priori versus a-posteriori reasoning.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Categories: Political Philosophy