Introspection is the process by which someone comes to form beliefs about her own mental states. We might form the belief that someone else is happy on the basis of perception – for example, by perceiving her behavior. But a person typically does not have to observe her own behavior in order to determine whether she is happy. Rather, one makes this determination by introspecting.
When compared to other beliefs that we have, the beliefs that we acquire through introspection seem epistemically special. What exactly this amounts to is discussed in the first part of this essay. The second part addresses the nature of introspection. Though the term “introspection” literally means “looking within” (from the Latin “spicere” meaning “to look” and “intra” meaning “within”), whether introspecting should be treated analogously to looking – that is, whether introspection is a form of inner perception – is debatable. Philosophers have offered both observational and non-observational accounts of introspection. Following the discussion of these various issues about the epistemology and nature of introspection, the third section of this essay addresses an important use to which introspection has been put in philosophical discussions, namely, to draw metaphysical conclusions about the nature of mind.
Table of Contents
- 1. The Epistemic “Specialness” of Introspection
- 2. The Nature of Introspection
- 3. Introspection and the Nature of Mind
- 4. References and Further Reading
We form beliefs about our own mental states by introspection. How exactly introspection works will be discussed in the next section. But however it works, philosophers have long taken note of the fact that each individual’s introspective capacity seems to place her in a unique position to form beliefs, and gain knowledge, of her own mental states. An individual’s introspective beliefs about her own mental states seem in some way more secure than her beliefs about the external world, including her beliefs about the mental states of other people. Correspondingly, her introspective beliefs about her own mental states seem more secure than the beliefs that anyone else could form about her mental states. In these ways, there seems to be something epistemically special about the beliefs that we form on the basis of introspection. Typically, this specialness has been referred to as the privileged access that we have to our own mental states.
To say that an individual has privileged access to her own mental states is to say that she is in a better position than anyone else to acquire knowledge (or perhaps, justified beliefs) about them. But what exactly does privileged access amount to? In this section, of the numerous different claims that philosophers have made in this regard are discussed. (See Alston 1971 for a particularly comprehensive discussion of these and similar claims.)
In the Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes worries that he may be deceived by an evil demon. As a result, all of his beliefs about the external world may well be false. But however powerful the demon may be, Descartes claims that it cannot deceive him about the contents of his own mind. Though it might not be true that he is seeing, hearing and feeling what he thinks he is, it is nonetheless true, he says, that “I certainly seem to see, to hear, and to be warmed. This cannot be false.” (Descartes 1641/1986)
This passage has been commonly interpreted in terms of infallibility. As such, it gives us one of the strongest claims that philosophers have made about the epistemic specialness of our self-knowledge: One cannot have a false belief about one’s own mental states. In this way, I am in a privileged position to make judgments about my mental states, since other people can have false beliefs about my mental states. But, necessarily, if I believe that I am in a particular mental state, then I am in that mental state.
Before discussing this thesis, it is worth noting that there has been some unfortunate terminological messiness in this area. Sometimes the terms “incorrigibility” or “indubitability” have been used as a synonym for what has just been referred to as “infallibility.” For example, when Armstrong (1963) asks whether introspective knowledge is incorrigible, he has in mind the claim that it is logically impossible for someone to be mistaken when she makes a sincere introspective report. He then explicitly uses the words “incorrigible” and “indubitable” interchangeably. (See also Shoemaker 1963, who uses the term “incorrigible” to refer to any sincere introspective report in which “it does not make sense to suppose, and nothing could be accepted as showing, that [the individual] is mistaken, i.e., that what he says is false.”) However, the terms “incorrigibility” and “indubitability” are also often distinguished from one another, and from “infallibility,” to pick out related, but different, kinds of epistemic specialness. On this usage, an individual’s introspective belief is said to be incorrigible when no one else can have grounds for correcting it; an individual’s introspective belief is said to be indubitable when she herself can have no grounds for rejecting it. (See Alston 1971 and Gallois 1996.) Note that these three kinds of epistemic specialness can clearly come apart. For example, we can conceive (at least in principle) of cases in which an individual’s introspective report was false even though no one else had grounds for correcting it, or in which the individual herself has no grounds to reject it. It thus seems best to keep separate the terms “infallibility,” “incorrigibility,” and “indubitability.” This essay reserves the term “infallibility” for the claim discussed above that it is not possible for me to believe that I am in a given mental state unless I am in that mental state.
One further qualification is also needed. As stated above, the infallibility thesis concerns our self-knowledge generally, rather than just our introspective knowledge, and is thus overly broad. Suppose that in the course of a polite disagreement, a friend accuses me of being angry at her. In fact, she is lying to cover her own anger at me. But, because she is normally reliable, I might take her accusation at face value and become convinced that I am angry at her. This case, in which I have the belief that I am angry even though I am not, shows that we can have fallible self-knowledge. (See Gertler 2003b for some similar examples.) The case does not show, however, that we can have fallible introspective knowledge. In fact, one might suppose that my belief in the case above is mistaken precisely because it was not formed on the basis of introspection, but rather on the basis of my friend’s testimony. Proponents of infallibility undoubtedly intend the infallibility thesis to apply only to introspective knowledge and not to self-knowledge more generally. To make this clear, we can insert the following qualification in the statement of the infallibility claim: Necessarily, if I believe on the basis of introspection that I am in a particular mental state, then I am in that mental state.
Thus understood, the infallibility thesis enjoys some intuitive support, particularly when it comes to certain types of mental states like sensations. How can I be wrong that I am in pain right now? (See Shoemaker 1990 for an attempt to flesh out the inherent plausibility of the infallibility thesis.) Nonetheless, it is now almost uniformly rejected by both philosophers and psychologists alike. Some obvious counterexamples come from our assessments of our emotional states and character traits. Individuals are notoriously poor judges of whether they are feeling jealous, for example. And of course there are widespread examples from literature and cinema where it is plain to everyone but the bickering hero and heroine themselves that, despite their protestations to the contrary, they are really in love.
Arguing against the infallibility thesis, Churchland (1988) suggests that we make mistakes in our introspective judgments because of expectation, presentation, and memory effects, – three phenomena that are familiar from the case of perception. As an example where expectations come into play, he offers the case of a captured spy whose interrogators have repeatedly tortured him by briefly pressing a hot iron against his back. What would happen if, after 19 times with the hot iron, the torturers surreptitiously use an ice cube instead? Since the spy strongly expects to feel pain, Churchland suggests that the spy’s immediate reaction to the ice cube will not differ significantly from the reactions that he had to the hot iron, i.e., he will mistakenly think he is feeling pain. (See also Warner 1993.) Likewise, Churchland argues that when a sensation is presented to us for a very short duration of time, mistakes are not just likely but inevitable. Finally, he asks us to consider someone who suffered neural damage at a young age and has subsequently not felt pain or any other tactile sensation for 50 years. Then suppose that her neural deficits were somehow overcome. In such a situation, Churchland argues that it would be quite implausible to suppose that she would be able instantly and infallibly to discriminate and identify all of her newly regained sensations.
Churchland’s criticisms of the infallibility thesis in some ways echo worries raised by James almost a century earlier. As James noted, “Even the writers who insist upon the absolute veracity of our immediate inner apprehension of a conscious state have to contrast with this the fallibility of our memory or observation of it, a moment later.” He concludes that “introspection is difficult and fallible; and that the difficulty is simply that of all observation of whatever kind.” (James 1890/1950)
Another line of objection to the claim of infallibility derives from some remarks of Wittgenstein (1958). In the course of offering his private language argument, he worries about how an individual in isolation would be able to develop a language to refer to her own sensations. The problem is that in such cases there “is no criterion of correctness. One would like to say: whatever is going to seem right to me is right. And that only means that here we can’t talk about ‘right.’” Armstrong (1963) fleshes out the objection as follows (see also Wright 1989):
If introspective mistake is ruled out by logical necessity, then what sense can we attach to the notion of gaining knowledge by introspection? We can speak of gaining knowledge only in cases where it makes sense to speak of thinking wrongly that we have gained knowledge. In the words of the slogan: ‘If you can’t be wrong, then you can’t be right either.’ If failure is logically impossible, then talk of success is meaningless.
In the empirical domain, work in a variety of areas provides important evidence for the fallibility of introspection. Influential studies by Nisbett and Wilson (1977) suggest that we often misdescribe our own reasoning processes. In one study, subjects were presented with four pairs of stockings and asked to indicate which pair had the highest quality. The leftmost pair was preferred by a factor of almost four to one. However, unbeknownst to the subjects, all four pairs of stockings were identical. Though position effects were clearly playing a role in the subjects’ choice, none of them identified position when asked to explain their reasoning, and those who were asked explicitly whether position played any role in their reasoning process all denied it. The evidence from this and other studies thus suggests that people often form mistaken beliefs about what reasoning processes they are utilizing; as Nisbett and Wilson conclude, the evidence is “consistent with the most pessimistic view concerning people’s ability to report accurately about their cognitive processes.”
However interesting this result, Nisbett and Wilson’s work might not seem especially threatening to most proponents of infallibility, since it concerns introspective access only to higher order reasoning processes, and in particular, the ability to recognize outside influences on those processes. But who would have ever thought that we were infallible with respect to that? In contrast, empirical work on “changeblindness,” which calls into question our introspective access to our current perceptual states, seems to pose a deeper threat. According to work done by Kevin O’Regan (who works, ironically, at the Universite Rene Descartes in France), subjects typically fail to notice even large changes to objects in their visual field, as long as the change occurs simultaneously with some other “disruption,” such as a blink or a mudsplash on a windshield. (See, e.g., O’Regan et al, 1999.)
One might try to qualify the infallibility thesis to address some of the above objections. For example, one might restrict the infallibility thesis only to those judgments that are made after careful reflection. Alternatively, one might restrict the infallibility thesis to a subclass of mental states. For example, Jackson (1973) defends a limited infallibility thesis, claiming that we are infallible only about our current phenomenal states. However, Schwitzgebel (2005) adduces numerous considerations to suggest that we should reject even these attenuated infallibility theses. According to Schwitzgebel, we are prone to gross error even in introspective judgments that are often taken to be epistemically the most secure, namely, those about currently ongoing visual experience. Though we typically assume that visual experience consists of a broad stable field with imprecision or haziness only at the borders, introspective experiments that force us to direct our attention away from the focal center reveal that a surprisingly small portion of one’s visual field has any real clarity and precision. (See also Dennett 1991.)
Another account of our privileged access stems from the doctrine of self-intimation. A mental state is self-intimating if it is impossible for a person to be in that mental state and not know that she is that mental state. This doctrine is sometimes referred to as omniscience (see Alston 1971); if whenever an individual is in a mental state she has knowledge of that mental state, then that individual is omniscient with respect to her own mental life. This doctrine is also sometimes referred to as the transparency thesis – the claim that whatever happens within a mind is completely transparent to it. (See Shoemaker 1990.) As such, the doctrine is closely associated with the Cartesian conception of the mind. But though Descartes himself seemed to endorse both infallibility and self-intimation, it is useful to note that they can come apart. An individual might be infallible about her mental states without the mental states being self-intimating; in such a case, whatever beliefs she has about her mental states will be true, but there may nonetheless be some mental states about which she has no beliefs. Likewise, even if mental states are self-intimating, we might still have false introspective beliefs. Self-intimation requires that whenever an individual is in a mental state she will form the belief that she is in that mental state, but it does not rule out her falsely forming the very same belief when she is not in that mental state.
Like the infallibility thesis, the self-intimation thesis enjoys some inherent plausibility. In fact, self-intimation may even seem to follow from the very notion of a mental state. If what it is for an individual to have a mental state is for her to be conscious of it, how could self-intimation be denied? Insofar as we think of the mental in terms of the conscious, and insofar as we think of being conscious of a mental state as being aware of it, the self-intimation thesis seems like a truism.
Unfortunately for the proponent of self-intimation, however, there are two obvious problems with this line of reasoning. First, as the work of Freud has suggested, we should not limit the mental to the conscious. Second, the claim that consciousness should be analyzed in terms of awareness is itself highly controversial. (See e.g., Armstrong 1981; Block 1995.)
This second point relates to Armstrong’s case (1981) of the distracted truck driver, which is often offered as an objection to the self-intimation thesis. When driving for long periods of time at night, a truck driver may suddenly “come to” and realize that he has been driving for quite some time without being aware of what he has been doing. Though the truck driver was clearly in a conscious state while he was driving (after all, he was engaging in a fairly sophisticated activity), he had no introspective awareness of that state.
The self-intimation thesis also falls victim to many of the same objections that plague the infallibility thesis. Just as we can have false beliefs about many of our mental states, we may also fail to form beliefs about many of our mental states. Even if the jealous lover does not falsely believe that she is not jealous, she might nonetheless fail to recognize her feelings of jealousy. In fact, the only way that we are able to explain much of human behavior is to assume that individuals often lack knowledge of their own mental states. Why do the hero and the heroine bicker so much, to return to an example from above? Presumably this occurs because they are unaware of their true feelings for one another.
The proponent of the self-intimation thesis may be able to sidestep some of these objections by limiting the scope of the thesis in an appropriate way. Chisholm (1981) offers a self-intimation thesis limited to conscious states about which an individual reflects, i.e., whenever an individual who is in a conscious state reflects on whether she is in such a state, she will form a justified belief that she is in such a state. In recent years Shoemaker has also championed a limited version of the self-intimation thesis: “it is implicit in the nature of certain mental states that any subject of such states that has the capacity to conceive of itself as having them will be aware of having them when it does, or at least will become aware of this under certain conditions (e.g. if it reflects on the matter).” (Shoemaker 1988; see also Shoemaker 1995.) The mental states that Shoemaker has in mind are beliefs and desires. Shoemaker argues for his version of the self-intimation thesis by invoking considerations of Moore’s Paradox. Named for G.E. Moore, the paradox concerns assertions of the form “P, but I don’t believe that P” (e.g. “It is raining but I don’t believe that it is raining.”) In short, Shoemaker argues that any rational individual who has the first-order belief P will be able to avoid holding Moore-paradoxical beliefs. Thus, assuming rationality, the mere possession of a belief is enough to ensure that an individual will believe that he has that belief. We will return to Shoemaker’s view in our discussion of the nature of introspection in Section 2.
A third account of privileged access can be found in the notion of self-warrant. As Alston (1976) defines the notion, “a self-warranted belief enjoys an immunity from lack of justification; it cannot be the belief it is and fail to be justified.” If privileged access is to be understood in terms of self-warrant, then that would mean that whenever an individual has a belief about her own mental states, she is justified in holding that belief. As was the case with the infallibility claim, for this claim to be plausible it must presumably be limited to beliefs formed by introspection: if an individual believes on the basis of introspection that she is in a particular mental state, then her belief is justified.
Importantly, in contrast to the proponent of infallibility, the proponent of self-warrant does not claim that the relevant belief must be true. Self-warrant leaves open the possibility of error. As such, it is a considerably weaker claim than either of the two claims previously considered. Moreover, there is something intuitively plausible about it. Suppose that, on the basis on introspection, I form the belief I intend to go to the faculty meeting this afternoon. Granted, I might be wrong, and perhaps other people could supply me with evidence that would convince me that I am wrong. But that said, I have no reason to reject the belief. And that alone – when introspective beliefs are in question – seems to justify me in holding the belief. This point generalizes our introspective beliefs about other conscious mental states as well. Typically, nothing is required to justify an introspective belief about one’s own conscious mental state other than the fact that it is a belief about one’s own conscious mental state. As Alston (1976) argues, if someone were to report to us that she presently is imagining a blue jay, or that she is thinking about lunch, or that she has an itch on her left leg, then we take it for granted that these reports are justified; “We would unhesitatingly brand as absurd a request for justification such as ‘Why do you believe that?’, ‘What reason do you have for supposing that?’, or ‘How do you know that?’”
Against this, Gallois (1996) argues that invoking self-warrant cannot provide an adequate explanation of the epistemic distinctiveness of our introspective beliefs. Gallois suggests that ultimately there is no way of understanding self-warrant except in terms of non-evidential justification; any other analysis will lead to the implausible conclusion that all beliefs are self-warranted. But that means that what is really doing the work to explain the distinctive epistemic nature of our introspective knowledge is the fact that it is non-evidentially justified – the notion of self-warrant itself does no explanatory work. Non-evidential justification will be discussed in connection with the notion of immediacy, below.
An additional claim that is often made about an individual’s introspective access to her own mental states is that it is immediate or direct. To claim that introspective access is immediate is to claim that our introspective beliefs are non-inferential and non-evidentially based. In this respect, our introspective beliefs are significantly different from perceptual beliefs (and perhaps, from all of our other beliefs as well).
Immediacy is often linked with infallibility. One reason that introspective beliefs might be thought to be infallible is that they are immediate; the fact that they are not inferred from any other beliefs or based on any other evidence bestows on them an immunity from error. This position is often associated with Russell, and in particular, his distinction between knowledge by description and knowledge by acquaintance: “We shall say that we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths.” (Russell 1912) For Russell, the only things with which we have such acquaintance are our current mental particulars, and when we are acquainted with some such particular – when our access to it is immediate – our judgments about it cannot be wrong:
At any given moment, there are certain things of which a man is ‘aware,’ certain things which are ‘before his mind.’ … If I describe these objects, I may of course describe them wrongly, hence I cannot with certainty communicate to another what are the things of which I am aware. But if I speak to myself, and denote them by what may be called ‘proper names,’ rather than by descriptive words, I cannot be in error. (Russell 1910.)
Leaving aside the question of whether Russell is right to connect immediacy with infallibility, a further question remains: can immediacy provide us with an adequate understanding of privileged access? Many philosophers have argued that it cannot. For example, Alston (1971) complains that the notion of immediate awareness is not well-understood. It will not help to try to comprehend the notion in causal or special terms, since we do not have a good sense of how these notions apply to mental states. He suggests further that even once the notion is clarified, it still will not serve to explain our privileged access. (Alston 1976). The primary problem concerns the following question: What, exactly, are we supposed to have immediate awareness of? Alston notes that we can have awareness of particulars (my sensation of this patch of color) or facts (that this patch of color is red). But since we do not enjoy privileged access with respect to all of our beliefs about the particular, it looks as if immediate awareness to particulars cannot do the work that it is supposed to do. The problem does not arise if our immediate awareness is of a particular fact about the particular – an immediate awareness of the fact that this patch of color is red can explain why a belief in that fact would be epistemically privileged. However, here we have merely traded one problem for another, since it is not at all clear what sense it makes to say that facts can be immediately apprehended.
Heil (1988) offers an additional reason to deny that immediacy or directness gives us a sufficient explanation of privileged access. According to Heil, a mental state’s being one’s own is neither necessary nor sufficient for it to be knowable directly. It is possible, in principle, that I might fail to know many of my mental states directly, and it might further be possible that I might know someone else’s mental states directly. (Suppose, for example, that Anne could be wired in such a way so that she is connected to Emily’s nervous system. In this case, Anne might know Emily’s mental states directly.) As he concludes, “a characterization of my privileged access based exclusively on what is directly known is anemic, hence unsatisfactory.”
However we are to understand the special epistemic status of our introspective judgments, we might naturally think that this status owes to the nature of introspection. But what is the nature of our introspective capacity? Philosophers who have attempted to answer this question fall, broadly speaking, into two camps: those who give observational models of introspection, and those who give non-observational models of introspection. In what follows, we address each of these accounts in turn. We will also briefly consider the skeptical view of an additional camp of philosophers, those who deny that there is any special introspective capacity for which to account.
One of the most common accounts of introspection is modeled on perception: just as our perceptual capacity enables us to observe the outer world, our introspective capacity enables us to observe the inner world. As such, introspection can be thought of as an inner sense. This view is often thought to have originated with Locke, who claimed that one source of our ideas is:
the Perception of the Operations of our own Minds within us …. This Source of Ideas, every Man has wholly in himself: And though it be not Sense, as having nothing to do with external Objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be call’d internal Sense. (Locke 1689/1975)
Armstrong (1968, 1981) is probably the main contemporary advocate of the inner sense view. In the course of advocating a materialist theory of mind, Armstrong advances a view of introspection as a self-scanning process in the brain. According to Armstrong, the scanning state and the state scanned must be distinct states: “although they are both mental states, it is impossible that the introspecting and the thing introspected should be one and the same mental state. A mental state cannot be aware of itself, any more than a man can eat himself up.” (Armstrong 1968, 324) Having offered this consideration, which is often referred to as the distinct existences argument, Armstrong also argues that the relationship between the two states is causal.
Given this picture of introspection, it is no surprise that proponents of the inner sense view typically reject several of the claims discussed in Section 1 above. Since they view the introspective state and the introspected state as distinct states, they claim that it must be possible for one to occur without the other. Thus, they reject the self-intimation claim. Since it seems possible that the scanning mechanism could malfunction, they also reject the infallibility claim.
This does not mean, however, that the inner sense view of introspection should be seen as deflationary. Lycan (1996), who offers a version of Armstrong’s self-scanning view, emphasizes the importance of introspection to our mental lives: “Introspective consciousness is no accident … As a matter of engineering, if we did not have the devices of introspection, there would be no we to argue about, or to do the arguing.” Here Lycan stresses the evolutionary advantages conferred by our capacity for introspection. The complexity of our sensory, cognitive and motor systems demands that we be able to engage in an internal monitoring of these systems.
In recent years, Shoemaker has been one of the most persistent critics of the inner sense model of introspection. According to Shoemaker (1994), if introspection were to conform to a perceptual model, even one broadly construed, then it would have to satisfy two conditions. The first is what he calls the “causal condition” – introspective beliefs about one’s own mental states are caused by those mental states, by a reliable belief-producing mechanism. The second is what he calls the “independence condition” – the existence of mental states is independent of any introspective beliefs about them. Shoemaker’s main concern with the inner sense model is that introspection fails to satisfy this second condition. His arguments here relate to his arguments for the self-intimation thesis, discussed above. According to Shoemaker, rationality demands that a creature be sensitive to her own mental states, and thus it is of the essence of mental states to reveal themselves to introspection. (See also Falvey 2000.)
Many of the additional criticisms of the inner sense view stem from alleged disanalogies with “outer” sense. For example, there is no organ of introspection the way that there are organs of sense perception. Armstrong (1968) dismisses this criticism by noting that even one of the outer senses – namely, proprioception – proceeds without a sensory organ. Lormand (2000) makes the further point that there are mental processes such as imagination, dreaming, and hallucination that we think of as “sensory” even though they do not proceed by way of organs of perception.
Another disanalogy arises from the fact that introspecting lacks any distinctive phenomenology. Lyons (1986) takes this to show that it cannot literally be a form of inner perception. Each of our other senses has a distinct phenomenology; think, for example, of the phenomenology of tasting or of touching. However, the phenomenology of introspecting seems to derive wholly from what is being introspected; in and of itself, there is nothing that it is like to introspect.
This last criticism relates to the so-called diaphanousness or transparency of experience (not to be confused with the epistemic transparency claim discussed above that is associated with the Cartesian conception of mind). Experience is said to be transparent in the sense that we ‘see’ right through it to the object of that experience, analogously to the way we see through a pane of glass to whatever is on the other side of it. For example, when I am having an experience of a red tomato, and I try to focus on the experience, there seems to be nothing on which I can train my focus except the tomato itself. If experience is transparent in this way, then introspection is not a matter of “looking within.”
Moved by considerations of experiential transparency, some philosophers – most notably Dretske (1995, 1999) – have offered a perceptual model of introspection that differs dramatically from the inner sense view. Dretske claims that all mental states are representational states. But this means that there is no longer any need, or any use, for the sort of internal scanning mechanism posited by proponents of the inner sense view. Instead:
One becomes aware of representational facts by an awareness of physical objects. One learns that A looks longer than B, not by an awareness of the experience that represents A as longer than B, but by an awareness of A and B, the objects the experience is an experience of. On a representational theory of the mind, introspection becomes an instance of displaced perception—knowledge of internal (mental) facts via an awareness of external (physical) facts. (Dretske 1995)
On this displaced perception view, then, not only should we reject the infallibility thesis and the self-intimation thesis, but we should also reject the immediacy thesis. Introspective knowledge for someone like Dretske will be inferential knowledge – inferred from our knowledge of the external world.
In addition to the displaced perception view, there are other views that are at least broadly speaking observational views of introspection but yet deny that introspection should be construed along the lines of the traditional inner sense view. For example, Nichols and Stich (2003a, 2003b; see also Nichols 2000) have offered a view of introspection that works by way of a “monitoring mechanism.” The input to the mechanism is one’s own mental state; the output is a belief that one has that mental state. As stated, the monitoring mechanism sounds very much like Armstrong’s self-scanning mechanism, and thus looks like a version of the inner sense model of introspection. However, the view proposed by Stich and Nichols differs from standard versions of the inner sense view in its explicit denial that the monitoring mechanism detects the presence of the inputted mental state by way of phenomenological features.
In the previous section, we saw Shoemaker’s criticisms of the inner-sense model of introspection. Having developed these criticisms, Shoemaker (1988, 1990, 1994) offers his own view of how introspection works. This view is not observational. Rather, on Shoemaker’s view, there is a constitutive connection between being in a mental state and having introspective knowledge about that state: “Our minds are so constituted, or our brains are so wired, that for a wide range of mental states, one’s being in a certain mental state produces in one, under certain conditions, the belief that one is in that mental state.” (Shoemaker 1994)
For Shoemaker, this constitutive connection owes to the fact that we are rational creatures. It is an essential part of being rational that a being has the capacity for introspection. Shoemaker argues for this by primarily by invoking considerations of Moore’s Paradox (see above; section 1c). This argument aims to show that ‘self-blindness’ is not possible; in order to explain an individual’s possession of an introspective belief about a given mental state, we need only to invoke the fact that the individual has the relevant mental state plus normal intelligence, rationality, and conceptual capacity.
A similar account is offered by Gallois (1996), who argues that whenever I have a justified belief, I am entitled to infer from what I believe to the fact that I so believe it. This non-evidential inference will be made by any rational creature, since it is the only way that we can make sense of the world around us; in the absence of such an inference, an individual will not be able to contrast her beliefs about the world with the world as it actually is. What would result, according to Gallois, is an irrational view of the world around us. Thus, rationality demands the self-attribution of beliefs. Gallois then offers related considerations to show that rationality also demands the self-attribution of other mental states. For example, unless we attribute perceptual states to ourselves, we will be unable to contrast how the world appears to us with how it actually is.
Obviously, the plausibility of the sort of non-observational account that Shoemaker and Gallois offer will depend on the notion of rationality involved. Additionally, proponents of this sort of non-observational account must defend themselves against charges of circularity. Briefly put, the charge of circularity arises since it might naturally be thought that an adequate account of rationality will have to make reference to our introspective capacity. (See Kind 2003 and Siewert 2003 for criticisms of Shoemaker’s account.)
The Theory Theory of self-awareness (TTSA) offers a very different kind of non-observational model. TTSA derives directly from the “Theory Theory,” a view which claims that an individual’s network of commonsense folk-psychological beliefs constitute a theory which she uses to explain and predict the behavior of others. Typically, this inferential, theory-based understanding that we achieve of others’ mental states is contrasted with the direct, non-inferential understanding that we can have of our own mental states. Recent results from developmental psychology, however, call this contrast into question. For example, Gopnik (1993; see also Gopnik and Meltzoff 1994) presents evidence that very young children make errors about their own psychological states parallel to the kinds of errors that they make about others’ psychological states. These errors are not easily explained if we assume a sharp divide between the way we come to know about our own mental states and the way we come to know about others’ mental states. Gopnik thus concludes that the child’s theory of mind applies not only to others but to herself as well:
The important point is that the theoretical constructs themselves, and particularly the idea of intentionality, are not the result of some direct first-person apprehension that is then applied to others. Rather, they are the result of a cognitive construction. The child constructs a theory that explains a wide variety of facts about the child’s experience and behavior and about the behavior and language of others.
Recent research on autism and schizophrenia is also often cited by proponents of TTSA. For example, Carruthers (1996b) discusses experimental results suggesting that autistic individuals lack introspective access to many of their own current mental states. If we think of autism as a kind of “mind-blindness,” then these results are exactly what would be predicted by TTSA.
In developing his own version of TTSA, however, Carruthers (1996a) departs from Gopnik’s claim that self-knowledge is inferential. Rather, Carruthers thinks that mental states should be thought of as akin to the theoretical entities of physics; they are the theoretical entities of folk psychology. Introspection should likewise be thought of as akin to the kind of theory-laden perception that often goes on in the physical sciences. For example, armed with the appropriate background information, a physicist might sometimes simply see that electrons are being emitted by the substance that she is studying. Likewise, claims Carruthers, each of us can sometimes simply see – “that is, know intuitively and non-inferentially” – what mental states we have. Depending on what sense we make of Carruthers invocation of “seeing” here, this version of the TTSA might be best classified as an observational model of introspection (though obviously one that is quite different from the traditional inner-sense view).
Opponents of this view typically raise two very different sorts of criticisms. First, they criticize the data for the theory, suggesting that the research from developmental psychology does not in fact support the conclusions that proponents of TTSA want to draw. For example, Nichols (2000) argues that there are developmental asynchronies between a child’s ability to posit knowledge and ignorance to herself and her ability to posit knowledge and ignorance to others. Were TTSA to be true, however, we should expect these abilities to develop in parallel. Second, they criticize the theory itself. For example, Nichols and Stich (2003b) argue that the theory is underdescribed in one very critical respect. For TTSA to be plausible, the proponent has to allow that there is special information available in the first-person case that is not available in the third-person case. But proponents of TTSA have no plausible account of what this special information might be. Consider Gopnik’s remark that “we may well be equipped to detect certain kinds of internal cognitive activity in a vague and unspecified way, what we might call ‘the Cartesian buzz’.” (Gopnik 1993) Stich and Nichols reasonably note that the postulation of some mysterious ‘buzz’ does not offer much help in this regard.
Many philosophers who take a skeptical view towards introspection were influenced by the views of Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein is often associated with a view called expressivism about introspection, i.e., the claim that what appear to be introspective reports of our mental states are in fact not reports at all, but rather mere expressions of those mental states. Saying “I am in pain” is akin to saying “ouch.” As expressions, rather than reports, of one’s pain, neither of these utterances has any propositional content. Such expressions, in other words, are non-cognitive. This view parallels expressivism in ethics, where utterances like “Giving money to charity is morally right” and “Killing an innocent person is wrong” are interpreted as expressions of approval and disapproval. Whether Wittgenstein actually was an expressivist about introspection is, as is often the case with Wittgensteinian interpretation, a complicated and controversial exegetical question. But certainly some of his remarks are at least suggestive of expressivism, as for example when he says: “the verbal expression of pain replaces crying and does not describe it.” (Wittgenstein 1958)
It is worth noting that some philosophers have recently embraced expressivism without embracing skepticism about introspection. The basic line is to divorce expressivism from non-cognitivism, i.e., to deny that mental state self-ascriptions are reports without denying that such self-ascriptions can be judged true or false. In this spirit, Falvey (2000) argues that the denial that mental state self-ascriptions are reports amounts only to the denial of the observational model of introspection. Mental state self-ascriptions can be truth-apt even if they are mere expressions. His subsequent account of self-knowledge hinges on the notion of sincerity of utterance. According to Falvey, when an individual sincerely self-ascribes a mental state, the sincerity of her utterance will guarantee that she is in that mental state. Although Falvey recognizes that in general the sincerity of an utterance is not sufficient for the truth of that utterance, he argues that mental state self-ascriptions are special in that the gap between sincerity and truth collapses. Moreover, the absence of this gap is what explains privileged access. (See Bar-On 2005 for a different version of neo-expressivism.)
An additional source of skepticism about introspection comes from the rejection of the Cartesian picture of the mind. Cartesianism encourages us to think of the mind like a theater in which the ongoing show can be viewed by only one individual, the person whose mind it is. Critics of Cartesianism suggest that this picture seduces us into falsely positing a faculty for viewing the show, i.e., a faculty of introspection. Along with the rejection of Cartesianism, they urge the rejection of any commitment to a faculty of introspection.
One such critic is Ryle, who argues that the standard philosophical view of introspection is a logical mess. (Ryle 1949) His primary criticism takes the form of a regress argument. On the standard view, self-knowledge consists in a higher-order attention to some lower-order state. But this entails that we would also have to attend to the higher-order state. And the situation is actually even worse than this, since the state of attending to that higher-order state would itself have to be attended to, and so on, leading to a vicious infinite regress.
Importantly, in rejecting introspection, Ryle does not deny that we can attain self-knowledge. We can achieve self-knowledge exactly the same way that we can achieve knowledge of other people, namely, by drawing inductive conclusions on the basis of observed behavior. As this suggests, skepticism about introspection goes along with a rejection of privileged access. On Ryle’s view, there is nothing epistemically special about our judgments about our own mental states. In fact, not only do we typically fail to be in a better position to make judgments about our own mental states than about others’ mental states, or than the position others are in with respect to one’s own mental states, but we might on occasion be in a worse position. After all, one is often inclined to view one’s self with a considerable lack of objectivity.
In a similar spirit to Ryle’s account of introspection is Lyons’ (1986) “replay” account of introspection, according to which introspection is simply a process of perceptual replay. For example, if someone introspects in order to determine whether she is angry at her colleague, Lyons claim that what she will do is to call to mind the things that she did when she was last with the colleague, – what she said, how she reacted, etc. In sum, for Lyons introspection “is not a special and privileged executive monitoring process, over and above the more plebeian processes or perception, memory, and imagination; it is those processes put to a certain use.”
Dennett, one of Ryle’s most famous students, is also skeptical of standard views of introspection. According to Dennett, in many instances where we think we are introspecting, we are actually theorizing. (Dennett 1991) Moreover, since we are notoriously bad at this theorizing, our first-person access to our own mental states is considerably less privileged than is commonly thought.
Having discussed the epistemic status and the nature of introspection, we now turn briefly to two claims about introspection which have played significant roles in discussions of the nature of mind. First, we discuss whether introspection can provide a criterion of mentality. Second, we discuss whether introspection can provide support for a dualist answer to the mind-body problem. Both of these claims are associated with Descartes, and both have come under fire in recent discussions of philosophy of mind.
In claiming that the mind is transparent, Descartes was in essence making a claim about the scope of introspection: the introspective capacity has complete access to all of the contents of the mind. This gives rise to a further claim associated with a Cartesian conception of mind, namely, that introspectibility is the mark of the mental. For Descartes, there is nothing to the mind but that which is accessible to introspection.
In making this claim, Descartes should not be seen as committed to the implausibly strong view that a state must actually be introspected in order to count as a mental state. An individual can have mental states that, at any particular moment, are not present to her consciousness. For example, of the many beliefs that an individual holds, only a very few are occurrent at any point and time. Most of them are non-occurrent – they are standing beliefs that are recalled to consciousness only when needed. Take your belief that 6+7=13; presumably, before reading the previous sentence, that belief was not present to your consciousness. But the fact that it was not then being introspected does not incline us to deny that you then held the belief.
The accessibility that Descartes has in mind is accessibility in principle. Although prior to reading the sentence above you were not introspectively accessing your belief that 6+7=13, you could in principle have introspectively accessed that belief at any time. A belief remains introspectively accessible in principle even if there are many moments in time in which the belief is not being introspected. You might have some mental states to which it is more difficult to gain introspective access. In some cases it might require careful reflection; in other cases, it might even require some kind of psychoanalysis. But as long as the state can, in principle, be brought to consciousness, Descartes counts the relevant state as mental.
The problem, however, is that there are some states that we intuitively think of as mental states but that seem even in principle inaccessible to introspection. At least since the work of Freud, we have recognized the existence of mental states that are deeply unconsciousness. There can be some desires, for example, that are so deeply repressed that they cannot be made available to introspection even with the best psychoanalysis that money can buy. Such states, in other words, are not even in principle accessible to introspection.
With some slight tweaking to our accessibility-in-principle claim, it might be possible to avoid this problem. For example, Brook and Stainton (2000) offer the following suggestion. Consider some deeply unconscious states that we are assuming are not even introspectively accessible in principle. In other words, no matter how hard you were to try, you could not bring them to introspective awareness. Nonetheless: “were you to become aware of them, (directly aware of them, not aware of them by inferring them from behavior or something else), it would be by becoming able to introspect them.” The only way you could have direct access to such states, in other words, would be through introspection.
Even this suggestion, however, is not enough to save the claim that introspectibility is the mark of the mental. First of all, it is not clear how we should evaluate the above counterfactual conditional, given that the mental states in question are ex hypothesi inaccessible to introspection. Second of all, there is another class of mental states for which it is even harder to make sense of the supposition that we could become aware of them directly. Consider here any states that are typically thought to be at the “sub-personal” level. For example, if we accept Chomsky’s theory of language acquisition, each of us mentally represents all sorts of basic linguistic rules. These representations, however, are inaccessible in principle to introspection. Moreover, these states – unlike the sorts of repressed desires just considered – do not even seem to be suitable targets for introspective awareness.
For these reasons, it is unlikely that we will be able to use introspectibility as a criterion of the mental. Perhaps introspectibility can serve as a sufficient condition for a state’s being a mental state, but it cannot provide us with a necessary condition. Despite what Descartes thought, our mental life seems to outrun our introspective capacity.
In the Second Meditation, Descartes (1641) presents the famous line of reasoning often referred to as the Cogito – I think, therefore I am. Even if a powerful demon were to deceive me about the external world, “he will never bring it about that I am nothing so long as I think that I am something.” And so Descartes concludes that he can be certain that he exists.
Having achieved certainty about his existence, however, Descartes does not yet have any certain knowledge about what kind of being he is. He then goes on to examine the nature of the human mind. The course of this examination has suggested the following argument:
- Descartes cannot doubt that he (his mind) exists.
- Descartes can doubt that his body exists.
- Descartes’ mind is not the same thing as Descartes’ body, i.e., dualism is true.
Whether Descartes intended to be using the reflections of the Second Meditation to be offering this argument for dualism is a thorny exegetical question that we sidestep here. For our purposes, the question is whether these considerations do support dualism. More specifically, we are interested in closely related considerations that specifically invoke introspection:
- Mental states are known by introspection.
- Brain states are not known by introspection.
- Therefore, mental states are not identical to brain states.
According to Leibniz’ Law, if a has a property that b lacks, then a is not identical to b. Here we seem to have found a property that mental states have that brain states lack, namely, that they are known by introspection. Unfortunately for the dualist, however, this argument commits an intensional fallacy. For Leibniz’ Law to apply, the property in question must be extensional, that is, it must apply to an object independently of how we refer to that object. In this case, the property “is known by” fails to be extensional.
Faced with this objection, the dualist might offer the following amended argument:
- Mental states are knowable by introspection.
- Brain states are not knowable by introspection.
- Therefore, mental states are not identical to brain states.
The dualist can plausibly claim that the property invoked by this argument – being knowable by introspection – is a genuine, extensional property, and thus he can avoid the intensional fallacy committed by the previous argument. But this argument falls victim to a related objection, as explicated by Churchland (1985). According to Churchland, the materialist has no reason to accept premise 2: “if mental states are indeed identical with brain states, then it is really brain states that we have been introspecting all along, though without appreciating their fine-grained nature.” The fact that temperature is identical to mean molecular kinetic energy means that we can sense mean molecular kinetic energy by feeling, whether we realize that’s what we’re sensing by feeling or not. The fact that we don’t realize that we can introspect brain states does not mean that mental states are not identical to brain states.
In contemporary discussions of the mind-body problem, the above argument from introspection has not played much of a role. However, related considerations from introspection are still in play. For example, Chalmers (1996) offers an argument from “epistemic asymmetry” to show that consciousness cannot be reductively explained. According to this argument:
Our grounds for belief in consciousness derive solely from our own experience of it. Even if we knew every last detail about the physics of the universe … that information would not lead us to postulate the existence of conscious experience. My knowledge of consciousness, in the first instance, comes from my own case, not from any external observations. It is my first-person experience of consciousness that forces the problem on me.
Although this passage (and Chalmers’ discussion of the argument) does not specifically mention introspection, it seems clear that the way one gains first-person experience of consciousness is through introspection.
More generally, many of the contemporary arguments offered in discussions of the mind-body problem rely on premises that can only be supported by introspection, or by introspective projection. Consider, for example, Jackson’s Knowledge Argument. Mary, who is locked in a black and white room and has never had any color sensations, learns every physical fact there is about color. Nonetheless, claims Jackson, when she leaves the room and sees a ripe tomato for the first time, she will learn some new fact about the color red. Thus, there are facts that escape the physicalist story. (Jackson 1982) Whether or not this argument succeeds in establishing the falsity of physicalism is hotly debated, but for our purposes, what’s most important is the following question: how can we judge the truth of Jackson’s claim that Mary learns (or even seems to learn) a new fact about color when she leaves the room? What we must do, it seems, is to imagine ourselves in Mary’s position and judge what we think our epistemic position would be upon exiting the room. In other words, we engage in a sort of introspective projection. In this way, introspection continues to play a key role in this and many other arguments relating to the mind-body problem.
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Last updated: November 18, 2005 | Originally published: November/18/2005
Categories: Mind & Cognitive Science