Jainism is properly the name of one of the religious traditions that have their origin in the Indian subcontinent. According to its own traditions, the teachings of Jainism are eternal, and hence have no founder; however, the Jainism of this age can be traced back to Mahavira, a teacher of the sixth century BCE, a contemporary of the Buddha. Like those of the Buddha, Mahavira’s doctrines were formulated as a reaction to and rejection of the Brahmanism (religion based on the Hindu scriptures, the Vedas and Upanisads) then taking shape. The brahmans taught the division of society into rigidly delineated castes, and a doctrine of reincarnation guided by karma, or merit brought about by the moral qualities of actions. Their schools of thought, since they respected the authority of the Vedas and Upanisads, were known as orthodox darsanas (‘darsanas‘ means literally, ‘views’). Jainism and Buddhism, along with a school of materialists called Carvaka, were regarded as the unorthodox darsanas, because they taught that the Vedas and Upanisads, and hence the brahman caste, had no authority.
According to Jain thought, the basic constituents of reality are souls (jiva), matter (pudgala), motion (dharma), rest (adharma), space (akasa), and time (kala). Space is understood to be infinite in all directions, but not all of space is inhabitable. A finite region of space, usually described as taking the shape of a standing man with arms akimbo, is the only region of space that can contain anything. This is so because it is the only region of space that is pervaded with dharma, the principle of motion (adharma is not simply the absence of dharma, but rather a principle that causes objects to stop moving). The physical world resides in the narrow part of the middle of inhabitable space. The rest of the inhabitable universe may contain gods or other spirits.
While Jainism is dualistic—that is, matter and souls are thought to be entirely different types of substance—it is frequently said to be atheistic. What is denied is a creator god above all. The universe is eternal, matter and souls being equally uncreated. The universe contains gods who may be worshipped for various reasons, but there is no being outside it exercising control over it. The gods and other superhuman beings are all just as subject to karma and rebirth as human beings are. By their actions, souls accumulate karma, which is understood to be a kind of matter, and that accumulation draws them back into a body after death. Hence, all souls have undergone an infinite number of previous lives, and—with the exception of those who win release from the bondage of karma—will continue to reincarnate, each new life determined by the kind and amount of karma accumulated. Release is achieved by purging the soul of all karma, good and bad.
Every living thing has a soul, so every living thing can be harmed or helped. For purposes of assessing the worth of actions (see Ethics, below), living things are classified in a hierarchy according to the kinds of senses they have; the more senses a being has, the more ways it can be harmed or helped. Plants, various one-celled animals, and ‘elemental’ beings (beings made of one of the four elements—earth, air, fire, or water) have only one sense, the sense of touch. Worms and many insects have the senses of touch and taste. Other insects, like ants and lice, have those two senses plus the sense of smell. Flies and bees, along with other higher insects, also have sight. Human beings, along with birds, fish, and most terrestrial animals, have all five senses. This complete set of senses (plus, according to some Jain thinkers, a separate faculty of consciousness) makes all kinds of knowledge available to human beings, including knowledge of the human condition and the need for liberation from rebirth.
Underlying Jain epistemology is the idea that reality is multifaceted (anekanta, or ‘non-one-sided’), such that no one view can capture it in its entirety; that is, no single statement or set of statements captures the complete truth about the objects they describe. This insight, illustrated by the famous story of the blind men trying to describe an elephant, grounds both a kind of fallibilism in epistemology and a sevenfold classification of statements in logic.
Every school of Indian thought includes some judgment about the valid sources of knowledge (pramanas). While their lists of pramanas differ, they share a concern to capture the common-sense view; no Indian school is skeptical. The Jain list of pramanas includes sense perception, valid testimony (including scriptures), extra-sensory perception, telepathy, and kevala, the state of omniscience of a perfected soul. Notably absent from the list is inference, which most other Indian schools include, but Jain discussion of the pramanas seem to indicate that inference is included by implication in the pramana that provides the premises for inference. That is, inference from things learned by the senses is itself knowledge gained from the senses; inference from knowledge gained by testimony is itself knowledge gained by testimony, etc. Later Jain thinkers would add inference as a separate category, along with memory and tarka, the faculty by which we recognize logical relations.
Since reality is multi-faceted, none of the pramanas gives absolute or perfect knowledge (except kevala, which is enjoyed only by the perfected soul, and cannot be expressed in language). As a result, any item of knowledge gained is only tentative and provisional. This is expressed in Jain philosophy in the doctrine of naya, or partial predication (sometimes called the doctrine of perspectives or viewpoints). According to this doctrine, any judgment is true only from the viewpoint or perspective of the judge, and ought to be so expressed. Given the multifaceted nature of reality, no one should take his or her own judgments as the final truth about the matter, excluding all other judgments. This insight generates a sevenfold classification of predications. The seven categories of claim can be schematized as follows, where ‘a’ represents any arbitrarily selected object, and ‘F’ represents some predicate assertible of it:
Each predication is preceded by a marker of uncertainty (syat), which I have rendered here as ‘perhaps.’ Some render it as ‘from a perspective,’ or ‘somehow.’ However it is translated, it is intended to mark respect for the multifaceted nature of reality by showing a lack of conclusive certainty.
Early Jain philosophical works (especially the Tattvartha Sutra) indicate that for any object and any predicate, all seven of these predications are true. That is to say, for every object a and every predicate F, there is some circumstance in which, or perspective from which, it is correct to make claims of each of these forms. These seven categories of predication are not to be understood as seven truth-values, since they are all seven thought to be true. Historically, this view has been criticized (by Sankara, among others) on the obvious ground of inconsistency. While both a proposition and its negation may well be assertible, it seems that the conjunction, being a contradiction, can never be even assertible, never mind true, and so the third and seventh forms of predication are never possible. This is precisely the kind of consideration that leads some commentators to understand the ‘syat’ operator to mean ‘from a perspective.’ Since it may well be that from one perspective, a is F, and from another, a is not-F, then one and the same person can appreciate those facts and assert them both together. Given the multifaceted nature of the real, every object is in one way F, and in another way not-F. An appreciation of the complexity of the real also can lead one to see that objects are, as they are in themselves, indescribable (as no description can capture their entirety). This yields the fourth form of predication, which can then be combined with other insights to yield the last three forms.
Perhaps the deepest problem with this doctrine is one that troubles all forms of skepticism and fallibilism to one degree or another; it seems to be self-defeating. After all, if reality is multifaceted, and that keeps us from making absolute judgments (since my judgment and its negation will both be equally true), the doctrines that underlie Jain epistemology are themselves equally tentative. For example, take the doctrine of anekantevada. According to that doctrine, reality is so complex that any claim about it will necessarily fall short of complete accuracy. The doctrine itself must then fall short of complete accuracy. Therefore, we should say, “Perhaps (or “from a perspective”) reality is multifaceted.” At the same time, we have to grant the propriety, in some circumstances, of saying, “Perhaps reality is not multifaceted.” Jain epistemology gains assertibility for its own doctrine, but at the cost of being unable to deny contradictory doctrines. What begins as a laudable fallibilism ends as an untenable relativism.
Given that the proper goal for a Jain is release from death and rebirth, and rebirth is caused by the accumulation of karma, all Jain ethics aims at purging karma that has been accumulated, and ceasing to accumulate new karma. Like Buddhists and Hindus, Jains believe that good karma leads to better circumstances in the next life, and bad karma to worse. However, since they conceive karma to be a material substance that draws the soul back into the body, all karma, both good and bad, leads to rebirth in the body. No karma can help a person achieve liberation from rebirth. Karma comes in different kinds, according to the kind of actions and intentions that attract it. In particular, it comes from four basic sources: (1) attachment to worldly things, (2) the passions, such as anger, greed, fear, pride, etc., (3) sensual enjoyment, and (4) ignorance, or false belief. Only the first three have a directly ethical or moral upshot, since ignorance is cured by knowledge, not by moral action.
The moral life, then, is in part the life devoted to breaking attachments to the world, including attachments to sensual enjoyment. Hence, the moral ideal in Jainism is an ascetic ideal. Monks (who, as in Buddhism, live by stricter rules than laymen) are constrained by five cardinal rules, the “five vows”: (1) ahimsa, frequently translated “non-violence,” or “non-harming,” satya, or truthfulness, asteya, not taking anything that is not given, brahmacharya, chastity, and aparigraha, detachment. This list differs from the rules binding on Buddhists only in that Buddhism requires abstention from intoxicants, and has no separate rule against attachment to the things of the world. The cardinal rule of interaction with other jivas is the rule of ahimsa. This is because harming other jivas is caused by either passions like anger, or ignorance of their nature as living beings. Consequently, Jains are required to be vegetarians. According to the earliest Jain documents, plants both are and contain living beings, although one-sensed beings, so even a vegetarian life does harm. This is why the ideal way to end one’s life, for a Jain, is to sit motionless and starve to death. Mahavira himself, and other great Jain saints, are said to have died this way. That is the only way to be sure you are doing no harm to any living being.
While it may seem that this code of behavior is not really moral, since it is aimed at a specific reward for the agent—and is therefore entirely self-interested—it should be noted that the same can be said of any religion-based moral code. Furthermore, like the Hindus and Buddhists, Jains believe that the only reason that personal advantage accrues to moral behavior is that the very structure of the universe, in the form of the law of karma, makes it so.
Mark Owen Webb
Texas Tech University
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 1, 2005 | Originally published: