Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) focused on elements of the philosophy of religion for about half a century─from the mid-1750s, when he started teaching philosophy, until after his retirement from academia. Having been reared in a distinctively religious environment, he remained concerned about the place of religious belief in human thought and action. As he moved towards the development of his own original philosophical system in his pre-critical period through the years in which he was writing each Critique and subsequent works all the way to the incomplete, fragmentary Opus Postumum of his old age, his attention to religious faith was an enduring theme. His discussions of God and religion represent a measure of the evolution of his philosophical worldview. This began with his pre-critical advocacy of the rationalism in which he was educated. Then this got subjected to the systematic critique that would open the doors to his own unique critical treatment. Finally, at the end of his life, he seemed to experiment with a more radical approach. As we follow the trajectory of this development, we see Kant moving from confidently advocating a demonstrative argument for the God of metaphysics to denying all theoretical knowledge of a theological sort, to affirming a moral argument establishing religious belief as rational, to suspicions regarding religion divorced from morality, and finally to hints of an idea of God so identified with moral duty as to be immanent rather than transcendent. The key text representing the revolutionary move from his pre-critical, rationalistic Christian orthodoxy to his critical position (that could later lead to those suggestions of heterodox religious belief) is his seminal Critique of Pure Reason. In the preface to its second edition, in one of the most famous sentences he ever wrote, he sets the theme for this radical transition by writing, “I have therefore found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith” (Critique, B). Though never a skeptic (for example, he was always committed to scientific knowledge), Kant came to limit knowledge to objects of possible experience and to regard ideas of metaphysics (including theology) as matters of rational faith.
This article does not present a full biography of Kant. A more general account of his life can be found in the article Kant’s Aesthetics. But five matters should be briefly addressed as background for discussing his philosophical theology: (1) his association with Pietism; (2) his wish to strike a reasonable balance between (the Christian) religion and (Newtonian physical) science; (3) his attempt to steer a middle path between the excesses of dogmatic modern rationalism and skeptical modern empiricism; (4) his commitment to the Enlightenment ideals; and (5) his unpleasant encounter with the Prussian censor over his religious writings.
Kant was born, raised, educated, worked, lived, and died in Königsberg (now Kaliningrad, part of Russia), the capital city of East Prussia. His parents followed the Pietist movement in German Lutheranism, as he was brought up to do. Pietism stressed studying the scriptures as a basis for personal devotion, lay governance of the church, the conscientious practice of Christian ethics, religious education emphasizing the development and exercising of values, and preaching designed to inculcate and promote piety in its adherents. At the age of eight, the boy was sent to a Pietist school directed by his family’s pastor. Eight years later, he enrolled in the University of Königsberg, where he came under the influence of a Pietist professor of logic and metaphysics. Even during later decades of his life, when he ceased to practice religion publicly (see letter to Lavater in Correspondence, pp. 152-154) and found external displays of pious devotion distasteful, his thought and values continued to be influenced by the Pietism of his earlier years.
Second, as a university student, Kant became a follower of Newtonian science. The dissertation for his graduate degree was more what we would consider physics than philosophy, although in those days it was called “natural philosophy.” Many of his earliest writings were in Newtonian science, including his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755 (in Cosmogony), dedicated to his king, Frederick the Great, and propounding a nebular hypothesis to explain the formation of our solar system. He had reason to worry that his thoroughly mechanistic explanation might run afoul of Biblical fundamentalists who advocated the traditional doctrine of strict creationism. This is illustrative of a tension with which he had to deal all of his adult life—regarding how to reconcile Christian faith and scientific knowledge—which his philosophy of religion would address.
Third, although this is a bit of an oversimplification, before Kant, modern European philosophy was generally split into two rival camps: the Continental Rationalists, following Descartes, subscribed to a theory of a priori innate ideas that provide a basis for universal and necessary knowledge, while the British Empiricists, following Locke, subscribed to a tabula rasa theory, denying innate ideas and maintaining that our knowledge must ultimately be based on sense experience. This split vitally affected views regarding knowledge of God. Descartes and his followers were convinced that a priori knowledge of the existence of God, as an infinitely perfect Being, was possible and favored (what Kant would later call) the Ontological Argument as a way to establish it. By contrast, Locke and his followers spurned such a priori reasoning and resorted to empirical approaches, such as the Cosmological Argument and the Teleological Arguments or Design Arguments. An important Continental Rationalist was the German Leibniz, whose philosophy was systematized by Christian Wolff; in the eighteenth century, the Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy was replacing scholasticism in German universities. Kant’s family pastor and the professor who was so important in his education were both significantly influenced by Wolff’s philosophy, so that their young student was easily drawn into that orbit. But he also came to study British Empiricists and was particularly disturbed by the challenges posed by the skeptical David Hume, which would gradually undermine his attachment to rationalism. A vital feature of Kant’s mature philosophy is his attempt to work out a synthesis of these two great rival approaches.
Fourth, the eighteenth century was the heyday of the intellectual movement of the Enlightenment in Europe (as well as in North America), which was committed to ideals that Kant would appropriate as his own—including those of reason, experience, science, liberty, and progress. Frederick II, who was the Prussian king for most of Kant’s adult life (from 1740 to 1786) was called both “Frederick the Great” and “the Enlightenment King.” Hume and Wolff were both Enlightenment philosophers, as was Kant himself, who published a sort of manifesto for the movement, called “What Is Enlightenment?” (1784). There he calls his an age of developing enlightenment, though not yet a fully enlightened age. He champions the cause of the free use of reason in public discussion, including freedom from censorship regarding publishing on religion (Essays, pp. 41-46).
Fifth, Kant himself faced a personal crisis when the Prussian government condemned his published book, Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone. As long as Frederick the Great, “the Enlightenment King,” ruled, Kant and other Prussian scholars had broad latitude to publish controversial religious ideas in an intellectual atmosphere of general tolerance. But Frederick was succeeded by his illiberal nephew, Frederick William II, who appointed a former preacher named Wöllner as his reactionary minister of spiritual affairs. The anti-Enlightenment Wöllner issued edicts forbidding any deviations from orthodox Biblical doctrines and requiring approval by official state censors, prior to publication, for all works dealing with religion. Kant managed to get the first book of his Religion cleared by one of Wöllner’s censors in Berlin. But he was denied permission to publish Book II, which was seen as violating orthodox Biblical doctrines. Having publicly espoused the right of scholars to publish even controversial ideas, Kant sought and got permission from the philosophical faculty at Jena (which also had that authority) to publish the second, third, and fourth books of his Religion and proceeded to do so. When Wöllner found out about it, he was furious and sent Kant a letter, which he had written and signed, on behalf of the king, censuring Kant and threatening him with harsh consequences, should he ever repeat the offense. Kant wrote a reply to the king, promising, “as your Majesty’s most loyal subject,” to refrain from all further public discussion of religion. Until that king died (in 1797), Kant kept his promise. But, as he later explained (Theology, pp. 239-243), that carefully worded qualifying phrase meant that the commitment would pass with that king, after whose death Kant, in fact, did resume publishing on religion.
Kant’s pre-critical writings are those that precede his Inaugural Dissertation of 1770, which marked his assumption of the chair in logic and metaphysics at the university. These writings reflect a general commitment to the Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalist tradition. Near the beginning of his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens of 1755, Kant observes that the harmonious order of the universe points to its divinely governing first Cause; near the end of it, he writes that even now the universe is permeated by the divine energy of an omnipotent Deity (Cosmogony, pp. 14 and 153). In his New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (of the same year), he points to God’s existence as the necessary condition of all possibility (Exposition, pp. 224-225).
In The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God of 1763, after warning his readers that any attempt at proving divine reality will plunge us into the “dark ocean without coasts and without lighthouses” that is metaphysics, he develops that line of argumentation towards God as the unconditioned condition of all possibility. He denies the Cartesian thesis that existence is a predicate, thus undermining modern versions of the Ontological Argument. The absolutely necessary Being that is the ground of all possibility must be one, simple, immutable, eternal, the highest reality, and a spirit, he argues. He analyzes possible theoretical proofs of God into four possible sorts. Two of these—the Ontological, which he rejects, and his own—are based on possibility; the other two—the Cosmological and the Teleological (Design), both of which he deems inconclusive—are empirical. The final sentence of the book maintains that, though we must be convinced of God’s existence, logically demonstrating it is not required (Basis, pp. 43, 45, 57, 69, 71, 79, 81, 83, 87, 223, 225, 229, 231, and 239). That same year, Kant also published his Enquiry concerning the Clarity of the Principles of Natural Theology and Ethics. Here, while still expressing doubts that any metaphysical system of knowledge has yet been achieved, he nevertheless maintains his confidence that rational argumentation can lead to metaphysical knowledge, including that of God, as the absolutely necessary Being (Writings, pp. 14, 25, and 29-30). What we see in these pre-critical writings is the stamp of Leibnizian-Wolffian rationalism, but also the developing influence of Hume, whom Kant was surely studying during this period.
The heart of Kant’s philosophical system is the triad of books constituting his great critiques: his Critique of Pure Reason, published in 1781 (the A edition), with a significantly revised second edition appearing in 1787 (the B edition); his Critique of Practical Reason, published in 1788; and his Critique of Judgment, published in 1790.
Though some key ideas of the Critique of Pure Reason were adumbrated in Kant’s Inaugural Dissertation of 1770 (in Writings), this first Critique is revolutionary in the sense that, because of it, the history of philosophy became radically different from what it had been before its publication. We cannot adequately explore all of the game-changing details of the epistemology (theory of knowledge) he develops there, which has been discussed elsewhere in the IEP (see “Immanuel Kant: Metaphysics”), but will only consider the elements that have a direct bearing on his philosophy of religion.
The monumental breakthrough of this book is Kant’s invention of the transcendental method in philosophy, which allows him to discover a middle path between modern rationalism, which attributes intellectual intuition (for example, innate ideas) to humans, enabling them to have universal and necessary factual knowledge, and modern empiricism, which maintains that we only have sensible intuition, making it difficult to see how we can ever achieve universal and necessary factual knowledge through reason. Kant argues that both sides are partly correct and partly mistaken. He agrees with the empiricists that all human factual knowledge begins with sensible intuition (which is the only sort we have), but avoids the skeptical conclusions to which this leads them by agreeing with the rationalists that we bring something a priori to the knowing process, while rejecting their dogmatic assumption that it must be the innate ideas of intellectual intuition. According to Kant, universal and necessary factual knowledge requires both sensible experience, providing its content, and a priori structures of the mind, providing its form. Either without the other is insufficient. He famously writes, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (Critique, A51/B75). Without empirical, sensible content, there is nothing for us to know; but without those a priori structures, we have no way of giving intelligible form to whatever content we may have.
The transcendental method seeks the necessary a priori conditions of experience, of knowledge, and of metaphysical speculation. The two a priori forms of sensibility are time and space: that is, for us to make sense of them, all objects of sensation, whether external or internal, must be temporally organizable and all objects of external sensation must also be spatially organizable. But time and space are only forms of experience and not objects of experience, and they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition. When sensory inputs are received by us and spatio-temporally organized, the a priori necessary condition of our having objective knowledge is that one or more of twelve concepts of the understanding, also called “categories,” must be applied to our spatio-temporal representations. These twelve categories include reality, unity, substance, causality, and existence. Again, none of them is an object of experience; rather, they are all categories of the human mind, necessary for our knowing any objects of experience. And, again, they can only be known to apply to objects of sensible intuition. Now, by its very nature, metaphysics (including theology) necessarily speculates about ultimate reality that is not given to sensible intuition and therefore transcends any and all human perceptual experience. It is a fact of human experience that we do engage in metaphysical speculation. So what are the transcendental conditions of our capacity to do so? Kant’s answer is that they are the three a priori ideas of pure reason—the self or soul, the cosmos or universe as an orderly whole, and God, the one of direct concern to us here. But, as we never can have sensible experience of objects corresponding to such transcendent ideas and as the concepts of the understanding, without which human knowledge is impossible, can only be known to apply to objects of possible experience, knowledge of the soul, of the cosmos, and of God is impossible, in principle.
So what are we to make of ideas that can never yield knowledge? Here Kant makes another innovative contribution to epistemology. He says that ideas can have two possible functions in human thinking. Some (for example, empirical) ideas have a “constitutive” function, in that they can be used to constitute knowledge, while others have only a “regulative” function (Critique, A180/B222), in that, while they can never constitute knowledge, they do serve the heuristic purpose of regulating our thought and action. This is related to Kant’s dualistic distinction between the aspect of reality that comprises all phenomenal appearances and that which involves our noumenal ideas of things-in-themselves. (Although it is important, we cannot here explore this distinction in the depth it deserves.) Because metaphysical ideas are unknowable, they cannot serve any “constitutive” function. Still, they have great “regulative” value for both our thinking and our voluntary choices. They are relevant to our value-commitments, including those of a religious sort. Three such regulative ideas are Kant’s postulates of practical reason, which are “God, freedom, and immortality” (Critique, A3/B7). Although none of them refers to an object of empirical knowledge, he maintains that it is reasonable for us to postulate them as matters of rational faith. This sort of belief, which is subjectively, but not objectively, justifiable, is a middle ground between certain knowledge, which is objectively, as well as subjectively, justified, and mere arbitrary opinion, which is not even subjectively justified (Critique, A822/B850). Such rational belief can be religious—namely, faith in God.
Kant presents four logical puzzles that he calls “antinomies” to establish the natural dialectical illusions that our reason inevitably encounters when it engages metaphysical questions about cosmology in an open-minded fashion. The fourth of these particularly concerns us here, as reason purports to be able to prove both that there must be an absolutely necessary Being and that no such Being can exist. His dualism can expose this apparent contradiction as bogus, maintaining that in the realm of phenomenal appearances, everything exists contingently, with no necessary Being, but that in the realm of noumenal things-in-themselves there can be such a necessary Being.
But, we might wonder, what about the traditional arguments for God? If even one of them proves logically conclusive, would not that constitute some sort of knowledge of God? Here we encounter yet another great passage in the first Critique, where Kant’s epistemology leads him to a trenchant undermining of all such arguments. He maintains that there is a trichotomy of types of speculative arguments for God: the “physico-theological” Argument from Design, various Cosmological Arguments, and the non-empirical “Ontological” Argument. He cleverly shows that the first of these, even if it worked, would only establish a relatively intelligent and powerful architect of the world and not a necessarily existing Creator. In order to establish it as a necessary Being, some version of the second approach is needed. But, if that worked, it would still fail to show that the necessary creator is an infinitely perfect Being, worthy of religious devotion. Only the Ontological Argument will suffice to establish that. But here the problems accumulate. The Ontological Argument fails because it tries to attribute infinite, necessary existence to God; but existence, far from being a real predicate of anything, is merely a concept of the human understanding. Then the cosmological arguments also fail, in trying to establish that God is the necessary ultimate cause of the world, for both causality and necessity are merely categories of human understanding. Although Kant exhibits considerable respect for the teleological argument from design, in addition to its conclusion being so disappointingly limited, it also fails as a logical demonstration, in trying to show that an intelligent Designer must exist to account for the alleged intelligent design of the world. The problem is that we do not and cannot ever experience the world as a coherent whole, so that the argument’s premise is merely assumed without foundation. Thus Kant undermines the entire project of any philosophical theology that pretends to establish any knowledge of God (Critique, A592/B620-A614/B642 and A620/B648-A636/B664). Yet he remains a champion of religious faith as rationally justifiable. So how can he make such a position philosophically credible?
Here we must turn to his ingenious Critique of Practical Reason. Although it is essentially a work of ethics, a significant part of it is devoted to establishing belief in God (as well as in the immortality of the soul) as a rationally justifiable postulate of practical reason, by means of what has come to be called his “moral argument.” The argument hinges on his claim that we have a moral duty to help bring about, not just the supreme good of moral virtue, which we can achieve by our own efforts in this life, but also “the highest good,” which is the “perfect” correlation of “happiness in exact proportion to morality.” Since there cannot be any moral obligation that it is impossible to meet (“ought” implies “can”), achieving this highest good must be possible. However, there is no reason to believe that it can ever be achieved by us alone, acting either individually or collectively, in this life. So it would seem that all our efforts in this life cannot suffice to achieve the highest good. Yet there must be such a sufficient condition, supernatural and with attributes far exceeding ours, identifiable with God, with whom we can collaborate in the achievement of the highest good, not merely here and now but in the hereafter. Thus he establishes God and human immortality as “morally necessary” hypotheses, matters of “rational faith.” This is also the basis of Kant’s idea of moral religion, which we shall discuss in more detail below. But, for now, we can observe his definition of “religion” as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.” Thus the moral argument is not purely speculative but has a practical orientation. Kant does not pretend that the moral argument is constitutive of any knowledge. If he did, it could be easily refuted by denying that we have any obligation to achieve the highest good, because it is, for us, an impossible ideal. The moral argument rather deals with God as a regulative idea that can be shown to be a matter of rational belief. The famous sentence near the end of the second Critique provides a convenient bridge between it and the third: “Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and awe, the oftener and more steadily we reflect on them: the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me” (Reason, pp. 114-115/AA V: 110-111, 126-130/AA V: 121-126, 134/AA V: 129-130, and 166/AA V: 161). As morality leads Kant to God and religion, so does the awesome teleological order of the universe.
Although Kant’s Critique of Judgment is also not essentially a work in the philosophy of religion, its long appendix contains an important section that is germane for our purposes. We recall that, while criticizing the teleological argument from design, Kant exhibited a high regard for it. Such physical teleology points to a somewhat intelligent and powerful designing cause of the world. But now Kant pursues moral teleology, which will connect such a deity to our own practical purposes—not only to our natural desire for happiness, but to our moral worthiness to achieve it, which is a function of our own virtuous good will. He gives us another version of his moral argument for God, conceived not as the amoral, impersonal metaphysical principle indicated by the teleological argument from design, but rather as a personal deity who is the moral legislator and governor of the world. Again, all this points to God as a regulative matter of “moral faith,” without any pretense of establishing any theological knowledge (which would violate Kant’s own epistemology). Such faith is inescapably doubtful, in that it remains reasonable to maintain some doubt regarding it, and a matter of trust in teleological ends towards which we should be striving. Nor should we be so presumptuous as to suppose that we can ever comprehend God’s nature or purposes. It is only by analogy that we can contemplate such matters at all (Judgment, pp. 295-338/AA II: 442-485), a point which Kant more carefully develops in his Prolegomena.
Most—but not all—of the religious epistemology that is of note in Kant’s Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics is already contained in his more philosophically impressive first Critique and will not be repeated here. But a few pages of its “Conclusion” add something that we have not yet considered. One of the abiding problems of the philosophy of religion is how we can speak (and even think) about God except in anthropomorphic human terms without resorting to an indeterminate fog of ineffable mysticism. The great rationalists are particularly challenged here, and Hume, whom Kant credits with awaking him from his dogmatic slumbers, mercilessly exploits their dilemma. Kant’s project continues to be to navigate a perilous middle path between the equally problematic approaches of anthropomorphism and mysticism. Kant appreciates the dilemma as acutely as Hume, but wants to solve it rather than merely highlighting it. Hume means to replace theism with an indeterminate deism. Kant, himself a theist, admits that Hume’s objections against theism are devastating but holds that his arguments undermine only attempted deistic proofs and not deistic beliefs. Remembering that the concepts of the understanding cannot be known to apply to anything that transcends all possible experience, we can see that it will be a challenge for Kant to evade Hume’s dilemma. His approach is to distinguish between a malignant “dogmatic anthropomorphism,” which tries literally to attribute to God natural qualities, such as those attributable to humans, and a more benign “symbolic anthropomorphism,” which merely draws an analogy between God’s relation to our world and relations among things in our world, while avoiding thinking of them as identical. Kant’s example is helpful here: while we have no possible natural knowledge of God’s love for us and should acknowledge that it cannot be identical to any (necessarily limited) human love, we can use analogical language to think and talk about God’s love for us—as the love of human parents is directed to the welfare of their children, so God’s love for us is directed to human well-being. Thus, Kant maintains, we can avoid the vicious sort of dogmatic anthropomorphism which Hume rightly attacks and, for example, attribute to God a rational relationship to our world without pretending that divine reason is exactly the same as ours, for example, discursive and, thus, limited (Prolegomena, pp. 5, 19, and 96-99). Thinking and speaking of God with analogous language can facilitate a theology that neither is anthropomorphic in a bad way nor succumbs to the dialectical illusions from which Kant’s epistemology would save us.
A somewhat neglected, but still important, dimension of Kant’s philosophy of religion can be found in his Lectures on Philosophical Theology, which comprises an introduction, a first part on transcendental theology, and a second part on moral theology. After maintaining that rational theology’s essential value is practical rather than speculative, he defines religion as “the application of theology to morality,” which is a bit broader than the definition of the second Critique but is in line with it. He conceives of the God of rational theology as the causal author and moral ruler of the world. He considers himself a theist rather than a deist because he is committed to a free and moral “living God,” holy and just, as well as omniscient and omnipotent, as a postulate of practical reason (Lectures, pp. 24, 26, 30, and 41-42). In the first part of the Lectures, Kant considers the speculative proofs of God, as well as the use of analogous language as a hedge against gross anthropomorphism. But, as we have already discussed the more famous treatments of these topics (in the first Critique and the Prolegomena, respectively), we can pass over these here.
The second part of the Lectures starts with a version of the moral argument, which we have already considered (in connection with its more famous treatment in the second Critique). This line of reasoning leads to the moral attributes of “God as a holy lawgiver, a benevolent sustainer of the world, and a just judge.” A major problem of the philosophy of religion we have yet to consider is the problem of evil. If, indeed, an infinitely perfect and supremely moral God governs the world with divine providence, how can there be so much evil, in all its multiple forms, in that world? More specifically, for Kant, how can moral evil be consistent with divine holiness, pain and suffering with divine benevolence, and morally undeserved well-being and the lack of it with divine justice? Despite God’s holiness, moral evil is a function of our free will as rational creatures and our responsibility for our own development. Despite God’s benevolence towards personal creatures, the physical evils of pain and suffering provide incentives for our progressing towards fulfillment. And, despite God’s justice, the disproportion between virtue and well-being in this life must be temporary, to be rectified hereafter (Lectures, pp. 112 and 115-121). This earlier (from the 1780s) attempt at theodicy on Kant’s part was neither particularly original nor particularly convincing.
Kant deals with the problem of evil more impressively in his “On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy” (1791). He analyzes possible attempts at theodicy into three approaches: (a) it can argue that what we consider evil actually is not, so that there is really no conflict; (b) it can argue that the conflict between evil and God is naturally necessitated; and (c) it can argue that evil, though contingent, is the result of someone other than God. Kant’s own earlier work attempted to combine the second and third strategies; but here he concludes that all of these approaches must fail. More specifically, attempts to show that there is no pernicious conflict between moral evil and God’s holiness, between the physical evils of pain and suffering and God’s goodness, and, finally, between the disproportion of happiness and misery to virtue and vice and God’s justice, all fail using all three approaches. Thus Kant’s considered conclusion is negative: the doubts that are legitimately raised by the evil in our world can neither be conclusively answered nor conclusively refute God’s infinite moral wisdom. Thus, theodicy, like matters of religion more generally, turns out to be a matter of faith and not one of knowledge (Theology, pp. 24-34; see also “What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking?” in Theology pp. 12-15, and “Speculative Beginning of Human History,” in Essays). In a work published the year he died, Kant analyzes the core of his theological doctrine into three articles of faith: (1) he believes in one God, who is the causal source of all good in the world; (2) he believes in the possibility of harmonizing God’s purposes with our greatest good; and (3) he believes in human immortality as the necessary condition of our continued approach to the highest good possible (Metaphysics, p. 131). All of these doctrines of faith can be rationally supported. This leaves open the issue of whether further religious beliefs, drawn from revelation, can be added to this core. As Kant makes clear in The Conflict of the Faculties, he does not deny that divinely revealed truths are possible, but only that they are knowable. So, we might wonder, of what practical use is revelation if it cannot be an object of knowledge? His answer is that, even if it can never constitute knowledge, it can serve the regulative function of edification—contributing to our moral improvement and adding motivation to our moral purposes (Theology, pp. 283 and 287-288).
Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone of 1793 is considered by some to be the most underrated book in the entire history of the philosophy of religion. In a letter to a theologian, he subsequently repeats the questions with which he thinks any philosophical system should deal (three of them in his first Critique, A 805/B 833; see also his Logic, pp. 28-30, where he adds a fourth). The first one, regarding human knowledge, had been covered in the first Critique and the Prolegomena; the second, regarding practical values, was considered in his various writings on ethics and socio-political philosophy; the fourth, regarding human nature, had been covered in his philosophical anthropology. Now, with Religion, Kant addresses the third question of what we can reasonably hope for, and moves towards completing his system (Correspondence, pp. 458-459). Thus we can conclude that Kant himself sees this book, the publication of which got him into trouble with the Prussian government, as crucial to his philosophical purposes. Hence we should take it seriously here as representative of his own rational theology. In his Preface to the first edition, he again points out that reflection on moral obligation should lead us to religion (Religion, pp. 3-6; see also Education, pp. 111-114, for his analysis of how religion should be taught to children). In his Preface to the second edition, he offers an illuminating metaphor of two concentric circles—the inner one representing the core of the one religion of pure moral reason and the outer one representing many revealed historical religions, all of which should include and build on that core (Religion, p. 11).
In the first book, Kant considers our innate natural predisposition to good (in being animals, humans, and persons) and our equally innate propensity to evil (in our frailty, impurity, and wickedness). Whether we end up being praiseworthy or blameworthy depends, not on our sensuous nature or our theoretical reason, but on the use we make of our free will, which is naturally oriented towards both good and evil. There are two dimensions of what we call “will,” both of which are important in grasping Kant’s view here. On the one hand, there is our capacity for free choice (his word is “Willkür”); on the other hand, there is practical reason as rationally legislating moral choice and action (“Wille”). Thus a “good will” chooses in accordance with the rational demands of the moral law. At any rate, we are born with a propensity to evil; but whether we become evil depends on our own free acts of will. Thus Kant demythologizes the Christian doctrine of original sin. He then distinguishes between the phony religion of mere worship designed to win favor for ourselves and the authentic moral religion of virtuous behavior. Although it is legitimate to hope for God’s grace as helping us to lead morally good lives, it is mere fanaticism to imagine that we can become good by soliciting grace rather than freely choosing virtuous conduct (Religion, pp. 21-26, 30, 32, 35, and 47-49).
In the second book, Jesus of Nazareth is presented as an archetype symbolizing our ability to resist our propensity to evil and to approach the virtuous ideal of moral perfection. What Kant does not say is whether or not, in addition to being a moral model whose example we should try to follow, Jesus is also of divine origin in some unique manner attested to by miracles. Just as he neither denies nor affirms the divinity of Christ, so Kant avoids committing himself regarding belief in miracles, which can lead us into superstition (Religion, pp. 51, 54, 57, 74, 77, and 79-82; for more on the mystery of the Incarnation, see Theology, pp. 264-265).
In the third book, Kant expresses his rational hope for the ultimate supremacy of good over evil and the establishment of an ethical commonwealth of persons under a personal God, who is the divine law-giver and moral ruler—the ideal of the invisible church, as opposed to actual realities of visible churches. Whereas statutory religion focuses on obedient external behavior, true religion concerns internal commitment (or good will). Mere worship is a worthless substitute for good choices and virtuous conduct. Here Kant makes a particularly provocative claim, that, ultimately, there is only “one (true) religion,” the religion of morality, while there can be various historical “faiths” promoting it. From this perspective, Judaism, Islam, and the various denominations of Christianity are all legitimate faiths, to be located in Kant’s metaphorical outer circle, including the true religion of morality, his metaphorical inner circle. However, some faiths can be relatively more adequate expressions of the religion of moral reason than others (Religion, pp. 86, 89-92, 95, and 97-98; see also Theology, pp. 262-265).
In his particularly inflammatory fourth book, Kant probes the distinction between legitimate religious service and the pseudo-service of religious clericalism. From our human perspective, religion—both revealed and natural—should be regarded as “the recognition of all duties as divine commands.” Kant embraces the position of “pure rationalist,” rather than naturalism (which denies divine revelation) or pure supernaturalism (which considers it necessary), in that he accepts the possibility of revelation but does not dogmatically regard it as necessary. He acknowledges scripture scholars’ valuable role in helping to disseminate religious truth so long as they respect “universal human reason as the supremely commanding principle.” Christianity is both a natural and a revealed religion, and Kant shows how the gospel of Matthew expresses Kantian ethics, with Jesus as its wise moral teacher. Following his moral teachings is the means to true religious service, whereas substituting an attachment to external worship allegedly required instead of moral behavior is mere “pseudo-service.” Superstition and fanaticism are typical aspects of such illusions and substituting superstitious rituals for morally virtuous conduct is mere “fetishism.” Kant denounces clericalism as promoting such misguided pseudo-service. The ideal of genuine godliness comprises a combination of fear of God and love of God, which should converge to help render us persons of morally good will. So what about such religious practices as prayer, church attendance, and participation in sacraments? They can be either good expressions of devotion, if they bind us together in moral community (occupying Kant’s inner circle) or bad expressions of mere pseudo-service, if designed to ingratiate us with God (an accretion to the outer circle not rooted in the inner circle of genuine moral commitment). Mere external shows of piety must never be substituted for authentic inner virtue (Religion, pp. 142-143, 147-153, 156-158, 162, 165, 167-168, 170, and 181-189; cf. Ethics, pp. 78-116). Kant’s Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone provides a capstone for the revolutionary treatment of religion associated with his critical philosophy.
Yet it is quite admirable that, in the last few years of his life, despite struggling with the onset of dementia that made any such task increasingly challenging, he kept trying to explore new dimensions of the philosophy of religion. As has already been admitted, the results, located in his fragmentary Opus Postumum, are more provocative than satisfying; yet they are nevertheless worthy of brief consideration here. The work comprises a vast quantity of scattered remarks, many of which are familiar to readers of his earlier writings, but some of which represent acute, fresh insights, albeit none of them adequately developed. Here again Kant writes that reflection on moral duty, determinable by means of the categorical imperative, can reasonably lead us to the idea of God, as a rational moral agent with unlimited power over the realms of nature and of freedom, who prescribes our duties as divine commands. He then adds a bold idea, which breaks with his own previous orthodox theological concept of a transcendent God. Developing his old notion of God as “an ideal of human reason,” he identifies God with our concept of moral duty rather than as an independent substance. This notion of an immanent God (that is, one internal to our world rather than transcendently separate from it), while not carefully worked out by Kant himself, would be developed by later German Idealists (most significantly, Hegel). While conceding that we think of God as an omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent personal Being, Kant now denies that personality can be legitimately attributed to God—again stepping out of mainstream Judeo-Christian doctrine. Also, rather than still postulating God as an independent reality, he here says that “God and the world are correlates,” interdependent and mutually implicating one another. Unfortunately, we can only conjecture as to what, exactly, he means by this claim. Referring to Spinoza (the most important pre-Kantian panentheist in modern philosophy), he pushes the point even more radically, writing, “I am in the highest being.” But, then, Kant goes on to condemn Spinoza’s panentheistic conception of God (that is, the view also found in Hegel, that God contains our world rather than transcending it) as outlandish “enthusiastic” fanaticism. In fact, he suggests the inverse—instead of holding that we are in God, Kant now indicates that God is in us, though different from us, in that God’s reality is ideal rather than substantial. He proceeds to maintain that not only God is infinite, but so are the world and rational freedom, identifying God with “the inner vital spirit of man in the world.” Kant makes one final controversial claim when he denies that a concept of God is even essential to religion (Opus, pp. 200-204, 210-211, 213-214, 225, 229, 231, 234-236, 239-240, and 248). This denial is clearly not an aspect of Kant’s thought that is familiar and famous, and we should beware of presuming that we understand precisely what should be made of it. But what is undeniable is what a long and soaring intellectual journey Kant made as he developed his ideas on God and religion from his pre-critical writings through the central, revolutionary works of his philosophical maturity and into the puzzling but tantalizing thought-experiments of his old age.
Wayne P. Pomerleau
U. S. A.
Last updated: November 25, 2011 | Originally published: