Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Feminist Jurisprudence

American feminist jurisprudence is the study of the construction and workings of the law from perspectives which foreground the implications of the law for women and women's lives. This study includes law as a theoretical enterprise as well its practical and concrete effects in women's lives. Further, it includes law as an academic discipline, and thus incorporates concerns regarding pedagogy and the influence of teachers. On all these levels, feminist scholars, lawyers, and activists raise questions about the meaning and the impact of law on women's lives. Feminist jurisprudence seeks to analyze and redress more traditional legal theory and practice. It focuses on the ways in which law has been structured (sometimes unwittingly) that deny the experiences and needs of women. Feminist jurisprudence claims that patriarchy (the system of interconnected relations and institutions that oppress women) infuses the legal system and all its workings, and that this is an unacceptable state of affairs. Consequently, feminist jurisprudence is not politically neutral, but a normative approach, as expressed by philosopher Patricia Smith: "[F]eminist jurisprudence challenges basic legal categories and concepts rather than analyzing them as given. Feminist jurisprudence asks what is implied in traditional categories, distinctions, or concepts and rejects them if they imply the subordination of women. In this sense, feminist jurisprudence is normative and claims that traditional jurisprudence and law are implicitly normative as well" (Smith 1993, p. 10). Feminist jurisprudence sees the workings of law as thoroughly permeated by political and moral judgments about the worth of women and how women should be treated. These judgments are not commensurate with women's understandings of themselves, nor even with traditional liberal conceptions of (moral and legal) equality and fairness.

Although feminist jurisprudence revolves around a number of questions and features a diversity of focus and approach, two characteristics are central to it. First, because the Anglo-American legal tradition is built on liberalism and its tenets, feminist jurisprudence tends to respond to liberalism in some way. The second characteristic is the goal of bringing the law and its practitioners to recognize that law as currently constructed does not acknowledge or respond to the needs of women, and must be changed. These two features can be seen in the major debates in current feminist jurisprudence, which range from questions of the proper perspective from which to understand the problems of the law, to questions of legal theory and practice.

Table of Contents

  1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective
  2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice
    1. Equality and Rights
    2. Understanding Harm
    3. The Processes of Adjudication
  3. Trajectories
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Responding to Liberalism: Questions of Perspective

As a critical theory, feminist jurisprudence responds to the current dominant understanding of legal thought, which is usually identified with the liberal Anglo-American tradition. (This tradition is represented by such authors as Hart 1961 and Dworkin 1977, 1986.) Two major branches of this tradition have been legal positivism, on the one hand, and natural law theory on the other. Feminist jurisprudence responds to both these branches of the American legal tradition by raising questions regarding their assumptions about the law, including:

  • that law is properly objective and thus must have recourse to objective rules or understandings at some level
  • that law is properly impartial, especially in that it is not to be tainted by the personal experience of any of its practitioners, particularly judges
  • that equality must function as a formal notion rather than a substantive one, such that in the eyes of the law, difference must be shown to be "relevant" in order to be admissible/visible
  • that law, when working properly, should be certain, and that the goal of lawmaking and legal decision-making is to gain certainty
  • that justice can be understood as a matter of procedures, such that a proper following of procedures can be understood as sufficient to rendering justice.

Each of these assumptions, although contested and debated, has remained a significant feature of the liberal tradition of legal understanding.

Feminist jurisprudence usually frames its responses to traditional legal thought in terms of whether or not the critic is maintaining some commitment to the tradition or some particular feature of it. This split in responses has been formulated in a number of different ways, according to the particular concerns they emphasize. The two formulations found most frequently in American feminist jurisprudence characterize the split either as the reformist/radical debate or as the sameness/difference debate. Within the reformist/radical debate, reformist feminists argue that the liberal tradition offers much that can be shaped to fit feminist hands and should be retained for all that it offers. These feminists approach jurisprudence with an eye to what needs to be changed within the system that already exists. Their work, then, is to gain entry into that system and use its own tools to construct a legal system which prevents the inequities of patriarchy from affecting justice.

Those who see the traditional system as either bankrupt or so problematic that it cannot be reshaped are often referred to as transformist or radical feminists. According to this approach, the corruption of the legal tradition by patriarchy is thought to be too deeply embedded to allow for any significant adjustments to the problems that women face. Feminists using this approach tend to argue that the legal system, either parts or as a whole, must be abandoned. They argue that liberal legal concepts, categories and processes must be rejected, and new ones put in place which can be free from the biases of the current system. Their work, then, is to craft the transformations that are necessary in legal theory and practice and to create a new legal system that can provide a more equitable justice.

Under the sameness/difference debate, the central concern for feminists is to understand the role of difference and how women's needs must be figured before the law. Sameness feminists argue that to emphasize the differences between men and women is to weaken women's abilities to gain access to the rights and protections that men have enjoyed. Their concern is that it is women's difference that has been used to keep women from enjoying a legal status equal to men's. Consequently, they see difference as a concept that must be de-emphasized. Sameness feminists work to highlight the ways in which women can be seen as the same as men, entitled to the same rights, protections, and privileges.

Difference feminists argue that (at least some of) the differences between men and women, as well as other types of difference such as race, age, and sexual orientation, are significant. These significant differences must be taken into account by the law in order for justice and equity to be achieved. What has been good law for men cannot simply be adopted by women, because women are not in fact the same as men. Women have different needs which require different legal remedies. The law must be made to recognize differences that are relevant to women's lives, status and possibilities.

The two characterizations of the debate about what perspective is best for understanding the problems of the law do share some features. Those who argue a sameness position are often thought to fit, to some degree, with the reformist view. Difference feminists are seen as sharing much with radicals. The parallel between the two characterizations is that both argue over how much, if any, of the current legal system can and must be preserved and put to use in the service of feminist concerns. The two characterizations are not the same, but the important parallel between them allows for some generalization regarding the ways in which each is likely to respond to particular theoretical and substantive issues. However, while the two may reasonably be grouped for some purposes, they must not be conflated.

From these perspectives, feminist jurisprudence emphasizes two kinds of question: the theoretical and the substantive. These two kinds of question are, perhaps especially for feminists, deeply connected and overlapping. Discussions of central theoretical issues in feminist jurisprudence are punctuated by elaboration of the substantive issues with which they are intertwined.

2. Central Concerns: Questions of Theory and Practice

In asking theoretical questions, feminists are concerned with how to understand the law itself, its proper scope, legitimacy, and meaning. Many of these are the questions of traditional legal theory, but asked in the context of the feminist project: What is the proper moral foundation of the law, especially given that any answer depends on the moral principles of the dominant structure of the society? What is the meaning of rule of law, especially given that obedience to law has been an important part of the history of subjugation? What is the meaning of equality, especially in a world of diversity? What is the meaning of harm, especially in a world in which women, not men, are subjected by men to certain kinds of violence? How can adjudication of conflict be properly and fairly achieved, especially when not all persons are able to come to the adjudication process on a "level playing field"? What is the meaning of property, and how can women avoid being categorized as property? Is law the best and most appropriate channel for the resolution of conflict, especially given its traditional grounding in patriarchal goals and structures?

Although feminists have addressed all these questions and more, perhaps one issue stands out in many feminists' eyes as a matter of special importance, encompassing as it does some aspect of many of the questions noted above. The issue that for many feminists is at the heart of concerns is that of equality and rights. Two others that may be considered nearly as central are problems of harm, and of the processes of adjudication.

a. Equality and Rights

Law works partly by drawing abstract guiding principles out of the specifics of the cases it adjudicates. On this abstract level, theoretical questions arise for feminist jurisprudence regarding equality and rights, including the following: what understanding of equality will make it possible for women to have control over their lives, in both the private and public spheres? What understanding of equality will provide an adequate grounding for the concept of rights, such that women's rights can protect both their individual liberty and their identity as women?

In general, the feminist concern with equality involves the claim that equality must be understood not simply as a formal concept that functions rhetorically and legally. Equality must be a substantive concept which can actually make changes in the power structure and the relative power positions of men and women generally. Although equality is examined in a wide variety of specific applications, the major concern is the goal of making equality meaningful in the lives of women. But for many feminists, concerns with equality cannot be addressed without also attending to rights. Because the liberal tradition figures rights as the hallmark of equality, it is in terms of rights that we are expected to see ourselves as equals before the law. Further, rights discourse has structured both our understanding of equality, and our claims to it.

Examinations of equality are, therefore, often framed by particular substantive issues. For example, much feminist jurisprudence regarding equality is framed in terms of concerns about work. If women are equal, then how will this be expressed in workplace law and policy? One of the key issues in this field has been how to treat pregnancy in the workplace: Is it fair for women to have extended or paid leave for pregnancy and birthing? Under what circumstances, or limitations? Are women being given "special" rights if they have a right to such leave? The struggle over the proper understanding of pregnancy and work raises questions about whether women should be treated in such law as individuals or as a class. As individuals, it has seemed relatively easy for workplaces to claim that not all employees are given such leave, and thus that women who do not are being treated "equally". One feminist strategy has been to attempt to revise such law to recognize the particular difference of women as a class. Herma Hill Kay, for example, argues that pregnancy can be seen as an episode which affects women's ability to take advantage of opportunities in the workplace, and that pregnant workers must be protected against loss of equal opportunity during episodes of pregnancy. (Kay, 1985)

Concerns over pregnancy express the fundamental questions of the sameness/difference debate. The sameness position suggests difference should be erased to the greatest extent possible, because it has been used as a basis for discrimination. Difference proponents argue that pregnancy involves significant differences which should be seen as a linchpin of legal understanding. Does equality mean that women should wish to be treated exactly the same as men, or does it mean that women should wish to be treated differently, because their differences are such that same treatment cannot provide equity?

Feminists who argue that equality requires creating for women the same opportunities and rights which are currently available to men of the ruling class are bringing the reformist or sameness approach to bear. Approaches to rights and equality which focus on women's individuality, emphasizing it in the way that law has done for men and requiring women to show that they are like men and thus may be treated like men, tend then to be reformist or sameness oriented. Because these approaches are seen as requiring that women become as much like men as possible, and that law treat women as it does men, they are often referred to as assimilationist.

Christine Littleton (Littleton, 1987) offers a further set of terms for approaches to understanding equality: symmetrical (paralleling reformist and sameness approaches) and asymmetrical (paralleling radical and difference approaches). This classification refers to how women and men are "located in society" with regard to issues, norms and rules. If a theorist sees men and women as sharing a location regarding an issue, then that theorist has a symmetrical approach; if not, then the approach is asymmetrical. Littleton classifies assimilationist approaches as symmetrical, along with what she calls the androgyny approach. The androgyny approach argues that men and women are very much alike, but that equality will require social institutions to pick a "mean" between the two, and apply that standard to all persons. This model is less frequently argued than the assimilation model.

There are also many radical and difference approaches to equality. What they share is the desire to avoid having to take on all that is questionable and/or undesirable about (society's construction of) men in order to be considered equal before the law. Thus many radical approaches (although not all - MacKinnon, below, is an example of one which is not) emphasize similar questions and problems as difference approaches. How to recognize relevant difference, and what kind of difference law must be responsive to, is a crucial part of these feminist examinations of equality. Ann Scales, for example, argues that liberal/reformist approaches do not do enough to really make the changes that are necessary, because the problem in equality is a problem of understanding how domination works. We must learn to see how equality has formally been tied in to domination through the liberal framework. In her view, a certain kind of inequality needs to be recognized and worked with, rather than ignored or assimilated. (Scales, 1986)

Other difference/radical approaches include the special rights, accommodation, acceptance, and empowerment models. (Littleton, 1987) The special rights model suggests that justice requires our recognizing that equality is too easily understood as "sameness", where men and women are not the same. Rights should be based on needs, and if women have needs that men do not, that should not limit their rights. The accommodation model asserts that differences which are not fundamental or biologically based should be treated under a symmetrical or assimilation model. But this leaves those differences which are fundamental (such as the ability to be pregnant) as differences which must be recognized in the law and accommodated by it.

Littleton's own approach is expressed in the acceptance model. This argues that (gender) difference must be accepted, and that law should focus on the consequences of such differences, rather than the differences themselves. Although differences exist between men and women, equality should function to make these differences "costless" relative to each other. Equality should function to prevent women's being penalized on the basis of their difference. Thus equality should require us to institute paid leave for pregnancy and birthing, and to guarantee women's return to their jobs after birthing.

Empowerment models reject difference as irrelevant, and shift focus to levels of empowerment. Equality, then, is understood as what balances power for groups and individuals, and dismantles the ability of some to dominate others. This radical and asymmetrical view does not, however, fit well with the categorization of feminist positions in terms of sameness and difference. The empowerment model's focus on domination and the ways in which power is distributed seems to represent a significant departure from the parallel suggested above. Thus some feminist jurists have suggested that it be understood as a separate approach. Judith Baer calls it simply the domination model of feminist jurisprudence. Catherine MacKinnon is one well-known scholar who holds this view. (MacKinnon, 1987) In her theorizing of pornography, for example, she focuses on the question of how power is used in pornography to maintain a structure of domination which belies the possibility of equality between men and women.

Feminist critiques of rights in general assert that rights have been apportioned based on notions of equality that deliberately exclude the needs of women. If rights are to be truly equal, they must be apportioned on a more equitable basis, informed by the experience of women and others previously excluded. Or, following MacKinnon or Patricia Williams (discussed below), rights must be apportioned based on how they empower those to whom they are granted. Feminist scholars debate the ground for understanding rights while working to create a foundation from which women can claim and exercise rights that will be meaningful in their lives.

b. Understanding Harm

Perhaps the most difficult question for feminist jurisprudence regarding the issue of harm is that of perspective: who defines and identifies harm in specific cases? Given that law has traditionally worked from a patriarchal perspective, it is perhaps not surprising that identifying harm to women has been problematic. A patriarchal system will benefit from a very stingy recognition of harms against women. Feminist jurisprudence, therefore, must examine the basic question, what is harm? It also must ask, what counts as harm in our legal system, and why? What has been excluded from definitions of harm that women need included, and how can such trends be overturned?

Three types of harm-causing actions that are typically and systematically directed against women have formed the background for discussion about what harm means, and what counts as harm: rape, sexual harassment, and battering. Until fairly recently (for example, before the legislative reform movements of the 1970s), some forms of these actions were not considered actionable offenses under the law. This was largely due to the history of understanding women not as independent and autonomous agents, but as property belonging to men (thus issues of the meaning of property are also crucial to understanding harm). Feminist jurisprudence has challenged this state of affairs. As a result, changes have been made in the laws regarding each of the three categories, although the effectiveness of these changes is widely disputed (see, e.g., Schulhofer 1998 for an excellent review of this law). At the very least, work by feminists has made it possible to speak of these harms by providing a vocabulary for them, by raising awareness about them, and by prosecuting them more frequently and with some success.

Discussions of rape attempt to answer many of the questions that apply to all three types of harm-causing actions. Cases of all three types give rise to similar problems that prevent women from being treated justly: blaming the victim; privileging the point of view of "the" agent, i.e., the male perpetrator; indicting the woman's sexual history while ignoring the man's history, whether sexual or violent. Underlying all these problems are assumptions about gender and agency which encourage the law to place responsibility for their own harm on women rather than on the men who cause it. Women have been believed to be mentally unstable or at least weak-minded, to be scheming and deceptive, and to have an improper motivation for making claims of harm against men. For these reasons, they tend to be seen as untrustworthy witnesses. Because they have been characterized as sexually insatiable and indiscriminate, they tend to be seen as deserving whatever harm they "provoke" from men. Corresponding assumptions about men's rational superiority encourage their being seen as believable witnesses. At the same time, assumptions about men's natural sexual needs are taken as justification for their violations of women. Feminist jurisprudence attempts to respond to these problems as double standards and matters of equality and rights.

Other issues of harm require different responses. Harm-causing actions tend to be defined in terms of external and observable characteristics (levels of force), of intention on the part of the agent (mens rea), and of the consent of the one harmed. Consequently, what is at issue is how law uses these criteria in determining both when harm has occurred and whether it is to be justified or excused. What feminist jurisprudence has found is that women and men frequently differ over the understanding of each of these criteria. But since it is a patriarchal understanding which grounds the law, women's understandings tend not to be given a proper hearing.

In Susan Estrich's discussion of rape (Estrich, 1987, 1987a), she claims that the mens rea criterion can be used to create either too much emphasis on the perpetrator's intention, or too little. In either case, she believes the focus on this criterion makes evident the law's lack of understanding of and concern for the harms women suffer. The law's focus is to not wrongly punish men, which is achieved at the cost of not protecting women.

Further, Estrich argues that the force criterion is understood from a patriarchal perspective: force is seen as a matter of what "boys do in schoolyards." This criterion figures force as a simple matter of the straightforward use of physical strength, or the use of implements of violence. But it ignores the kinds of force that are most frequently used in rape and other types of harm to women, such as psychological coercion. If the courts expect women to resist physical and psychological coercion in the same ways and at the same level that men do, then the courts impose an unreasonable expectation on the "reasonable" woman.

Regarding consent, Estrich explains that the courts have believed that if consent is given, then rape (or other harms) do not occur. This places responsibility on the one who has been harmed to show that she did not, in fact, consent. But patriarchal courts have held that only the strongest and most emphatic expression of non-consent functions as evidence. This means that in many cases, women have been said to have "consented" even though they were physically carried off by men and verbally expressed non-consent (Schulhofer 1998). Non-consent has not been easily proven unless the woman has been severely beaten, or unless a significant weapon (that is, gun or knife) was used, or death was threatened in a way that convinces the court. Thus what non-consent means for the court has been very different from what women themselves have said about (their) consent.

Robin West (West, 1988) argues along similar lines, claiming that women's social training does not impart the same fundamental values that men's training does. She theorizes that men value separation and autonomy to the point that they would physically fight, desperately, to maintain theirs. But because women value connection and relation most highly, they find it difficult to respond to physical violence with violence of their own. Violence destroys connection and relationship, which is what women are socialized to value most. This makes it difficult for women to respond to rape, and other harms, in a way which convinces masculine courts that they did not consent. Women's definition and identification of these harms is very different from what the courts have so far constructed.

It is difficult to separate out some parts of the reformist or sameness and radical or difference approaches with regard to harm. In general, however, those who argue that current laws can be changed to adequately protect women have reformist or sameness views. Those arguing that the current definitions of harm simply cannot be revised sufficiently have radical or difference views. Thus Estrich, who concludes that we need to treat rape as we treat other kinds of crime which require nonconsent (theft, for example) could be considered a reformist view. Mary Lou Fellows and Bev Balos offer a similar analysis of how women's perception of the harms of date rape can be accommodated in current law. This can be accomplished by the application of the heightened duty of care that exists already in the common law doctrine of confidential relationship. (Fellows and Balos, 1991) West's argument, based on recognizing and responding to fundamental differences between men and women regarding harm, could be seen as a radical or difference view. MacKinnon's analysis of sexual harassment, which focuses on the need for women to be empowered to define the harms against them, represents a dominance view on harms.

c. The Processes of Adjudication

Many feminist jurists challenge the processes of adjudication by raising questions about the neutrality or impartiality that such processes are assumed to embody. Neutrality is believed to function in the law in at least two ways. It is assumed to be built into the processes of the law, and it is assumed to be produced by those processes. Feminist jurisprudence challenges the first set of assumptions by raising questions about legal reasoning. It challenges the second by raising questions about how a law created and applied by partial and biased persons can itself be neutral. Thus feminist jurisprudence also raises the question of whether neutrality is a possible, or an appropriate, goal of the law.

As traditionally understood, neutrality in law is supposed to protect us from a number of ills. It protects from personal bias by insisting that judges, attorneys, law enforcement officers, etc., treat us not as people with specific characteristics, but as interchangeable subjects. We should be seen only in terms of certain specific actions and our intentions with regard to those specific actions. Officials are expected not to bring their personal biases to bear on those who come before them, and certain personal aspects of those brought before the law are not permitted to come under scrutiny. For example, if a judge personally believes that women are pathological liars, this is not supposed to influence his or her interpretation of any particular woman's testimony. Similarly, no person's race is supposed to influence any judge's understanding of their case. Feminist jurisprudence challenges such claims to neutrality.

Neutrality in law is supposed to protect against ideological bias as well. It does this by taking a supposedly universal perspective on a case, rather than a particular perspective. This belief that law and its practitioners can see, and judge, from the "view from nowhere" has been criticized by feminist jurisprudence. Feminists claim that such complete objectivity seems not to be fully possible. They also argue that claiming such neutrality deflects attention away from the fact that a partial view - a masculinist view - is being presented as universal. Feminist jurisprudence, like most feminist theory, rejects the claim of law that it is a neutral practice, and instead points to the ways in which law is clearly not neutral.

One of the ways law is not neutral is through the individual people that work in law. Feminist jurisprudence argues that because there is no such thing as the "view from nowhere", every understanding has a perspective. This perspective influences it, and provides an interpretive field for whatever matters of fact there may be. Since law is made, administered and enforced by people, and people must have a perspective, law must reflect those perspectives at least to some degree. Feminists tend to agree that to the extent that a practice or person is unaware of their own perspective, that perspective will more strongly influence their interpretations of the world. It is when we become aware of biases that we are able, through critical reflection, to reduce their influence and thus move toward a greater (although not a perfect) objectivity.

Another way that law is not neutral is in its content. Because it is made by people, many of whom have not critically examined their own standpoints, the content of law may be unfair or discriminatory. Such content would require officials to act in ways that are not impartial, or not fair. But even if law is written by those whose perspectives are relatively objective, our legislative system often imposes compromises on laws. Some compromises required to pass law may change or weaken its objectives in ways that prevent its functioning as intended. These criticisms show that the content of the law, affected by the contestations of our legislative system, may not be neutral. Further, it shows that the processes of the law do not guarantee the neutrality that they are assumed to do.

Neutrality is also assumed to be built into certain processes of the law, and in particular the processes of judicial reasoning. The traditional model of judicial decision-making relies on case law, which uses precedent and analogy to provide evidence and justification. Interpretation of statutes in prior cases provides precedent or rules. Courts then attempt to determine how the facts of current cases require one rule or another to be brought to bear. This way of making decisions has itself been thought to be neutral, and the formalities of due process that support it are thought to reinforce that neutrality. This feature of law, relying on past judgments to influence current and future ones, also makes it peculiarly resistant to change. For feminist jurisprudence, use of precedent allows the law to insulate itself against the critiques of outsiders, including women.

Use of precedent has been challenged by a feminist and non-feminist critiques, including the pragmatism of Margaret Radin (Radin, 1990) and Jerome Frank's legal realism (Frank, 1963). Feminist jurisprudence responds to use of precedent by pointing out those areas which are most likely to be subject to sexist understandings. For example, case law that has derived from cases in which plaintiffs and defendants are men will assume that the circumstances for those men are simply the "normal" circumstances. Workplace law has frequently been challenged by feminist critics for this reason. The law assumes, based on cases in which the workplace was populated mainly by men, that everyone who works shares men's circumstances. This assumption entails that workers are supported by a full-time homemaker, such that the burdens of home life and child rearing should not affect one's ability to function efficiently in the workplace. But such assumptions work against women, who usually are supporting someone else in this way rather than being supported.

Reform and sameness feminists argue that case law is not a bad system but that reforms are needed to emphasize to the realities of women's lives. Radical and difference feminists are more likely to argue that case law is itself a system that is too heavily entrenched in patriarchy to be maintained. Its reliance on precedent makes it too conservative a system of decision-making to be adequately brought to the service of feminism.

3. Trajectories

Although it seems that the sameness/difference and the reform/radical debates could create an impasse for feminists, some theorists believe that some combination of the two views can be more effective than either alone. Patricia Williams (Williams, 1991), for example, believes that rights can function as powerful liberatory tools for the traditionally disadvantaged. However, she also believes that in a racist society such as contemporary America, racial difference must be recognized because it creates disadvantage before the law. In this way, she claims that some features of the liberal tradition, like rights, need to be maintained for the liberatory work they can do. However, she argues that the liberal tradition of formal equality is damaging to historically marginalized groups. This aspect of law needs to be completely transformed.

As an example of the ways in which rights are still needed by the traditionally disadvantaged, she examines the relationship to rights that is enjoyed by a white male colleague. His sense of his rights is so entrenched that he sees them as creating distance between himself and others, and believes that rights should be played down. In contrast, Williams expresses her own relationship to rights, being a black woman, as much more tenuous. The history of American slavery, under which black Americans were literally owned by whites, makes it difficult for both blacks and whites to figure blacks as empowered by rights in the same ways that whites are.

This example shows how Williams weaves together important elements of both reform and radical positions, and at the same time includes the element of empowerment that is seen in dominance positions. She claims that for blacks, and for any traditionally disadvantaged group, rights are a significant part of a program of advancement. One's relationship to rights depends on who one is, and how one is empowered by one's society and law. For those whose rights are already guaranteed, what may be necessary for social change is to challenge the power of rights rhetoric for one's group. But for those whose rights have never been secure, this will not look like the best course of action. Williams' suggestion is that we recognize that rights and rights rhetoric function differently in different settings and for different people. But this, then, is a response which relies on the radical and difference premise that difference must in fact be attended to rather than elided. In order that rights be made effective for historically marginalized people, we must first see that they do not in fact function for all people in the way that they do for those they were created for.

Another approach to drawing the two sides of the debate in feminist jurisprudence together is offered by Judith Baer, whose claim is that feminist jurisprudence to date has failed to either reform or transform law because feminists in both camps have made crucial mistakes. (Baer, 1999) The primary error has been that feminist jurisprudence has tended to misunderstand the tradition it criticizes. Although feminist jurists recognize that the liberal tradition has secured rights for men but not women, they have failed to make explicit the corresponding asymmetry of responsibility. Women are accorded responsibility for themselves and others in ways that men are not. For example, women are expected to be responsible for the lives of children in ways that men are not; as noted above, this has implications in areas like workplace law.

The second major error Baer sees in feminist jurisprudence is that it, along with most feminism, has tended to focus almost exclusively on women. This has drawn feminist attention away from men and the institutions that feminism needs to study, criticize, challenge and change. It has also created a series of debates within feminism that are divisive and draining of feminist energy. Again, the solution is to recognize when reform (sameness) and radical (difference) approaches are effective, and to use each as appropriate. Baer argues that

[f]eminist jurists need not - indeed, we must not – choose between laws that treat men and women the same and laws that treat them differently. We already know that both kinds of law can be sexist. Our gender-neutral law of reproductive rights treats women worse than men, but so did "protective" labor legislation. Conversely, both gender-neutral and gender-specific laws can promote sexual equality. Comparable worth legislation would make women more nearly equal with men. So have affirmative action policies. Women can have it both ways. Law can treat men and women alike where they are alike and differently where they are different. (Baer 1999, 55)

Baer provides critiques of both reform and radical feminist jurisprudence. She concludes that neither alone is sufficient, but that both, applied where appropriate, could be. She argues that the feminist focus on women has encouraged an inability to think on a universal scale. This leaves feminists, and law under feminist jurisprudence, mired in the particularities of individual cases and individual traits. To move out of this mire, she suggests three tasks for feminist jurisprudence:

First, it must do the opposite of what conventional theory and feminist critiques have done: posit rights and question responsibility. Second, it must develop analyses that will separate situations from the people experiencing them, so we can talk about women's victimization without labeling them as victims. Finally, it must move beyond women and begin scrutinizing men and institutions. (Baer 1999, 68)

Baer does not suggest that feminism, nor feminist jurisprudence, should give up the study of women and women's situations. Rather, her suggestion is that this study as an exclusive focus is not sufficient for either reform or transformation. Because "women neither create nor sustain their position in society" feminists need to scrutinize those who do. Baer's suggestion is that what is needed is an account of "what it means to be a human being, a man, or a woman, which makes equality possible." (Baer 1999, 192) The mistakes that feminist jurisprudence has made have prevented its developing this account, which Baer thinks could be the foundation of what she calls a feminist postliberalism sufficient for feminist jurisprudence.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Baer, Judith A, Our Lives Before the Law: Constructing a Feminist Jurisprudence (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1999)
  • Cornell, Drucilla, Beyond Accommodation: Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction and the Law (New York: Routledge, 1990)
  • Dworkin, Andrea, Intercourse, (New York: The Free Press, 1987)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Law's Empire (Cambridge: Harvaard University Press, 1986)
  • Dworkin, Ronald, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Estrich, Susan, "Rape," 95 Yale Law Journal 1087-1184 (1987)
  • Estrich, Susan, Real Rape (Cambrdige: Harvard University Press, 1987a)
  • Fellows, Mary Louise and Beverly Balos, "Guilty of the Crime of Trust: Nonstranger Rape" 75 Minnesota Law Review 599 (1991)
  • Hart, H.L.A., The Concept of Law, (New York, Oxford University Press, 1961)
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Author Information

Melissa Burchard
Email: mburchard@unca.edu
University of North Carolina – Asheville
U. S. A.




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