Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743-1819)

German philosopher; born at Dusseldorf January. 25,1743; died at Munich March. 10, 1819. He studied at Frankfort and Geneva, and in 1764 became the head of his father's business in Dusseldorf. After his appointment to the council for the duchies of Julich and Berg in 1772 he devoted himself entirely to literature and philosophy. His house at Pempelfort, near Dusseldorf, became the meeting-place of distinguished literary men. Among his more intimate friends were Wieland, Hamann, Herder, Lessing, and Goethe. On account of the political agitation of the time he went to Holstein in 1794. During the next ten years he resided chiefly at Wandsbeek, Hamburg, and Eutin. In 1804 he accepted a call to Munich in connection with the proposed Academy of Sciences there. He was president of the academy from its opening in 1807 till 1812. His writings are characterized by poetic fancy and religious sentiment rather than by logical necessity. He held that the understanding can only join and disjoin given facts, without explaining them, and that knowledge deduced in this way is conditioned and relatively unimportant, being always related to a background of existence which forever remains beyond abstract thinking. All demonstrable knowledge, therefore, is relative and conditioned; it does not touch the ultimate nature of things. The faculty by which we grasp ultimate facts is not the understanding, but faith, which Jacobi identified with reason. It was Jacobi who first pointed out the fatal contradiction involved in Kant's application of the category of causality to the Ding an Sich. His doctrine of the relativity of knowledge was later exploited by Sir William Hamilton. Jacobi's principal works are the two philosophical novels, Woldmwr (2 vols., Flensburg, 1779) and Eduard Allwills Briefsamlung (Breslau, 1781); Ueber die Lehre der Spinoza (1785; enlarged ed., 1789); Dazid Hunw fiber den Glauben, oder Ide-alis;nus und Realismus (1787), containing his criticism of Kant; Ueber das Unternehmen des Kritizismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen (Hamburg, 1801); and Von den gottlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung (Leipsic, 1811), which was directed against Schelling. During his last years Jacobi was employed in collecting and editing his Werke (6 vols., Leipsic, 1812-24). His Auserlesener Briefwechsel was edited by F. Roth (2 vols., 1825-27).

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