Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

William James (1842-1910)

William James is considered by many to be the most insightful and stimulating of American philosophers, as well as the second of the three great pragmatists (the middle link between Charles Sanders Peirce and John Dewey).  As a professor of psychology and of philosophy at Harvard University, he became the most famous living American psychologist and later the most famous living American philosopher of his time.  Avoiding the logically tight systems typical of European rationalists, such as the German idealists, he cobbled together a psychology rich in philosophical implications and a philosophy enriched by his psychological expertise.  More specifically, his theory of the self and his view of human belief as oriented towards conscious action raised issues that required him to turn to philosophy.  There he developed his pragmatic epistemology, which considers the meaning of ideas and the truth of beliefs not abstractly, but in terms of the practical difference they can make in people’s lives.  He explored the implications of this theory in areas of religious belief, metaphysics, human freedom and moral values, and social philosophy. His contributions in these areas included critiques of long-standing philosophical positions on such issues as freedom vs. determinism, correspondence vs. coherence, and dualism vs. materialism, as well as a thorough analysis of a phenomenological understanding of the self and consciousness, a “forward-looking” conception of truth (based on validation and revisable experience), a thorough-going metaphysical pluralism, and a commitment to a full view of agency in connection with communal and social concerns. Thus he created one of the last great philosophical systems in Western thought, even if he did not live quite long enough to complete every aspect of it. The combination of his provocative ideas and his engaging writing style has contributed to the enduring impact of his work.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophical Psychology
    1. The Stream of Consciousness and the Self
    2. Sensation, Perception, Imagination, and Belief
    3. Emotion and Will
  3. Epistemology
    1. The Pragmatic Method
    2. The Pragmatic Theory of Truth
    3. The Pragmatic Approach to Belief
  4. Philosophy of Religion
    1. The Will to Believe in God
    2. The Varieties of Religious Experience
    3. James’s Own Religious Views
  5. Metaphysics
    1. Realms of Reality
    2. The Philosophical Importance of Metaphysics
    3. Monism vs. Pluralism
  6. Freedom and Morality
    1. Human Freedom
    2. Moral Responsibility
    3. The Meaningfulness of Life
  7. Social Philosophy
    1. Individuals and Their Communities
    2. War and Peace
    3. Democratic Tolerance and Social Progress
  8. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Works

Born in New York City on January 11, 1842, William James was the oldest of the five children of Henry James, Sr., and Mary Walsh James.  His oldest brother, Henry James, Jr., the renowned writer of fiction, was followed by two other brothers and a sister.  The family frequently moved between America and Europe, the father having inherited an amount of money sufficient to allow him to enjoy the life of an intellectual.  While growing up, William had a passion for drawing.  Since he wanted to become a painter, the family moved to Newport, Rhode Island in 1860, where William studied with the leading American portraitist, William Morris Hunt.  Although he had talent, he gave up this career goal in less than a year.  He had decided that it was insufficient for him to do first-rate work.  All this is indicative of three things:  the family’s remarkable support for his aspirations; his own quest to achieve excellence; and his restless, indecisive difficulty in remaining committed to a career path.

In 1861, the American Civil War erupted.  In response to President Lincoln’s call for volunteers, James committed himself to a short-term enlistment.  However, already in delicate health, he left when it expired after three months.  (His younger brothers Wilky and Bob served in the Union Army.)  He then enrolled in the Lawrence Scientific School at Harvard University, his family moving to Boston.  There he studied chemistry and then physiology, prior to his entering Harvard’s Medical School in 1863.  A couple of years later, he took a year off to join a scientific expedition to Brazil, led by Louis Agassiz.  But bad health eventually forced him to quit the expedition, and he returned to medical school (the James family moving from Boston to Cambridge, Massachusetts).   Again he left, this time to study physiology and medicine in Germany and to recover his health.  He failed to find a cure for his curious back pains, but returned to Harvard, passed his medical exams, and received his medical degree in 1869.  Nevertheless, he did not plan to practice medicine and seemed lost as to what to do with the rest of his life.

By the end of that same year, James’s neurological symptoms had become worse.  His training in hard science was making it impossible for him to believe in human freedom and, thus, in the value of struggling for moral ideals; the despair of materialism was leading him to the depression of determinism.  In a barely disguised case history in his Varieties of Religious Experience, he tells of visiting an asylum while he was a medical student, and seeing an epileptic patient whose condition had reduced him to an idiotic state.  James could not dispel the realization that if universal determinism prevails, he could likewise sink into such a state, utterly incapable of preventing it (Varieties, pp. 135-136).  His dread over the sense of life’s absolute insecurity pushed him to become a virtual invalid in his parents’ home.  He considered suicide.  By the spring of 1870, when James was twenty-eight years old, he experienced a critical moment while reading a treatment of human freedom by the French neo-Kantian Charles Renouvier.  He discovered the solution to his problem in the voluntaristic act of will whereby he could commit himself to believing in his own freedom despite any lack of objective evidence.  He started down the road to recovery, though the remainder of his life would be plagued by seemingly psychosomatic troubles (serious eye strain, mysterious back pains, digestive problems, and periods of exhaustion, as well as chronic mood swings, including times of brooding depression).  Unfortunately, he still lacked a constructive career goal.

In 1872, one of James’s former chemistry professors, now Harvard’s President, offered him a job teaching physiology.  He accepted and began his career of more than a third of a century as a faculty member there.  The next year, he became an instructor of anatomy and physiology.  By the mid-eighteen-seventies, he was teaching psychology there, using the physiological approach he had learned in Germany and establishing the first psychology laboratory in America.  He met a schoolteacher named Alice Howe Gibbens, whom he married in 1878.  Like his parents, they had five children, naming the first two Henry and William.  Alice was adept at handling his neurotic obsessions and emotional moodiness, and they seem to have had a good marriage, living comfortably in Cambridge.  The year they married, James agreed to write a psychology textbook; however, by then he was already drifting away from psychology into philosophy.  He was a member of a Metaphysical Club that included Oliver Wendell Holmes, who taught law at Harvard and would go on to serve on the U. S. Supreme Court, and Charles Sanders Peirce, a philosopher of science, who would become the founder of American pragmatism.  In 1879, James began teaching philosophy at Harvard, becoming an assistant professor of philosophy the next year.  He published “The Sentiment of Rationality,” his first important article in his new discipline.  As he got deeper into philosophy, he developed a negative attitude towards psychology.  After becoming a full professor of philosophy in 1885 and of psychology in 1889, he published his Principles of Psychology in 1890.  It had taken him close to twelve years to finish it, and, though it would be extremely successful, he was dissatisfied with it and disgusted with psychology (Letters, vol. 1, pp. 294, 296, & vol. 2, pp. 2-3).  Nevertheless, he agreed to prepare an abridged version, which was published two years later as Psychology:  Briefer Course; it too would be widely used and help to establish his reputation as the foremost living American psychologist.  He resigned his directorship of Harvard’s psychology lab and committed himself to teaching and writing philosophy.

In 1897, James’s first philosophical book, The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, was published, dedicated to Charles Sanders Peirce.  The following year, at the University of California at Berkeley, he delivered a lecture, “Philosophical Conceptions and Practical Results,” which helped to launch pragmatism as a nationwide philosophical movement.  In 1899, his Talks to Teachers on Psychology and to Students on Some of Life’s Ideals was published.  Overworked at Harvard and jeopardizing his fragile health, he suffered a physical breakdown that same year.  While recovering his health, he studied a wide range of accounts of religious experience and prepared his Gifford Lectures, which he delivered at the University of Edinburgh in 1901-02.  These were published as The Varieties of Religious Experience in 1902 and proved to be quite successful, although James himself was displeased, believing them to contain too much reporting on facts and too little philosophical analysis.

For the remainder of his life, James focused on the development of his own philosophy, writing essays and lectures that would later be collected and published in four books.  In the spring of 1906, he took a leave of absence from Harvard to take a visiting professorship at Stanford University, though his lecture series in California was interrupted by the great San Francisco earthquake.  In late 1906 and early 1907, he delivered his lectures on Pragmatism in Boston and at Columbia University, publishing them in the spring of 1907.  That was also the year he resigned from Harvard, worried that he might die before being able to complete his philosophical system, as he was suffering from angina and shortness of breath.  He delivered the Hibbert Lectures in England in 1908, published the next year as A Pluralistic Universe, aimed at combating the neo-Hegelian idealism that was then prevalent in Great Britain.  Meanwhile, he was under intellectual assault by mainstream philosophers for his pragmatic treatment of truth, which he defended in a collection of essays published in 1909 as The Meaning of Truth.

By the next year, James’s heart trouble left him so plagued by fatigue that normal activities became quite difficult.  He was attempting to complete his textbook on Some Problems of Philosophy, but died on August 26, 1910.  In 1911, his textbook, edited by his son Henry, and his Memories and Studies were posthumously published.  In 1912, his Essays in Radical Empiricism was published, followed, in 1920, by some of his Collected Essays and Reviews and The Letters of William James, edited in two volumes by his son Henry.  His writings have survived in part because of the provocative honesty of his ideas, but also because of the vibrant, sometimes racy, style in which he expressed them.  In A Pluralistic Universe, he castigates philosophers who use technical jargon instead of clear, straightforward language.  He practiced the spontaneous thinking and freshness of expression he advocates there (Universe, pp. 129-130).  It has been said (by the novelist Rebecca West) that, while Henry James wrote fiction as though it were philosophy, his older brother, William, wrote philosophy in a colorful style typical of fiction.

2. Philosophical Psychology

By the early 1890s, when James published his two books on psychology, the discipline was in the process of splitting off from philosophical speculation (“psychology” literally means  “the study of the soul”) to establish itself as an empirical social science.  Despite impatience with the process of that development, he contributed significantly to moving it along, regarding psychology as the science of our mental phenomena or states of consciousness, such as thoughts, feelings, desires, volitions, and so forth.

a. The Stream of Consciousness and the Self

In analyzing what can broadly be termed human thinking, James delineates five generic characteristics:  (1) all thought is owned by some personal self; (2) all thought, as experienced by human consciousness, is constantly in flux and never static; (3) nevertheless, there is an ongoing continuity of thought for every thinker, as it moves from one object to another (like the alternating times of flight and perching in a bird’s life), constantly comprising shifting foci and the contextual fringes within which they are given; (4) thought typically deals with objects different from and independent of consciousness itself, so that two minds can experience common objects; and (5) consciousness takes an interest in particular objects, choosing to focus on them rather than on others (Principles, vol. 1, pp. 224-226, 236-237, 239, 243, 258-259, 271-272, 284; Psychology, pp. 152-154, 157-160, 166-167, 170).  The self can be viewed as an object of thought or as the subject of thought.  The former is the empirical self or “me,” while the latter is the pure ego or “I.”  The dimensions of the empirical self (“me”) include the “material” self (comprised of one’s body and such extensions of it as one’s clothing, immediate family, and home), the “social” self (or significant interpersonal relations), and the “spiritual” self (one’s personality, character, and defining values).  The pure ego (“I”), identifiable with the soul of traditional metaphysics, cannot be an object of science and should not be assumed to be a substance (Principles, vol. 1, pp. 291-294, 296, 319, 343-344, 348, 350; Psychology, pp. 176-181, 194, 196, 198, 200, 202-203, 215-216).

b. Sensation, Perception, Imagination, and Belief

James states that if we track the dynamic of mental activity, we discern a standard pattern from sensation to perception to imagination to belief.  Through sensation, we become acquainted with some given fact.  This can, but need not, lead to knowledge about that fact, achieved by perceiving its relations to other given facts.  Both sensation and perception involve an immediate intuition of some given objects.  Imagination, less immediate, retrieves mental copies of past sensations and perceptions, even when their external stimuli are no longer present.  Belief is the sense or feeling that ideas or propositions formed in the imagination correspond to reality.  Every proposition can be analyzed in terms of its object and whether that object is believed.  The object of a proposition comprises a subject (such as my horse), a predicate (wings), and a relation between them (my horse has sprouted wings).  The belief is the psychic attitude a mind has towards that object (for example, I believe it or deny it or am in doubt about it) (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 1-3, 44, 76-77, 82-83, 283-284, 287-290; Psychology, pp. 12-14, 302, 312, 316-317).

c. Emotion and Will

Like other animals, we have primitive instincts, such as fear, some desires, and certain forms of sympathy, which do not require being taught them or consciously focusing on ends.  However, we also have emotions that are learned behavior and do involve such a focus—for example, a fear of failure and the desire for an academic degree.  Instincts and emotions thus overlap, the latter tending to cover a broader range of objects than the former.  We tend to assume that perceptions trigger emotional responses, eventuating in bodily expressions—that we suddenly see a bear, become frightened, and then tremble and run away.  But James thinks the actual sequence is perception, followed by bodily expressions, followed by emotional feeling—that we see the bear, tremble and run away, then feel those physical events as what we call fear.  The idea that emotions ultimately have physical causes emphasizes the intimate relationship between our bodies and our mental life (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 383, 410, 442, 449-453, 467; Psychology, pp. 391, 375-376, 378-381).

The human will is crucial for deliberately acting on our beliefs and emotions.  Sometimes we consider alternative courses of action and seem to select one among them, as if making a voluntary decision.  James maps out five sorts of decision-making:  (1) the reasonable sort, whereby we accede to rational arguments; (2) the sort that is triggered by external circumstances, such as overhearing a rumor; (3) the sort that is prompted by our submission to something within ourselves, such as a habit formed by past actions; (4) the sort that results from a sudden change of mood such as might be caused by a feeling of grief; and (5) the rare sort that is a consequence of our own voluntary choice, which will be identified as the “will to believe.”  Whether we have free will or not is a metaphysical issue that cannot be scientifically determined (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 486-488, 528, 531-534, 572-573; Psychology, pp. 415, 419-420, 428-434, 456-457).

3. Epistemology

Even if philosophically interesting matters such as freedom vs. determinism cannot be scientifically resolved, some sort of epistemological methodology is needed if we are to avoid arbitrary conclusions.  Whatever approach is chosen, it is clear that James repudiates rationalism, with its notions of a priori existential truths.  He is particularly hostile to German idealism, which he identifies especially with Hegel and which he attacks in many of his essays (this identification leads him to be remarkably unfair to Kant, an earlier German idealist).  As he makes clear in “The Sentiment of Rationality,” the personality of the would-be knower and various practical concerns are far too relevant to allow for such abstract intellectualism.  The tradition of modern empiricism is more promising, yet too atomistic to allow us to move much beyond the knowledge of acquaintance to genuine comprehension (Will, pp. 63-67, 70, 75-77, 82-86, 89, 92).  Fortunately, James had already learned about the pragmatic approach from Peirce.

a. The Pragmatic Method

James’s book of lectures on Pragmatism is arguably the most influential book of American philosophy.  The first of its eight lectures presents pragmatism as a more attractive middle ground between the two mainstream approaches of European philosophy.  The “tender-minded” approach tends to be rationalistic, intellectualistic, idealistic, optimistic, religious, committed to freedom, monistic, and dogmatic; by contrast, the “tough-minded” approach tends to be empirical, grounded in sensations, materialistic, pessimistic, irreligious, fatalistic, pluralistic, and skeptical.  It is difficult to identify many pure types of either of these in the history of philosophy, and some thinkers (such as Kant) are deliberately mixed, as is James himself.  He thinks that most of us want a philosophical method that is firmly anchored in empirical facts, while being open to, rather than dismissive of, moral and religious values.  He offers pragmatism as a philosophy that coherently meets both demands.  James’s second lecture is committed to showing how the pragmatic method helps us establish meaning by making it a function of practical consequences (the word “pragmatic” means having to do with action and is etymologically related to our English word “practical”).  Before we invest much time or effort in seeking the meaning of anything, we should consider what practical difference it would make if we could find out.  Providing an example to illustrate his point, James refers to the Hegelian notion of God as the all-encompassing Absolute Spirit.  How should we decide whether this is what we should mean by God?  Consider the practical consequences for a believer:  on the one hand, it would provide us with the optimistic, comforting assurance that everything will work out for the best; but, on the other, it also undermines the values of human individuality, freedom, and responsibility.  From that pragmatic perspective, James rejects the Hegelian notion.  Undoubtedly, philosophy provides us with only one legitimate approach to belief, as he observes in his fifth lecture, others being common sense (with its basic concepts derived from experience) and science.  However, these others are impotent in dealing with questions of freedom and value (Pragmatism, pp. 10-13, 18, 26-28, 30-38, 79-80, 83-85).

b. The Pragmatic Theory of Truth

It seems that anything knowable must be true.  But what does it mean to call a proposition or belief “true” from the perspective of pragmatism?  This is the subject of James’s famous sixth lecture.  He begins with a standard dictionary analysis of truth as agreement with reality.  Accepting this, he warns that pragmatists and intellectualists will disagree over how to interpret the concepts of “agreement” and “reality,” the latter thinking that ideas copy what is fixed and independent of us.  By contrast, he advocates a more dynamic and practical interpretation, a true idea or belief being one we can incorporate into our ways of thinking in such a way that it can be experientially validated.  For James, the “reality” with which truths must agree has three dimensions:  (1) matters of fact, (2) relations of ideas (such as the eternal truths of mathematics), and (3) the entire set of other truths to which we are committed.  To say that our truths must “agree” with such realities pragmatically means that they must lead us to useful consequences.  He is a fallibilist, seeing all existential truths as, in theory, revisable given new experience.  They involve a relationship between facts and our ideas or beliefs.  Because the facts, and our experience of them, change we must beware of regarding such truths as absolute, as rationalists tend to do (Pragmatism, pp. 91-97, 100-101).  This relativistic theory generated a firestorm of criticism among mainstream philosophers to which he responded in The Meaning of Truth.

c. The Pragmatic Approach to Belief

Western philosophers have traditionally viewed knowledge as justified, true belief.  So long as the idea of truth is pragmatically analyzed and given a pragmatic interpretation of justification, James seems to accept that view.  His entire philosophy can be seen as fundamentally one of productive beliefs.  All inquiry must terminate in belief or disbelief or doubt; disbelief is merely a negative belief and doubt is the true opposite of both.  Believing in anything involves conceiving of it as somehow real; when we dismiss something as unreal (disbelief), it is typically because it somehow contradicts what we think of as real.  Some of our most fundamental and valuable beliefs do not seem sufficiently justified to be regarded as known.  These “postulates of rationality” include the convictions that every event is caused and that the world as a whole is rationally intelligible (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 283-284, 288-290, 670-672, 675, 677).  As he holds in “The Sentiment of Rationality,” to say that such beliefs, however crucial, are not known, is to admit that, though they involve a willingness to act on them, doubt as to their truth still seems theoretically possible.  He identifies four postulates of rationality as value-related, but unknowable, matters of belief; these are God, immortality, freedom, and moral duty (Will, pp. 90, 95).  He proceeds to deal with each of them individually.

4. Philosophy of Religion

James is arguably the most significant American philosopher of religion in intellectual history, and many of his writings, in addition to the obligatory “Will to Believe” essay and his book on The Varieties of Religious Experience, offer provocative insights into that area.

a. The Will to Believe in God

Because we do not naturally experience the supernatural, James, the radical empiricist, thinks of faith in God as falling short of knowledge.  Yet such faith is pragmatically meaningful to many people, and it is reasonable to wonder whether, how, and to what extent it can be justified.  For James, the logical philosopher trained in science, both logic and science have limits beyond which we can legitimately seek the sentiment of rationality.  His notorious “Will to Believe” essay is designed to be a defense of religious faith in the absence of conclusive logical argumentation or scientific evidence.  It focuses on what he calls a “genuine option,” which is a choice between two hypotheses, which the believer can regard as “living” (personally meaningful), “forced” (mutually exclusive), and “momentous” (involving potentially important consequences).  Whether an option is “genuine” is thus relative to the perspective of a particular believer.  James acknowledges that in our scientific age, there is something dubious about the voluntaristic view that, in some circumstances, we can legitimately choose to believe in the absence of any objective justification.  However, he claims we naturally do so all the time, our moral and political ideas being obvious examples.  When you believe that your mother loves you or in the sincerity of your best friend, you have no conclusively objective evidence.  In addition, you will never be able to secure such evidence.  Yet it often seems unreasonable to refuse to commit to believing such matters; if we did so, the pragmatic consequences would be a more impoverished social life.  Indeed, in some cases, believing and acting on that belief can help increase the chances of the belief being true.  Now let us apply this argument to religious belief.  What does religion in general propose for our belief?  The two-pronged answer is that ultimate reality is most valuable and that we are better off if we believe that.  Committing to that two-pronged belief is meaningful, as is the refusal to do so.  At any given moment, I must either make that two-pronged commitment or not; and how I experience this life, as well as prospects for a possible after-life, may be at stake.  Whether one makes that commitment or not, pragmatic consequences can be involved.  Nor should we imagine that we could avoid having to make a choice, as the commitment not to commit is itself a commitment (Will, pp. 1-4, 7-9, 11-14, 22-30; see also Problems, pp. 221-224).

b. The Varieties of Religious Experience

If religious faith is not to be reduced to arbitrary whimsy (the “will to make believe”), it must rest on some sort of personal experience.  As psychologist and philosopher, James deliberately defines “religion” broadly as the experiences of human individuals insofar as they see themselves related to whatever they regard as divine.  This definition indicates that religion does not require faith in a transcendent, monotheistic God, and that it does not mandate the social dimension of religious community.  James distinguishes between “healthy-mindedness” and the “sick soul” as two extreme types of religious consciousness, the former being characterized by optimistic joy and the latter by a morbid pessimism.  In between these extremes are “the divided self” and the stable, well-integrated believer.  James develops lengthy analyses of religious conversion, saintliness, and mysticism.  In going beyond these, he considers what philosophy might contribute to establishing “over-beliefs” regarding the existence and nature of the divine.  He critically considers traditional arguments for God—the cosmological argument, the argument from design, the moral argument, and the argument from popular consensus—finding none of them particularly cogent, but exhibiting the most respect for the argument from design.  He likewise weighs in the balance and finds wanting arguments for metaphysical and moral divine attributes, finding the latter of more pragmatic relevance to human values, choices, and behavior than the former.  In his final lecture, he draws conclusions regarding three beliefs that experience finds in religions in general:  (1) that our sensible world is part of and derives its significance from a greater spiritual order; (2) that our purpose is fulfilled by achieving harmonious union with it; and (3) that prayer and spiritual communion are efficacious.  Furthermore, religions typically involve two psychological qualities in their believers:  (1) an energetic zest for living; and (2) a sense of security, love, and peace.  Given that thought and feeling both determine conduct, James thinks that different religions are similar in feeling and conduct, their doctrines being more variable, but less essential.  Most generally, these doctrines attempt to diagnose a fundamental uneasiness about our natural state and to prescribe a solution whereby we might be saved (Varieties, pp. 42, 83, 121, 124, 137, 142, 145-147, 330, 334-341, 367, 380-383).

c. James’s Own Religious Views

Although James is somewhat vague regarding his own religious “over-beliefs,” they can be pieced together from various passages.  He believes there is more to reality than our natural world and that this unseen realm generates practical effects in this world.  If we call the supreme being “God,” then we have reason to think the interpersonal relationship between God and humans is dynamic and that God provides us with a guarantee that the moral values we strive to realize will somehow survive us.  James describes himself as a supernaturalist (rather than a materialist) of a sort less refined than idealists and as unable to subscribe to popular Christianity.  He is unwilling to assume that God is one or infinite, even contemplating the polytheistic notion that the divine is a collection of godlike selves (Varieties, pp. 384-386, 388-390, 392-393, 395-396).  In “The Dilemma of Determinism,” James depicts his image of God with a memorable analogy, comparing God to a master chess player engaged in a give-and-take with us novices.  We are free to make our own moves; yet the master knows all the moves we could possibly make, the odds of our choosing one over the others, and how best to respond to any move we choose to make.  This indicates two departures from the traditional Judeo-Christian concept of God, in that the master is interacting with us in time (rather than eternal) and does not know everything in the future, to the extent that it is freely chosen by us.  In “Reflex Action and Theism,” James subscribes to a theistic belief in a personal God with whom we can maintain interpersonal relations, who possesses the deepest power in reality (not necessarily omnipotent) and a mind (not omniscient).  We can love and respect God to the extent that we are committed to the pursuit of common values.  In “Is Life Worth Living?” James even suggests that God may derive strength and energy from our collaboration (Will, pp. 181-182, 116, 122, 141, 61).  Elsewhere, rejecting the Hegelian notion of God as an all-encompassing Absolute, he subscribes to a God that is finite in knowledge or in power or in both, one that acts in time and has a history and an environment, like us (Universe, pp. 269, 272; see Letters, vol. 2, pp. 213-215, for James’s responses to a 1904 questionnaire regarding his personal religious beliefs).

5. Metaphysics

a. Realms of Reality

In contrast to monists such as Hegel, James believes in multiple worlds, specifying seven realms of reality we can experience:  (1) the realm that serves as the touchstone of reality for most of us is the world of physical objects of sense experience; (2) the world of science, things understood in terms of physical forces and laws of nature, is available to the educated; (3) philosophy and mathematics expose us to a world of abstract truth and ideal relations; (4) as humans, we are all subject to the distortions of commonplace illusion and prejudices; (5) our cultures expose us to the realms of mythology and fiction; (6) each of us has his or her own subjective opinions, which may or may not be expressed to others; and (7) the world of madness can disconnect us from the reality in which others can readily believe.  Normally we can inhabit more than one of these and be able to discriminate among them.  What we take to be real must connect with us personally because we find it interesting and/or important, which emphasizes elements of both subjectivity and pragmatic relevance (Principles, vol. 2, pp. 292-299).

b. The Philosophical Importance of Metaphysics

Part of what makes James a great philosopher in the grand tradition is that, unlike so many post-Hegelian Western philosophers, he advocates the pivotal importance of metaphysics.  The theory of reality in general provides a crucial foundational context for philosophy of human nature, philosophy of religion, ethics, social philosophy, and so forth.  Philosophy essentially is an intellectual attempt to come to grips with reality, as he says on the first page of Pragmatism.  In its third lecture, James approaches four standard metaphysical issues using his pragmatic method, those of (1) physical and spiritual substance, (2) materialism vs. theism as explanations of our world, (3) whether the natural world indicates intelligent design, and (4) freedom vs. universal determinism.  For each of these, we cannot conclusively establish where we should stand based merely on what experience discloses about the past, but can take reasonable positions based on pragmatic anticipated future consequences.  As modern philosophy demonstrates, we can never directly and immediately experience any sort of substance; however, we do experience physical qualities and mental events and can best make sense of them by attributing them to bodies and minds.  The world is what it is, regardless of whether it is the result of divine activity or of the random interactions of atoms moving in space; whether or not it was intelligently designed in the distant past has no bearing on the fact that we experience it as we do.  But a world intelligently designed by a deity pragmatically involves the possibility of a promising future, whereas one resulting from unconscious physical forces promises nothing more than a collapse into meaningless obliteration.  On the one hand, if everything we may do or fail to do is determined, why bother doing anything?  On the other hand, if we are free to choose at least some of our actions, then effort can be meaningful.  In the fourth lecture, James states that our world can be viewed as one (monism) or as an irreducible many (pluralism).  There are certain ways in which we humans generate a unity of the objects of our experience, yet the absolute unity to which monism is committed remains a perpetually vanishing ideal.  In his seventh lecture, James identifies three dimensions of reality:  (1) the objects of factual experience; (2) relationships between our sensations and our ideas and among our ideas; and (3) the entire network of truths to which we are committed at any given time.  Again, we see here a combination of subjectivity and pragmatic relevance that views reality as a process of development, which he calls “humanism” (Pragmatism, pp. 7, 43-55, 62-69, 71, 73-74, 110-111, 115-116; see also Truth, pp. 100-101).

c. Monism vs. Pluralism

James intended Some Problems of Philosophy to be largely a textbook in metaphysics, which he defines in terms of the ultimate principles of reality, both within and beyond our human experience.  Much of it concerns the issue of the one and the many, which is arguably the oldest problem of Western philosophy and represents the split between collective monism (such as Hegel’s) and distributive pluralism (such as James himself advocates).  Monism, pursued to its logical extreme, is deterministic, setting up a sharp dichotomy between what is necessary and what is impossible, while pluralism allows for possibilities that may, but need not, be realized.  The former must be either optimistic or pessimistic in its outlook, depending on whether the future that is determined is seen as attractive or unattractive.  In contrast, pluralism’s possibilities allow for a “melioristic” view of the future as possibly better, depending on choices we freely make.  Pluralism need not specify how much unnecessary possibility there is in the world; by contrast, monism must say that everything about the future is locked in from all eternity—to which pluralism says, “Ever not quite.”  James is advocating what he calls the possibility of “novelty” in the world.  Pluralism, being melioristic, calls for our trusting in and cooperating with one another in order to realize desirable possibilities that are not assured (Problems, pp. 31, 114, 139-143, 205, 228-230).  In his Essays in Radical Empiricism, James attempts to distance himself from the philosophical dualism that sees physical reality (bodies) and spiritual reality (minds) as essentially distinct.  He claims that the “philosophy of pure experience” is more consonant with the theory of novelty, indeterminism, moralism, and humanism that he advocates, though it is less than clear why.  We never experience mind in separation from body, and he dismisses as an illusion the notion of consciousness as substantial; however, he does not want to reject the reality of mind as a materialist might do.  So after years of opposing monism, he adopts an admittedly vague sort of neutral (neither materialistic nor idealistic) monism that sees thoughts and things as fundamentally the same stuff, the further definition of which eludes us (Empiricism, pp. 48, 115-117, 120).

6. Freedom and Morality

In the eighth lecture of Pragmatism, James sees monism as tending to a passive sort of quietism rather than to a vital life of active effort.  By contrast, pluralistic pragmatism emphasizes the possibilities that may be if we work to realize them.  Monism determines the future optimistically as working out for the best, whatever we do, or pessimistically as working out for the worst, whatever we do.  By contrast, pluralistic meliorism holds that it can get better if we freely try to make it so.  Whether we embrace the option of freedom and moral responsibility or not is ultimately a matter of personal faith rather than one of objective logic or scientific evidence (Pragmatism, pp. 125, 127-128, 132).

a. Human Freedom

Like God and human immortality, the possibility of which James defends without firmly committing himself to believing in it (Immortality, pp. 3, 6-7, 10-18, 20, 23-24, 28-31, 35-37, 39-41, 43-45), freedom is a postulate of rationality, an unprovable article of faith.  James wrote an essay on the topic, called “The Dilemma of Determinism.”  After admitting that human freedom is an old and shopworn topic about which we may suspect that nothing new can be said, and that he will not pretend to be able to prove or disprove, he launches a pragmatic justification for believing in it.  Indeterminism, the belief in freedom, holds that there is some degree of possibility that is not necessitated by the rest of reality, while determinism must deny all such possibilities.  These beliefs constitute exhaustive and mutually exclusive alternatives, so that if we reject either, we logically should accept the other.  Let us consider a commonplace example such as walking home from campus.  Before the fact neither the determinist nor the indeterminist can infallibly predict which path will be taken, but after the fact the determinist can irrefutably claim that the path taken was necessary, while the indeterminist can irrefutably claim that it was freely chosen.  Thus far, there is no advantage on either side.  But now consider the example of a man gruesomely murdering his loving wife.  We hear the awful details recounted and naturally regret what the wicked man did to her.  Now, what are we to make of that regret from the perspective of determinism?  What sense can it make to regret what had to occur?  From that perspective, we logically must embrace pessimism (all of reality is determined to be bad) or optimism (everything is destined to work out for the best) or subjectivism (good and evil are merely subjective interpretations we artificially cast on things).  All of these can be logically coherent positions, but each of them minimizes the evil we experience in the world and trivializes our natural reaction of regret as pointless.  From a practical (as opposed to a logical) point of view, can we live with that?  James deliberately puts the point quite personally.  Though thoughtful and reflective pessimists, optimists, and subjectivists can live with it, he would not, because its pragmatic implications would render life not worth living.  In that sense, determinism, though logically tenable, is pragmatically unacceptable, and James commits to indeterminism (Will, pp. 145-146, 150-152, 155-156, 160-161, 175-176, 178-179).

b. Moral Responsibility

In addition to God, immortality, and freedom, moral duty is a fourth postulate of rationality.  James offers us one remarkable essay on the topic, entitled “The Moral Philosopher and the Moral Life.”  He addresses three questions:  (1) the psychological one, regarding the origins of our moral values and judgments, (2) the metaphysical one, regarding the grounds of meaning for our basic moral concepts, and (3) the casuistic one, regarding how we should order conflicting values.  First, our human nature comprises a capacity for an intuitive moral sense, but this must be developed in a context of values that socially evolve.  Second, our basic moral concepts of good and bad, right and wrong, and so forth, are all person-relative, grounded in the claims people make on their environment.  Third, when values conflict, those which would seem to satisfy as many personal demands as possible, while frustrating the fewest, should have priority regardless of the nature of those demands.  This represents a pragmatic form of moral relativism, in which no action can be absolutely good or evil in all conceivable circumstances.  Finally, James distinguishes between “the easy-going mood” that tries to avoid conflict, and “the strenuous mood” that strives to achieve ideals, apparently preferring the latter (Will, pp. 185-186, 190, 194-195, 197, 201, 205, 209, 211).

c. The Meaningfulness of Life

In answering the question of what is the primary objective of human life, James maintains that a natural answer is happiness.  It is this, which motivates us to act and endure.  Evolution is often seen as a progressive advance towards happiness (Varieties, pp. 76, 85).  The person who seems incapable of achieving it may well wonder whether life is worth living; suicide deciding that it is not.  For James there is no absolute answer, and it is relative to the life being lived.  A human life involves an ongoing series of possibilities.  Some of these “maybes” may be realized if we believe in our own capacity to realize them; others will not be, either because we do not try or because we try and fail.  Life can become worth living if we believe that it is and act on that belief, our commitment giving it meaning (Will, pp. 37, 59-62).  Our happiness seems to require that we have ideals, that we strive to achieve them, and that we think we are making some progress towards doing so (Talks, pp. 185-189).

7. Social Philosophy

a. Individuals and Their Communities

James’s philosophy is so individualistic that it does not allow for a robust theory of community.  Still, he offers us some interesting insights and one great paper.  “Great Men and Their Environment” views one’s society as not only a context in which great individuals emerge, but even as playing a selective role in allowing their greatness to develop. In turn, that social environment is affected by them.  Whether or not an individual will be able to have an impact is, to some extent, determined by society.  Thus socially significant individuals and their communities have a dynamic, correlative relationship.  In a follow-up article, “The Importance of Individuals,” he maintains that agents of social change, beyond being gifted in some way(s), tend to take greater advantage of given circumstances than more ordinary persons do (Will, pp. 225-226, 229-230, 232, 259).

b. War and Peace

In the last decade of his life, following the Spanish-American War, in which Theodore Roosevelt, his former student, was the hero, James gave a talk at the banquet of the Universal Peace Congress.  Regarding human nature as essentially antagonistic, he warns against our permanent tendencies to mass violence and the romantic idealization of war.  We have to forever be on our guard to resist those dangerous, destructive tendencies; however, he doubts that humanity will ever be able to achieve universal disarmament and peace.  What we can and should do is work to minimize conflicts and to resolve them non-violently.  The great paper James wrote in the area of social relations, written just a few years before the outbreak of World War I and first published the month he died, is “The Moral Equivalent of War.”  In it he warns of the extreme challenge of suppressing our martial tendencies.  Warfare has become so costly, in terms of treasure and carnage, thanks to modern technology, that we need to find some way of rechanneling the primitive tendencies inherited from our ancestors.  How can we create an atmosphere in which peace is the norm rather than that interim period between wars?  Identifying himself as a “pacifist,” he nevertheless admits that there are desirable human qualities—such as patriotism, loyalty, social solidarity, and national vigor—that have traditionally been nurtured by war and the preparation for conducting it.  The question at hand is whether a “moral equivalent” might be found that would generate such martial virtues without involving the horrible destructiveness of war. Since wars are the results of human choices rather than fatalistically determined, he anticipates a time when they will be formally outlawed among civilized societies.  But then how can these martial virtues still be nurtured?  His answer is that we should draft young adults into national service, as opposed to military service, fighting against adverse natural conditions rather than against fellow human beings, working for a time in coal mines, on constructing roads, and so forth.  Thus they could cultivate those desirable qualities by serving society in a way that would yield good consequences rather than more suffering (Studies, pp. 300-301, 303-306, 267, 269, 275-276, 280, 283, 286-292).

c. Democratic Tolerance and Social Progress

In “What Makes a Life Significant,” James advocates the move towards mutual non-interference with people who are not threatening us with violence.  Tolerance of others is an antidote to cruelty and injustice.  He maintains that the trend of social evolution is in the direction of democratic progress.  Yet this trend requires effort, and its continuation poses challenges for us, including that of striving for a more equitable distribution of wealth (Talks, pp. 170, 178, 189).  His commitments to individual freedom, mutual respect, peaceful interrelationships, and tolerance converge to point us in the direction of progressing towards what he calls “the intellectual republic” (Will, p. 30).  This is the pragmatically beneficial ideal towards which social progress can take us, if we have faith in it and commit ourselves to acting on that belief.

8. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • William James, Essays in Radical Empiricism and A Pluralistic Universe (called “Empiricism” and “Universe,” respectively).  New York:  E. P. Dutton, 1971.
  • William James, The Letters of William James, Two Volumes in One, ed. Henry James (called “Letters”).  Boston:  Little, Brown, 1926.
  • William James, The Meaning of Truth (called “Truth”).  Ann Arbor:  University of Michigan Press, 1970.
  • William James, Memories and Studies (called “Studies”).  Westport:  Greenwood Press, 1968)
  • William James, Pragmatism (called “Pragmatism”), ed. Bruce Kuklick.  Indianapolis:  Hackett, 1981.
  • William James, The Principles of Psychology, Two Volumes (called “Principles”).  New York:  Dover, 1950.
  • William James, Psychology:  Briefer Course (called “Psychology”).  New York:  Henry Holt, 1910.
  • William James, Some Problems of Philosophy, ed. Henry James (called “Problems”).  New York:  Longmans, Green, 1931.
  • William James, Talks to Teachers on Psychology:  and to Students on some of Life’s Ideals (called “Talks”).  New York:  W. W. Norton, 1958.
  • William James, The Varieties of Religious Experience (called “Varieties”).  New York:  New American Library, 1958.
  • William James, The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy and Human Immortality (called “Will” and ”Immortality,” respectively).  New York:  Dover, 1956.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Jacques Barzun, A Stroll with William James.  Chicago:  University of Chicago Press, 1984.
    • This is a non-technical discussion of James’s life and thought.
  • Patrick Kiaran Dooley, Pragmatism as Humanism:  The Philosophy of William James.  Totowa:  Littlefield, Adams, 1975.
    • This is a brief but good introduction to James’s philosophy of human nature.
  • Richard M. Gale, The Philosophy of William James:  An Introduction.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • This is a monograph on the theory and vision of James.
  • R. W. B. Lewis, The Jameses:  A Family Narrative.  New York:  Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 1991.
    • This is a monumental collective biography of the James family.
  • Gerald E. Myers, William James:  His Life and Thought.  New Haven:  Yale University Press, 1986.
    • This is a long, comprehensive, in-depth analysis of James’s psychology and philosophy.
  • Ralph Barton Perry, The Thought and Character of William James:  Briefer Version.  Cambridge:  Harvard University Press, 1948.
    • This is a classic intellectual biography of James by one of his famous students.
  • Ruth Anna Putnam, The Cambridge Companion to William James.  New York:  Cambridge University Press, 1997.
    • This is a collection of critical analyses of important parts of James’s thought.
  • Robert D. Richardson, William James:  In the Maelstrom of American Modernism.  Boston:  Houghton Mifflin, 2006.
    • This intellectual biography of James studies the man through his work.
  • Robert J. Vanden Burgt, The Religious Philosophy of William James.  Chicago:  Nelson-Hall, 1981.
    • This is a short but illuminating treatment of James’s philosophy of religion.

Author Information

Wayne P. Pomerleau
Email: Pomerleau@calvin.gonzaga.edu
Gonzaga University
U. S. A.




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