Ismailism belongs to the Shi‘a main stream of Islam. Recent scholarship, based on a more judicious analysis of primary sources, has shown how Ismaili thought was in constant interaction with and to a certain extent influenced well-known currents of Islamic philosophy, theology, and mysticism.
Shi‘i and Ismaili philosophy use ta’wil as a tool of interpretation of scripture. This Qur’anic term connotes going back to the original meaning of the Qur’an. The objective of Ismaili thought is to create a bridge between Hellenic philosophy and religion. The human intellect is engaged to retrieve and disclose that which is interior or hidden (batin).
Ismailism presents a cosmology within an adapted Neoplatonic framework but tries to create an alternative synthesis. The starting point of such a synthesis is the doctrine of ibda‘ (derived from Qur’an 2:117). In its verbal form it is taken to mean ‘eternal existentiation’ to explain the notion in the Qur’an of God’s timeless command (Kun: ‘Be!’). The process of creation can be said to take place at several levels. Ibda‘ represents the initial level. The human intellect eventually relates to creation and tries to penetrate the mystery of the unknowable God.
Human history operates cyclically. The function of the Prophet is to reveal the religious law (shari‘a) while the Imam unveils gradually to his disciples the inner meaning (batin) of the revelation through the ta’wil.
Ismailism belongs to the Shi‘a branch of Islam, and, in common with various Muslim interpretive communities, has been concerned with developing a philosophical discourse to elucidate foundational Qur’anic and Islamic beliefs and principles. It would, however, be misleading to label Ismaili and other Muslim philosophical stances, as has been done by some scholars in the past, simplistically as manifestations of “Ismaili/Muslim Neoplatonism,” and “Ismaili/Muslim gnosticism,” and so forth. While elements of these philosophical and spiritual schools were certainly appropriated, and common features may be evident in the expression and development of Ismaili as well as other ideas, it must be noted that they were applied within very different historical and intellectual contexts and that such ideas came to be quite dramatically transformed in their meaning, purpose and significance in Islamic philosophy.
By those who were hostile to it or opposed its philosophical and intellectual stance, the Ismailis were regarded as heretical; legends were fabricated about them and their teachings. Early Western scholarship on Islamic philosophy inherited some of the biases of some medieval Muslim anti-philosophical stances, which tended to project a negative image of Ismailism, perceiving its philosophical contribution as having been derived from sources and tendencies ‘alien’ to Islam. Recent scholarship, based on a more judicious analysis of primary sources, provides a balanced perspective, and has shown how Ismaili thought was in constant interaction with and to a certain extent influenced well-known currents of Islamic philosophy and theology. Their views represent a consensus that it is inappropriate to treat Ismailism as a marginal school of Islamic thought; rather it constitutes a significant philosophical branch, among others, in Islamic philosophy.
Early Ismaili philosophy works dating back to the Fatimid period (fourth/tenth to sixth/twelfth century) are in Arabic; Nasir Khusraw (d. 471/1078) was the only Ismaili writer of the period to write in Persian. The Arabic tradition was continued in Yemen and India by the Musta‘li branch and in Syria by the Nizaris. In Persia and in Central Asia, the tradition was preserved and elaborated in Persian. Elsewhere among the Ismailis, local oral languages and literatures played an important part, though no strictly philosophical writings were developed in these languages.
Among the tools of interpretation of scripture that are associated particularly with Shi‘i and Ismaili philosophy is that of ta’wil. The application of this Qur’anic term, which connotes “going back to the first/the beginning,” marks the effort in Ismaili thought of creating a philosophical and hermeneutical discourse that establishes the intellectual discipline for approaching revelation and creates a bridge between philosophy and religion.
Philosophy as conceived in Ismaili thought thus seeks to extend the meaning of religion and revelation to identify the visible and the apparent (zahir) and also to penetrate to the roots, to retrieve and disclose that which is interior or hidden (batin). Ultimately, this discovery engages both the intellect (‘aql) and the spirit (ruh), functioning in an integral manner to illuminate and disclose truths (haqa’iq).
The appropriate mode of language which serves us best in this task is, according to Ismaili philosophers, symbolic language. Such language, which employs analogy, metaphor and symbols, allows one to make distinctions and to establish differences in ways that a literal reading of language does not permit. Such language employs a special system of signs, the ultimate meaning of which can be ‘unveiled’ by the proper application of hermeneutics (ta’wil).
It has been argued that Ismaili cosmology, integrates a manifestational cosmology (analogous to some aspects of Stoic thought) within an adapted Neoplatonic framework to create an alternative synthesis. The starting point of such a synthesis is the doctrine of ibda (derived from Qur’an 2:117). In its verbal form it is taken to mean ‘eternal existentiation’ to explain the notion in the Qur’an of God’s timeless command (Kun: Be!). Ibda therefore connotes not a specific act of creation but the dialogical mode through which a relationship between God and His creation can be affirmed – it articulates the process of beginning and sets the stage for developing a philosophy of the manifestation of transcendence in creation.
In sum the process of creation can be said to take place at several levels. Ibda represents the initial level – one transcends history, the other creates it. The spiritual and material realms are not dichotomous, since in the Ismaili formulation, matter and spirit are united under a higher genus and each realm possesses its own hierarchy. Though they require linguistic and rational categories for definition, they represent elements of a whole, and a true understanding of God must also take account of His creation. Such a synthesis is crucial to how the human intellect eventually relates to creation and how it ultimately becomes the instrument for penetrating through history the mystery of the unknowable God implied in the formulation of tawhid.
Human history, as conceived in Ismailism, operates cyclically. According to this typological view, the epoch of the great prophets mirrors the cosmological paradigm, unfolding to recover the equilibrium and harmony inherent in the divine pattern of creation. Prophets and, after them, their appointed successors, the imams, have as their collective goal the establishment of a just society. The function of the Prophet is to initiate the cycle for human society and of the Imam to complement and interpret the teaching to sustain the just order at the social and individual levels.
As Nasir Khusraw, the best known of the Ismaili writers in Persian, states in a passage paraphrased by Corbin:
Time is eternity measured by the movements of the heavens,
whose name is day, night, month, year. Eternity is Time not
measured, having neither beginning nor end…The cause of Time
is the Soul of the World….; it is not in time, for time is
in the horizon of the soul as its instrument, as the duration
of the living mortal who is “the shadow of the soul”, while
eternity is the duration of the living immortal – that is to
say of the Intelligence and of the Soul.
This synthesis of time as cycle and time as arrow lies at the heart of an Ismaili philosophy of active engagement in the world.
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
Last updated: July 1, 2005 | Originally published: