Luce Irigaray is a prominent author in contemporary French feminism and Continental philosophy. She is an interdisciplinary thinker who works between philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics. Originally a student of the famous analyst Jacques Lacan, Irigaray’s departure from Lacan in Speculum of the Other Woman, where she critiques the exclusion of women from both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, earned her recognition as a leading feminist theorist and continental philosopher. Her subsequent texts provide a comprehensive analysis and critique of the exclusion of women from the history of philosophy, psychoanalytic theory and structural linguistics. Irigaray alleges that women have been traditionally associated with matter and nature to the expense of a female subject position. While women can become subjects if they assimilate to male subjectivity, a separate subject position for women does not exist. Irigaray’s goal is to uncover the absence of a female subject position, the relegation of all things feminine to nature/matter, and, ultimately, the absence of true sexual difference in Western culture. In addition to establishing this critique, Irigaray offers suggestions for altering the situation of women in Western culture. Mimesis, strategic essentialism, utopian ideals, and employing novel language, are but some of the methods central to changing contemporary culture. Irigaray’s analysis of women’s exclusion from culture and her use of strategic essentialism have been enormously influential in contemporary feminist theory. Her work has generated productive discussions about how to define femininity and sexual difference, whether strategic essentialism should be employed, and assessing the risk involved in engaging categories historically used to oppress women. Irigaray’s work extends beyond theory into practice. Irigaray has been actively engaged in the feminist movement in Italy. She has participated in several initiatives in Italy to implement a respect for sexual difference on a cultural and, in her most recent work, governmental level. Her contributions to feminist theory and continental philosophy are many and her complete works present her readers with a rewarding challenge to traditional conceptions of gender, self, and body.
In a 1993 interview with Margaret Whitford, Luce Irigaray specifically says that she does not like to be asked personal questions. She does not want opinions about her everyday life to interfere with interpretations of her ideas. Irigaray believes that entrance into intellectual discussions is a hard won battle for women and that reference to biographical material is one way in which women’s credibility is challenged. It is no surprise that detailed biographical information about Irigaray is limited and that different accounts conflict.
What remains constant between accounts is that Luce Irigaray was born in Belgium in 1932. She holds two doctoral degrees-one in Philosophy and the other in Linguistics. She is also a trained and practicing psychoanalyst. She has held a research post at the Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique de Paris since 1964. She is currently the Director of Research in Philosophy at the center, and also continues her private practice. Perhaps the most well known fact of Irigaray’s life-which Irigaray herself refers to in the opening of je, tu, nous-is her education at, and later expulsion from, the Ecole Freudienne de Paris (Freudian School of Paris). The Ecole Freudienne was founded by the famous psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Irigaray trained at the school in the sixties. In 1974, she published the thesis she wrote while studying at the school, Speculum, de l’autre femme, translated into English as Speculum of the Other Woman. This thesis criticized-among philosophical topics-the phallocentrism of Freudian and Lacanian psychoanalysis. The publication of this thesis gained her recognition, but also negatively affected Irigaray’s career. She was relieved of her teaching post at the University of Vincennes and was ostracized by the Lacanian community. In spite of these early hardships, Irigaray went on to become an influential and prolific author in contemporary feminist theory and continental philosophy. In addition to her intellectual accomplishments, Irigaray is committed to active participation in the women’s movement in both France and internationally-especially in Italy. Several of her later texts are dedicated to her work in the women’s movement of Italy. She is still actively researching and publishing.
Irigaray argues that, since ancient times, mothers have been associated with nature and unthinking matter. Further, Irigaray believes that all women have historically been associated with the role of “mother” such that, whether or not a woman is a mother, her identity is always defined according to that role. This is in contrast to men who are associated with culture and subjectivity. While excluded from culture and subjectivity, women serve as their unacknowledged support. In other words, while women are not considered full subjects, society itself could not function without their contributions. Irigaray ultimately states that Western culture itself is founded upon a primary sacrifice of the mother, and all women through her.
Based on this analysis, Irigaray says that sexual difference does not exist. True sexual difference would require that men and women are equally able to achieve subjectivity. As is, Irigaray believes that men are subjects (e.g. self-conscious, self-same entities) and women are “the other” of these subjects (e.g. the non-subjective, supporting matter). Only one form of subjectivity exists in Western culture and it is male. While Irigaray is influenced by both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy, she identifies them both as influential discourses that exclude women from a social existence as mature subjects. In many of her texts, Irigaray seeks to unveil how both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy exclude women from a genuine social existence as autonomous subjects, and relegate women to the realm of inert, lifeless, inessential matter. With this critique in place, Irigaray suggests how women can begin to reconfigure their identity such that one sex does not exist at the expense of the other. However, she is unwilling to definitively state what that new identity should be like. Irigaray refrains from prescribing a new identity because she wants women to determine for themselves how they want to be defined. While both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory are her targets, Irigaray identifies philosophy as the master discourse. Irigaray’s reasons for this designation are revealed in Speculum of the Other Woman where she demonstrates how philosophy-since Ancient times-has articulated fundamental epistemological, ontological, and metaphysical truths from a male perspective that excludes women. While she is not suggesting that philosophy is single-handedly responsible for the history of women’s oppression, she wants to emphasize that the similar type of exclusion manifest in both philosophy and psychoanalysis predates the birth of psychoanalysis. As the companion discourse to philosophy, psychoanalysis plays a unique role. While Irigaray praises psychoanalysis for utilizing the method of analysis to reveal the plight of female subjectivity, she also thinks that it reinforces it. Freud attempts to explain female subjectivity and sexuality according to a male model. From this perspective, female subjectivity looks like a deformed or insufficiently developed form of male subjectivity. Irigaray argues that if Freud had turned the tools of analysis onto his own discourse, then he would have seen that female subjectivity cannot be understood through the lenses of a one-sex model. In other words, negative views of women exist because of theoretical bias-not because of nature. Through her critiques of both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, Irigaray argues that women need to attain a social existence separate from the role of mother. However, this alone will not change the current state of affairs. For Irigaray is not suggesting that the social role of women will change if they merely step over the line of nature into culture. Irigaray believes that true social change will occur only if society challenges its perception of nature as unthinking matter to be dominated and controlled. Thus, while women must attain subjectivity, men must become more embodied. Irigaray argues that both men and women have to reconfigure their subjectivity so that they both understand themselves as belonging equally to nature and culture. Irigaray’s discussions of mimesis, novel language and utopian ideals, reconfiguring the mother/daughter relationship, altering language itself, ethics, and politics are all central to achieving this end.
Irigaray’s interdisciplinary interests in philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics underscore that her work has more than one influence. Two main discourses that maintain a strong presence throughout her work are psychoanalysis, with Sigmund Freud and Jacques Lacan as its representatives, and philosophy. Insofar as Lacanian psychoanalysis works out of a background in structural linguistics, both Lacan and Irigaray also focus on language. Irigaray engages with philosophy, psychoanalysis and linguistics in order to uncover the lack of true sexual difference in Western culture.
Irigaray states on the opening page of An Ethics of Sexual Difference that each age is defined by a philosophical issue that calls to be thoroughly examined-ours is sexual difference. Sexual difference is often associated with the anatomical differences between the sexes. However, Irigaray follows the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan in understanding sexual difference as a difference that is assigned in language. While Irigaray is critical of Lacan, she is influenced by Lacan’s interpretation of Freud’s theory of subject formation.
Freud’s work has served as a starting point for diverse psychoanalytic theories such as drive theory, object relations theory, and ego psychology. Lacan interprets Freud’s work from a background in structural linguistics, philosophy, and, of course, psychoanalysis. Of particular importance to Irigaray’s work is Lacan’s claim that there are two key moments in the formation of a child’s identity: the formation of an imaginary body and the assignation of sexual difference in language. Freud introduces the idea of an imaginary body in The Ego and the Id, in the section of the same name, when he describes the ego (self-consciousness) as neither strictly a psychic phenomenon nor a bodily phenomenon. Freud believes that an ego is formed in reference to a body, such that the manner in which an infant understands his or her selfhood is inseparable from his or her bodily existence. However, the body that an infant attributes to him or herself is not objectively understood-it is the mind’s understanding of the body. This means that a person’s understanding of his or her own body is imbued with a degree of fantasy and imagination. In his famous essay “The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I,” Lacan expands Freud’s comments on the bodily ego into a theory about imaginary anatomy. Lacan states that the first of two key moments in subject formation is the projection of an imaginary body. This occurs in the mirror stage at roughly six months. As a being who still lacks mobility and motor control, an infant who is placed in front of a mirror (another person can serve here as well, typically the mother) will identify with the unified, idealized image that is reflected back in the mirror. While the image in the mirror does not match the infant’s experience, it is a key moment in the development of his or her ego. Rather than identify with him or herself as a helpless being, the child choose to identify with the idealized image of him or herself. Lacan believes that the element of fantasy and imagination involved in the identification with the mirror image marks the image as simultaneously representative and misrepresentative of the infant. While the body of the mirror stage is key to the infant’s identity, it is also only an interpretation of his or her biological existence. In other words, according to Lacan, one’s understanding of one’s body occurs only in conjunction with an organization in language and image that begins in the mirror stage, and is further complicated by the next stage of ego formation-entrance into the Symbolic order. Irigaray agrees with Lacan that how we understand our biology is largely culturally influenced-thus does she accept the idea of an imaginary body. Irigaray employs the Lacanian imaginary body in her discussions about Western culture’s bias against women. Irigaray argues that, like people, cultures project dominant imaginary schemes which then affect how that culture understands and defines itself. According to Irigaray, in Western culture, the imaginary body which dominates on a cultural level is a male body. Irigaray thus argues that Western culture privileges identity, unity, and sight-all of which she believes are associated with male anatomy. She believes that fields such as philosophy, psychoanalysis, science and medicine are controlled by this imaginary. Three examples from her work illustrate her view. In Speculum of the Other Woman, Irigaray addresses Freud’s claim in his essay “Femininity” that little girls are only little men. She argues that Freud could not understand women because he was influenced by the one-sex theory of his time (men exist and women are a variation of men), and expanded his own, male experience of the world into a general theory applicable to all humans. According to Irigaray, since Freud was unable to imagine another perspective, his reduction of women to male experience resulted in viewing women as defective men. Another example is found in “Cosi Fan Tutti,” (in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that Lacan’s ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order-the Phallus-is a projection of the male body. Irigaray argues that Lacan failed to diagnose the error of his predecessor, Freud, and similarly understood the world-and especially language-in terms of a one-sex model of sexuality and subjectivity. Although Lacan claims that the Phallus is not connected to male biology, his appropriation of Freud renders this claim false. A final example is found in “The Mechanics of ‘Fluids’” (also in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that science itself is biased towards categories typically personified as masculine (e.g. solids as opposed to fluids). Irigaray believes that if women are not understood in Western culture, it is because Western culture has yet to accept alternate paradigms for understanding them. While selfhood begins in the mirror stage with the imaginary body, it is not solidified until one enters the Symbolic order. According to Lacan, the Symbolic order is an ahistorical system of language that must be entered for a person to have a coherent social identity. The Phallus is the privileged master signifier of the Symbolic order. One must have a relationship to the Phallus if one is to attain social existence. According to Lacan, infants in the mirror stage do not differentiate between themselves and the world. For example, an infant views him or herself as continuous with his or her mother, and this understanding of the mother-child relationship organizes the infant’s world. However, as the infant matures, he or she becomes aware that his or her mothers’ attention is not wholly directed toward the infant in a reciprocal manner. The mother participates in a larger social context dominated by the Symbolic order. The infant fantasizes that if he or she could occupy the role of the Phallus-the master signifer of that Symbolic order-he or she could regain the full attention of the mother. However, this is impossible. In exchange for giving up this fantasy-which the Father demands of the child in the Oedipus complex-the infant gains his or her own relationship to the Phallus. The infant must break with the mother (nature, pre-symbolic) in order to become a subject (culture, symbolic order). One among many unique claims of Lacan’s is that the infant acquires sexual difference in his or her relationship to the Phallus. According to Lacan, sexual difference is not about biological imperative (e.g. if you have a penis you are male, if you have a vagina you are female), it is about having one of two types of relationship to the Phallus-having or being the Phallus. Hence, in the Lacanian view, the body as humans understand it is something that is constructed in the mirror stage, and sexually differentiated in the entrance to the Symbolic order. Irigaray critically appropriates this radical description of sexual difference. She discusses the linguistic character of sexual difference in a manner similar to Lacan in This Sex Which Is Not One. Irigaray is more concerned with how culture-and language as a product of culture-understands sexual difference and subjectivity than with arguing that truths about sexual difference or subjectivity emerge out of biology itself. However she distances herself from Lacan in two key manners. First, Irigaray disagrees with Lacan’s depiction of the Symbolic order as ahistorical and unchanging. Irigaray believes that language systems are malleable, and largely determined by power relationships that are in flux. Second, Irigaray remains unconvinced by Lacan’s claims that the Phallus is an ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order that has no connection to male anatomy. In “Cosi Fan Tutti,” she argues that the Phallus is not a purely symbolic category, but is ultimately an extension of-and reinforcement of-Freud’s description of the world according to a one-sex model. According to Irigaray, the Phallus as the master signifier (that can be traced back to male anatomy) is evidence that the Symbolic order is constructed and not ahistorical.
Irigaray is also influenced by her extensive study of the history of philosophy. Texts such as Speculum of the Other Woman and An Ethics of Sexual Difference demonstrate her command of the philosophical canon. Speculum of the Other Woman discusses the elision of all things feminine in traditional thinkers such as Aristotle, Descartes, Kant, and Hegel. An Ethics of Sexual Difference also discusses the elision of the feminine, but specifically from the perspective of ethical relationships between men and women. An Ethics of Sexual Difference addresses thinkers as diverse as Plato, Merleau-Ponty, Spinoza, and Levinas. Irigaray is also writing a series of texts devoted to the four elements. The elemental works Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche and The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger are sustained discussions of the exclusions implemented by key male philosophers.
No one philosopher can be identified as influencing Irigaray. She appropriates from various thinkers while maintaining a critical distance. For example, her method of mimesis resembles Derridian deconstruction. However, she also criticizes Derrida’s deconstruction of the category “woman” (see Derrida’s Spurs) in Marine Lover. As another example, she agrees with Heidegger that every age has a concept that underlies and informs its beliefs, but is radically unknown to it. For Heidegger it was “Being,” for Irigaray it is “sexual difference.” Like Heidegger, she wants to investigate the concept that Western culture takes to be self-evident in order to show that it is unknown to us. However she is critical in The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger of Heidegger’s exclusion of women. One can also find Levinasian (An Ethics of Sexual Difference), Hegelian (I love to you) or Marxist (This Sex Which Is Not One, “Women on the Market”) undertones in Irigaray’s discussions of ethics and dialectical thinking. While she is clearly influenced by the history of philosophy, her own project of creating a new space for redefining women does not permit her to privilege any one philosophical approach.
Irigaray describes herself as analyzing both the analysts and the philosophers. Perhaps the most famous critical tool employed by Irigaray is mimesis. Mimesis is a process of resubmitting women to stereotypical views of women in order to call the views themselves into question. Key to mimesis is that the stereotypical views are not repeated faithfully. One example is that if women are viewed as illogical, women should speak logically about this view. According to Irigaray, the juxtaposition of illogical and logical undermines the claim that women are illogical. Or if women’s bodies are viewed as multiple and dispersed, women should speak from that position in a playful way that suggests that this view stems from a masculine economy that values identity and unity (e.g. the penis or the Phallus) and excludes women as the other (e.g. lack, dispersed, or “nothing to see”). This type of mimesis is also known as strategic essentialism. Irigaray’s essay “This Sex Which Is Not One,” in the text of the same name, provides several clear examples of this method.
According to Irigaray, the very possibility of repeating a negative view unfaithfully suggests that women are something other than the view expressed. Irigaray repeats the views because she believes that overcoming harmful views of women cannot occur through simply ignoring the views. True to the methodology of psychoanalysis, she believes that negative views can only be overcome when they are exposed and demystified. When successfully employed, mimesis repeats a negative view-without reducing women to that view-and makes fun of it such that the view itself must be discarded. Irigaray’s wager in utilizing mimesis with regard to female subjectivity is as follows. Male dominance has defined Western culture for centuries. If a new form of subjectivity comes into being out of the death of the modern, transcendental subject, and we have never really investigated or mimetically engaged with the deformed, female form of subjectivity that accompanied and sustained the male form, then what would prevent the logic of master/subject/male and slave/other/female from repeating itself? According to Irigaray, the logic will not be altered until we call attention to the fact that subjectivity has changed before when male dominance has not. We must ask after the feminine other. Irigaray believes that only by asking after the other through mimesis will it be possible to affect a paradigm shift. Irigaray therefore speaks from the silenced position of women in order to (a) challenge the authority of either the negative view or the repression by revealing that position to be nothing more than a fabrication (b) show how the woman/body has been excluded by either revealing the stereotypical view to be false or by inciting the excluded woman/body to speak and (c) thereby force a shift in the conception of female subjectivity and the body. Irigaray employs mimesis because she believes that a ‘second sex’ cannot exist in its own right (or with a positive form of identity as opposed to being viewed as a deformed version of male identity) until we have not only challenged, but also passed back through the oppressive formulation of sexual difference in contemporary Western culture.
While the goal of mimesis is to problematize the male definition of femininity to such a degree that a new definition of and, ultimately, an embodied subject position for women can emerge, Irigaray says in her earlier work that she will not prescribe in advance either the definition or the subject position. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray clearly indicates that she will not redefine femininity because it would interfere with women redefining themselves for themselves. Further, she believes that she cannot describe the feminine (e.g. female subjectivity, the female imaginary body) outside of the current, male definitions without further disrupting the male definitions of women. A new definition for women has to emerge out of a mimetic engagement with the old definitions, and it is a collective process.
Irigaray is, however, willing to provide material to help ignite the process of redefinition. The material she offers varies from new concepts about religion and bodies-expressed through both the novel use of existing words and the creation of new words-to utopian ideals. One example of a new concept that she puts into play through novel language is her discussion of the sensible/transcendental and female divinity. Irigaray introduces these concepts in order to disrupt male dominance in religion. Irigaray follows Feuerbach in interpreting the divine as an organizing principle for both identity and culture. Religion is thus viewed as caught up in power and culture. Irigaray specifically targets male dominated religions that posit a transcendental God. She believes that these religions reinforce male dominance and the division of the world into male/subject and female/body. She suggests that in place of a religion that focuses on a transcendent God, we construct a divinity that is both sensible and transcendental. In other words, given the connection between religion and culture, and the manner in which the mind/body split has fallen out along gender lines, why not propose a vision of divinity that will help Western culture overcome its dualisms and prejudices about those dualisms. Irigaray is not prescribing the sensible/transcendental as a new religion to be implemented and followed, but merely placing it in circulation as a creative impetus for change. An example of utopian ideals can be found in Sexes and Genealogies, thinking the difference, and je, tu, nous. In these texts, Irigaray describes civil laws that she believes would help women achieve social existence (mature subjectivity) in Western culture. In one law she suggests that virginity needs to be protected under the law so that women have control over their own sexuality. She also describes new ways in which the mother/daughter relationship should be legally protected, and outlines how mothers and daughters can communicate with each other so that female subjectivity can be further developed. When these texts were first published, these views were widely interpreted as suggestions intended to initiate discussions between women (utopian ideals) and not as prescriptions for social change. While Irigaray’s later work has complicated this interpretation, it is still widely accepted.
According to Irigaray, while it is necessary to alter cultural norms, it is equally as important to address the problematic nature of individual relationships between women-especially the mother/daughter relationship. To emphasize how mother/daughter relationships are sundered in contemporary Western culture, Irigaray turns to Greek mythology. For example, she discusses the myth of Demeter, the goddess of the earth (agriculture), and her daughter Persephone. In the myth, Zeus, Persephone’s father, aids his brother Hades, king of the underworld, to abduct the young Perspephone. Hades has fallen in love with Persephone and wants her to be queen of the underworld. When Demeter learns that her daughter is missing, she is devastated and abandons her role as goddess of the earth. The earth becomes barren. To reestablish harmony in the world, Zeus needs Demeter to return to her divine responsibilities. Zeus orders Hades to return Persephone. However, Persephone is tricked into eating a pomegranate seed that binds her to Hades forever. Under the persuasion of Zeus, Hades agrees to release Persephone from the underworld for half of each year. Irigaray reads this myth as an example of both a positive mother/daughter relationship, and the success of men at breaking it apart. Demeter and Persephone love each other and Demeter strives to protect her daughter. However, in this myth they are ultimately at the mercy of the more powerful males. The myth is also an example of men exchanging women as if they were commodities. Zeus conspires with his brother and, in effect, gives his daughter away without consulting either Persephone or Demeter. Irigaray believes that myths tell us something about the deterioration of the mother/daughter relationship and the manner in which men have traditionally controlled the fate of women-whether they are wives, daughters, sisters, or mothers. Irigaray utilizes myth to suggest that mothers and daughters need to protect their relationships and strengthen their bonds to one another.
The need to alter the mother/daughter relationship is a constant theme in Irigaray’s work. While she believes that women’s social and political situation has to be addressed on a global level, she also thinks that change begins in individual relationships between women. Thus she stresses the need for mothers to represent themselves differently to their daughters, and to emphasize their daughter’s subjectivity. For example, in je, tu, nous, Irigaray offers suggestions for developing mother-daughter relationships such as displaying images of the mother-daughter couple, or consciously emphasizing that the daughter and the mother are both subjects in their own right. Changing relationships between mothers and daughters also requires language work.
Since Irigaray agrees with Lacan that one must enter language (culture) in order to be a subject, she believes that language itself must change if women are to have their own subjectivity that is recognized at a cultural level. She believes that language typically excludes women from an active subject position. Further, inclusion of women in the current form of subjectivity is not the solution. Irigaray’s goal is for there to be more than one subject position in language.
In order to prove that language excludes women from subjectivity, Irigaray conducted research that links the exclusion of women from subjectivity in Western culture to the speech patterns of men and women. She concluded that general speech patterns specific to each sex do exist and that women often do not occupy the subject position in language. She argues that in language experiments, women were less willing to occupy the subject position. Referring to the French language as a clear example-even though she believes that the structure of the English language does not exempt it from sexism-she discusses the dominance of the masculine in both the plural and the neuter, which takes the same form as the masculine. Irigaray argues that objects of value, such as the sun or God, are typically marked with the masculine gender while less important objects are feminine. Since language and society mutually affect each other, Irigaray believes that language must change along with society. Failure to see the importance of changing language is an impediment to real change. According to Irigaray, it is crucial that women learn to occupy the position of “I” and “you” in language. Irigaray views the “I” and the “you” as markers of subjectivity. In her text I love to you, Irigaray describes how she determined that women do not occupy the subject position. She conducted an experiment where she gave her subjects a noun (e.g. enfant) and asked her test subjects to use the noun in a sentence as a pronoun (il or elle). The majority of both men and women consistently chose “il”. She noted in another experiment, where she gave a sequence that implied the use of “elle” (e.g. robe-se-voir), that both sexes avoided using “elle” (she) and “elle se” (she herself) as an active subject. In contrast, when she gave a sequence that implied the use of il as a subject, it was almost always used. Further, Irigaray discovered that young girls seek an intersubjective dialogue with their mothers, but that their mothers did not reciprocate. Irigaray concludes from her research that women are not subjects in language in the same way as men. She believes that men and women do not produce the same sentences with similar cues, they use prepositions differently, and they represent temporality in language differently. Irigaray seeks for men and women to recognize each other in language as irreducible others. She argues that this cannot happen until women occupy the subject position, and men learn to communicate with other subjects. Irigaray believes that a language of ‘indirection’ could help bring this to fruition. She describes this in her book I love to you. The title itself is an example of this language of indirection. Saying “I love to you” rather than “I love you” is a way of symbolizing a respect for the other. The “to” is a verbal barrier against appropriating or subjugating the other. Speaking differently in this manner is an integral part of Irigaray’s general project to cultivate true intersubjectivity between the genders. However, she does not put forth a definitive plan for implementing this change in language.
While ethics is a constant theme throughout her work, Irigaray’s text An Ethics of Sexual Difference is devoted to this theme. In this text, Irigaray intertwines essays of her own on the ethics of sexual difference with dialogues that she has created between herself and six male philosophers: Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. Irigaray groups the dialogues into four sections that each begin with an essay of her own about sexual difference and love. Her own essay signals what themes she will address with regard to each of the philosophers she discusses. Irigaray utilizes her analyses of the male philosophers to discuss the following themes which are essential to her ethics: creative relationships between men and women that are not based in reproduction, separate ‘places’ for men and women (emotional and embodied), wonder at the difference of the other, acknowledgement of finiteness and intersubjectivity, and an embodied divinity.
In the first section, which engages Plato and Aristotle, Irigaray emphasizes that an ethical love relationship must be creative independent of procreation, and that both men and women need to have a place for themselves (be embodied individuals) that is open to, but not subsumable by, the other. In the second section, using Descartes and Spinoza, she argues that ethical love cannot occur between men and women until there is respect and wonder for the irreducible difference of the other, and an admittance and acceptance of one’s finiteness. In the third section, in which there is no engagement with a male philosopher, Irigaray describes how the infinite is essential to love between men and women. She believes that it is unethical that women have not had access to subjectivity, and that the universals of our culture have been dominated by a male imaginary. She says that ethics requires that men and women understand themselves as embodied subjects. In the fourth and final section, Irigaray discusses Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. She argues that if ethical relationships are to occur between men and women, men must overcome nostalgia for the womb. Thus will they develop their identity, and open up a space for women to create their own. Further, Irigaray believes that we must think both otherness and divinity in conjunction with embodiment. She believes that separating mind and body is unethical insofar as it perpetuates the division in culture between man/mind and woman/body. Ethics involves thinking of otherness and divinity in terms of the sensible/transcendental. At the end of her An Ethics of Sexual Difference, it is clear that Irigaray does not believe that Western culture is ethical, and that the primary reason is its treatment of women and nature. She believes that nothing short of altering our views of subjectivity, science, and religion can change this situation. Men and women must work together to learn to respect the irreducible difference between them. Women must become full subjects, and men must recognize that they are embodied. Further, ethical love relationships are based in respect for alterity and creativity outside of reproduction. Her text I love to you, which focuses on both language and ethics, is a clear example of how her discussion of ethics can also be developed from a Hegelian perspective.
Irigaray refuses to belong to any one group in the feminist movement because she believes that there is a tendency for groups to set themselves up against each other. When groups within the women’s movement fight each other, this detracts from the overall goal of trying to positively alter the social, political, and symbolic position of women. Irigaray models solidarity among women in her unwillingness to belong exclusively to one group.
Irigaray is particularly active in the feminist movement in Italy. Texts such as I love to you, Democracy Begins Between Two, and Two Be Two were all inspired by and, at various moments, give accounts of Irigaray’s experience with the Italian women’s movement. An example of Irigaray’s most recent collaborations with Italy, and a testimony to her commitment to her ideas, is her collaboration with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna. She was invited by this region to educate its citizens about her political ideals. Her text, Democracy Begins Between Two, was a part of that collaboration insofar as it was the theoretical work behind her role as adviser. In that text she also describes how she and Renzo Imbeni co-authored a “Report on Citizenship of the Union.” This report argued for rights based on sexual difference and was submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.
Irigaray’s use of strategic essentialism has been criticized as essentialism itself-or of endorsing the belief that social behavior follows from biology. The appearance of her translated work in the United States was met with great opposition. She was read as further naturalizing women at a time when women were benefiting both politically and socially from arguing that biology did not matter. Irigaray and her supporters defended her engagement with essentialist views as a strategy. They argued that when Irigaray seeks to alter the exclusion of the feminine by repeating or reiterating naturalizing discourses about female bodies, she is not suggesting a return to a lost female body that pre-exists patriarchy. Rather, she is employing her strategy of mimesis. While many contemporary interpreters now accept this view, strategic essentialism remains a controversial aspect of Irigaray’s work.
Irigaray has been criticized-especially by materialist feminists-on the grounds that she privileges questions of psychological oppression over social/material oppression. The concern is that the psychoanalytic discourse that Irigaray relies upon-even though she is critical of it-universalizes and abstracts away from material conditions that are of central concern to feminism. Materialist feminists do not believe that definitive changes in the structure of politics can result from the changes Irigaray proposes in psychoanalytic theories of subject formation. However, Irigaray’s goal to challenge psychoanalytic theory and to change the definition of femininity evinces an agreement with the materialist position. Both agree that the ahistorical, overly universalized character of traditional psychoanalytic theory must be rejected. Further, Irigaray argues that focusing on language work and on altering allegedly intractable structures does not mean that women have to ignore material conditions. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray says that simultaneous with her challenges to the symbolic order, women must fight for equal wages, and against discrimination in employment and education. Irigaray recognizes that it is important to find ways to challenge the social and economic position in which women find themselves. But focusing exclusively on women’s material or economic situation as the key to change will only-at best-grant women access to a male social role insofar as it will not change the definition of women. Irigaray’s response to first changing material conditions would be that it would leave the question of a non-patriarchal view of female identity untouched. Due to the force of the oppression of women, it is the definitions that have to be changed before women, as distinct from men, will attain a social existence.
Related to the materialist critique is the question of whether or not Irigaray’s psychoanalytic approach can account for real differences between women. Irigaray often discusses a subject position for women and a new definition of women. A common question asked of Irigaray is whether or not a universal definition for women is desirable considering the real differences between women. More specifically, if Irigaray insists on a universal subject position for women, will it be exclusively determined by first world, white, middle class women? Can her universal successfully include the experiences of minority women, second and third world women, and economically disadvantaged women? Or does it create further exclusion among the excluded themselves? Irigaray’s interpreters remain divided on this question.
Irigaray is often criticized along with other French feminists, such as Julia Kristeva, for the opacity of her writing style. Based on her writing style, she has been dismissed as elitist. Irigaray’s writing is undeniably challenging and complex. But, the difficulty of her work can be equally productive as it is labor intensive. Irigaray’s opacity can be viewed as fruitful when understood in conjunction with one mode of writing that she assumes-that of an analyst. In this style of writing, Irigaray not only will not assume the position of a master-knower who imparts knowledge in a linear manner, she also considers her readers’ reactions to her work to be an integral part of that work. Her alleged failure to be clear, or to give a concrete, linear feminist theory, are invitations for readers to imagine their own vision for the future. Like the psychoanalytic session, her texts are a collaboration between writer (analyst) and reader (analysand). Irigaray believes that, through writing in this style, she can take culture as a whole as her analysand.
Irigaray’s view of ethics is criticized because she describes the quintessential ethical relationship using a man and a woman. The question arises of whether or not Irigaray is suggesting that the heterosexual couple is the model for ethical relationships. Since it is unclear whether or not Irigaray’s view can be applied to other types of relationships (e.g. same sex friendships or same sex love relationships), this point of criticism remains unresolved. Related to this critique is a concern that Irigaray’s emphasis on sexual difference and male/female relationships also prevent her from accounting for non-traditional family arrangements.
Irigaray’s most recent work raises the final point of controversy. In her earlier work, Irigaray refuses to give a new definition of women because she thinks that women must give it to themselves. However, in her most recent work she has developed laws that she submitted to the European Parliament for ratification. Irigaray’s interpreters debate about the relationship between her early work and her most recent texts. Is there continuity between the early and the later position? Or has Irigaray abandoned her earlier project? A spectrum of interpretations are available with no final answer.
Sarah K. Donovan
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 2, 2005 | Originally published: