Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) is one of the most influential philosophers in the history of Western philosophy. His contributions to metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and aesthetics have had a profound impact on almost every philosophical movement that followed him. This article focuses on his metaphysics and epistemology in one of his most important works, The Critique of Pure Reason. A large part of Kant’s work addresses the question “What can we know?” The answer, if it can be stated simply, is that our knowledge is constrained to mathematics and the science of the natural, empirical world. It is impossible, Kant argues, to extend knowledge to the supersensible realm of speculative metaphysics. The reason that knowledge has these constraints, Kant argues, is that the mind plays an active role in constituting the features of experience and limiting the mind’s access only to the empirical realm of space and time.
Kant responded to his predecessors by arguing against the Empiricists that the mind is not a blank slate that is written upon by the empirical world, and by rejecting the Rationalists’ notion that pure, a priori knowledge of a mind-independent world was possible. Reason itself is structured with forms of experience and categories that give a phenomenal and logical structure to any possible object of empirical experience. These categories cannot be circumvented to get at a mind-independent world, but they are necessary for experience of spatio-temporal objects with their causal behavior and logical properties. These two theses constitute Kant’s famous transcendental idealism and empirical realism.
Kant’s contributions to ethics have been just as substantial, if not more so, than his work in metaphysics and epistemology. He is the most important proponent in philosophical history of deontological, or duty based, ethics. In Kant’s view, the sole feature that gives an action moral worth is not the outcome that is achieved by the action, but the motive that is behind the action. And the only motive that can endow an act with moral value, he argues, is one that arises from universal principles discovered by reason. The categorical imperative is Kant’s famous statement of this duty: “Act only according to that maxim by which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law.”
In order to understand Kant’s position, we must understand the philosophical background that he was reacting to. First, this article presents a brief overview of his predecessor’s positions with a brief statement of Kant’s objections, then I will return to a more detailed exposition of Kant’s arguments. There are two major historical movements in the early modern period of philosophy that had a significant impact on Kant: Empiricism and Rationalism. Kant argues that both the method and the content of these philosophers’ arguments contain serious flaws. A central epistemological problem for philosophers in both movements was determining how we can escape from within the confines of the human mind and the immediately knowable content of our own thoughts to acquire knowledge of the world outside of us. The Empiricists sought to accomplish this through the senses and a posteriori reasoning. The Rationalists attempted to use a priori reasoning to build the necessary bridge. A posteriori reasoning depends upon experience or contingent events in the world to provide us with information. That “Bill Clinton was president of the United States in 1999,” for example, is something that I can know only through experience; I cannot determine this to be true through an analysis of the concepts of “president” or “Bill Clinton.” A priori reasoning, in contrast, does not depend upon experience to inform it. The concept “bachelor” logically entails the ideas of an unmarried, adult, human male without my needing to conduct a survey of bachelors and men who are unmarried. Kant believed that this twofold distinction in kinds of knowledge was inadequate to the task of understanding metaphysics for reasons we will discuss in a moment.
Empiricists, such as Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, argued that human knowledge originates in our sensations. Locke, for instance, was a representative realist about the external world and placed great confidence in the ability of the senses to inform us of the properties that empirical objects really have in themselves. Locke had also argued that the mind is a blank slate, or a tabula rasa, that becomes populated with ideas by its interactions with the world. Experience teaches us everything, including concepts of relationship, identity, causation, and so on. Kant argues that the blank slate model of the mind is insufficient to explain the beliefs about objects that we have; some components of our beliefs must be brought by the mind to experience.
Berkeley’s strict phenomenalism, in contrast to Locke, raised questions about the inference from the character of our sensations to conclusions about the real properties of mind-independent objects. Since the human mind is strictly limited to the senses for its input, Berkeley argued, it has no independent means by which to verify the accuracy of the match between sensations and the properties that objects possess in themselves. In fact, Berkeley rejected the very idea of mind-independent objects on the grounds that a mind is, by its nature, incapable of possessing an idea of such a thing. Hence, in Kant’s terms, Berkeley was a material idealist. To the material idealist, knowledge of material objects is ideal or unachievable, not real. For Berkeley, mind-independent material objects are impossible and unknowable. In our sense experience we only have access to our mental representations, not to objects themselves. Berkeley argues that our judgments about objects are really judgments about these mental representations alone, not the substance that gives rise to them. In the Refutation of Material Idealism, Kant argues that material idealism is actually incompatible with a position that Berkeley held, namely that we are capable of making judgments about our experience.
David Hume pursued Berkeley’s empirical line of inquiry even further, calling into question even more of our common sense beliefs about the source and support of our sense perceptions. Hume maintains that we cannot provide a priori or a posteriori justifications for a number of our beliefs like, “Objects and subjects persist identically over time,” or “Every event must have a cause.” In Hume’s hands, it becomes clear that empiricism cannot give us an epistemological justification for the claims about objects, subjects, and causes that we took to be most obvious and certain about the world.
Kant expresses deep dissatisfaction with the idealistic and seemingly skeptical results of the empirical lines of inquiry. In each case, Kant gives a number of arguments to show that Locke’s, Berkeley’s, and Hume’s empiricist positions are untenable because they necessarily presuppose the very claims they set out to disprove. In fact, any coherent account of how we perform even the most rudimentary mental acts of self-awareness and making judgments about objects must presuppose these claims, Kant argues. Hence, while Kant is sympathetic with many parts of empiricism, ultimately it cannot be a satisfactory account of our experience of the world.
The Rationalists, principally Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, approached the problems of human knowledge from another angle. They hoped to escape the epistemological confines of the mind by constructing knowledge of the external world, the self, the soul, God, ethics, and science out of the simplest, indubitable ideas possessed innately by the mind. Leibniz in particular, thought that the world was knowable a priori, through an analysis of ideas and derivations done through logic. Supersensible knowledge, the Rationalists argued, can be achieved by means of reason. Descartes believed that certain truths, that “if I am thinking, I exist,” for example, are invulnerable to the most pernicious skepticism. Armed with the knowledge of his own existence, Descartes hoped to build a foundation for all knowledge.
Kant’s Refutation of Material Idealism works against Descartes’ project as well as Berkeley’s. Descartes believed that he could infer the existence of objects in space outside of him based on his awareness of his own existence coupled with an argument that God exists and is not deceiving him about the evidence of his senses. Kant argues in the Refutation chapter that knowledge of external objects cannot be inferential. Rather, the capacity to be aware of one’s own existence in Descartes’ famous cogito argument already presupposes that existence of objects in space and time outside of me.
Kant had also come to doubt the claims of the Rationalists because of what he called Antinomies, or contradictory, but validly proven pairs of claims that reason is compelled toward. From the basic principles that the Rationalists held, it is possible, Kant argues, to prove conflicting claims like, “The world has a beginning in time and is limited as regards space,” and “The world has no beginning, and no limits in space.” (A 426/B 454) Kant claims that antinomies like this one reveal fundamental methodological and metaphysical mistakes in the rationalist project. The contradictory claims could both be proven because they both shared the mistaken metaphysical assumption that we can have knowledge of things as they are in themselves, independent of the conditions of our experience of them.
The Antinomies can be resolved, Kant argues, if we understand the proper function and domain of the various faculties that contribute to produce knowledge. We must recognize that we cannot know things as they are in themselves and that our knowledge is subject to the conditions of our experience. The Rationalist project was doomed to failure because it did not take note of the contribution that our faculty of reason makes to our experience of objects. Their a priori analysis of our ideas could inform us about the content of our ideas, but it could not give a coherent demonstration of metaphysical truths about the external world, the self, the soul, God, and so on.
Kant’s answer to the problems generated by the two traditions mentioned above changed the face of philosophy. First, Kant argued that that old division between a priori truths and a posteriori truths employed by both camps was insufficient to describe the sort of metaphysical claims that were under dispute. An analysis of knowledge also requires a distinction between synthetic and analytic truths. In an analytic claim, the predicate is contained within the subject. In the claim, “Every body occupies space,” the property of occupying space is revealed in an analysis of what it means to be a body. The subject of a synthetic claim, however, does not contain the predicate. In, “This tree is 120 feet tall,” the concepts are synthesized or brought together to form a new claim that is not contained in any of the individual concepts. The Empiricists had not been able to prove synthetic a priori claims like “Every event must have a cause,” because they had conflated “synthetic” and “a posteriori” as well as “analytic” and “a priori.” Then they had assumed that the two resulting categories were exhaustive. A synthetic a priori claim, Kant argues, is one that must be true without appealing to experience, yet the predicate is not logically contained within the subject, so it is no surprise that the Empiricists failed to produce the sought after justification. The Rationalists had similarly conflated the four terms and mistakenly proceeded as if claims like, “The self is a simple substance,” could be proven analytically and a priori.
Synthetic a priori claims, Kant argues, demand an entirely different kind of proof than those required for analytic a priori claims or synthetic a posteriori claims. Indications for how to proceed, Kant says, can be found in the examples of synthetic a priori claims in natural science and mathematics, specifically geometry. Claims like Newton’s, “the quantity of matter is always preserved,” and the geometer’s claim, “the angles of a triangle always add up to 180 degrees” are known a priori, but they cannot be known merely from an analysis of the concepts of matter or triangle. We must “go outside and beyond the concept. . . joining to it a priori in thought something which I have not thought in it.” (B 18) A synthetic a priori claim constructs upon and adds to what is contained analytically in a concept without appealing to experience. So if we are to solve the problems generated by Empiricism and Rationalism, the central question of metaphysics in the Critique of Pure Reason reduces to “How are synthetic a priori judgments possible?” (19) (All references to The Critique of Pure Reason will be to the A (1781) and B(1787) edition pages in Werner Pluhar’s translation. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996.) If we can answer that question, then we can determine the possibility, legitimacy, and range of all metaphysical claims.
Kant’s answer to the question is complicated, but his conclusion is that a number of synthetic a priori claims, like those from geometry and the natural sciences, are true because of the structure of the mind that knows them. “Every event must have a cause” cannot be proven by experience, but experience is impossible without it because it describes the way the mind must necessarily order its representations. We can understand Kant’s argument again by considering his predecessors. According to the Rationalist and Empiricist traditions, the mind is passive either because it finds itself possessing innate, well-formed ideas ready for analysis, or because it receives ideas of objects into a kind of empty theater, or blank slate. Kant’s crucial insight here is to argue that experience of a world as we have it is only possible if the mind provides a systematic structuring of its representations. This structuring is below the level of, or logically prior to, the mental representations that the Empiricists and Rationalists analyzed. Their epistemological and metaphysical theories could not adequately explain the sort of judgments or experience we have because they only considered the results of the mind’s interaction with the world, not the nature of the mind’s contribution. Kant’s methodological innovation was to employ what he calls a transcendental argument to prove synthetic a priori claims. Typically, a transcendental argument attempts to prove a conclusion about the necessary structure of knowledge on the basis of an incontrovertible mental act. Kant argues in the Refutation of Material Idealism that the fact that “There are objects that exist in space and time outside of me,” (B 274) which cannot be proven by a priori or a posteriori methods, is a necessary condition of the possibility of being aware of one’s own existence. It would not be possible to be aware of myself as existing, he says, without presupposing the existing of something permanent outside of me to distinguish myself from. I am aware of myself as existing. Therefore, there is something permanent outside of me.
This argument is one of many transcendental arguments that Kant gives that focuses on the contribution that the mind itself makes to its experience. These arguments lead Kant to conclude that the Empiricists’ assertion that experience is the source of all our ideas. It must be the mind’s structuring, Kant argues, that makes experience possible. If there are features of experience that the mind brings to objects rather than given to the mind by objects, that would explain why they are indispensable to experience but unsubstantiated in it. And that would explain why we can give a transcendental argument for the necessity of these features. Kant thought that Berkeley and Hume identified at least part of the mind’s a priori contribution to experience with the list of claims that they said were unsubstantiated on empirical grounds: “Every event must have a cause,” “There are mind-independent objects that persist over time,” and “Identical subjects persist over time.” The empiricist project must be incomplete since these claims are necessarily presupposed in our judgments, a point Berkeley and Hume failed to see. So, Kant argues that a philosophical investigation into the nature of the external world must be as much an inquiry into the features and activity of the mind that knows it.
The idea that the mind plays an active role in structuring reality is so familiar to us now that it is difficult for us to see what a pivotal insight this was for Kant. He was well aware of the idea’s power to overturn the philosophical worldviews of his contemporaries and predecessors, however. He even somewhat immodestly likens his situation to that of Copernicus in revolutionizing our worldview. In the Lockean view, mental content is given to the mind by the objects in the world. Their properties migrate into the mind, revealing the true nature of objects. Kant says, “Thus far it has been assumed that all our cognition must conform to objects” (B xvi). But that approach cannot explain why some claims like, “every event must have a cause,” are a priori true. Similarly, Copernicus recognized that the movement of the stars cannot be explained by making them revolve around the observer; it is the observer that must be revolving. Analogously, Kant argued that we must reformulate the way we think about our relationship to objects. It is the mind itself which gives objects at least some of their characteristics because they must conform to its structure and conceptual capacities. Thus, the mind’s active role in helping to create a world that is experiencable must put it at the center of our philosophical investigations. The appropriate starting place for any philosophical inquiry into knowledge, Kant decides, is with the mind that can have that knowledge.
Kant’s critical turn toward the mind of the knower is ambitious and challenging. Kant has rejected the dogmatic metaphysics of the Rationalists that promises supersensible knowledge. And he has argued that Empiricism faces serious limitations. His transcendental method will allow him to analyze the metaphysical requirements of the empirical method without venturing into speculative and ungrounded metaphysics. In this context, determining the “transcendental” components of knowledge means determining, “all knowledge which is occupied not so much with objects as with the mode of our knowledge of objects in so far as this mode of knowledge is to be possible a priori.” (A 12/B 25)
The project of the Critique of Pure Reason is also challenging because in the analysis of the mind’s transcendental contributions to experience we must employ the mind, the only tool we have, to investigate the mind. We must use the faculties of knowledge to determine the limits of knowledge, so Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason is both a critique that takes pure reason as its subject matter, and a critique that is conducted by pure reason.
Kant’s argument that the mind makes an a priori contribution to experiences should not be mistaken for an argument like the Rationalists’ that the mind possesses innate ideas like, “God is a perfect being.” Kant rejects the claim that there are complete propositions like this one etched on the fabric of the mind. He argues that the mind provides a formal structuring that allows for the conjoining of concepts into judgments, but that structuring itself has no content. The mind is devoid of content until interaction with the world actuates these formal constraints. The mind possesses a priori templates for judgments, not a priori judgments.
With Kant’s claim that the mind of the knower makes an active contribution to experience of objects before us, we are in a better position to understand transcendental idealism. Kant’s arguments are designed to show the limitations of our knowledge. The Rationalists believed that we could possess metaphysical knowledge about God, souls, substance, and so forth; they believed such knowledge was transcendentally real. Kant argues, however, that we cannot have knowledge of the realm beyond the empirical. That is, transcendental knowledge is ideal, not real, for minds like ours. Kant identifies two a priori sources of these constraints. The mind has a receptive capacity, or the sensibility, and the mind possesses a conceptual capacity, or the understanding.
In the Transcendental Aesthetic section of the Critique, Kant argues that sensibility is the understanding’s means of accessing objects. The reason synthetic a priori judgments are possible in geometry, Kant argues, is that space is an a priori form of sensibility. That is, we can know the claims of geometry with a priori certainty (which we do) only if experiencing objects in space is the necessary mode of our experience. Kant also argues that we cannot experience objects without being able to represent them spatially. It is impossible to grasp an object as an object unless we delineate the region of space it occupies. Without a spatial representation, our sensations are undifferentiated and we cannot ascribe properties to particular objects. Time, Kant argues, is also necessary as a form or condition of our intuitions of objects. The idea of time itself cannot be gathered from experience because succession and simultaneity of objects, the phenomena that would indicate the passage of time, would be impossible to represent if we did not already possess the capacity to represent objects in time.
Another way to understand Kant’s point here is that it is impossible for us to have any experience of objects that are not in time and space. Furthermore, space and time themselves cannot be perceived directly, so they must be the form by which experience of objects is had. A consciousness that apprehends objects directly, as they are in themselves and not by means of space and time, is possible—God, Kant says, has a purely intuitive consciousness—but our apprehension of objects is always mediated by the conditions of sensibility. Any discursive or concept using consciousness (A 230/B 283) like ours must apprehend objects as occupying a region of space and persisting for some duration of time.
Subjecting sensations to the a priori conditions of space and time is not sufficient to make judging objects possible. Kant argues that the understanding must provide the concepts, which are rules for identifying what is common or universal in different representations.(A 106) He says, “without sensibility no object would be given to us; and without understanding no object would be thought. Thoughts without content are empty; intuitions without concepts are blind.” (B 75) Locke’s mistake was believing that our sensible apprehensions of objects are thinkable and reveal the properties of the objects themselves. In the Analytic of Concepts section of the Critique, Kant argues that in order to think about the input from sensibility, sensations must conform to the conceptual structure that the mind has available to it. By applying concepts, the understanding takes the particulars that are given in sensation and identifies what is common and general about them. A concept of “shelter” for instance, allows me to identify what is common in particular representations of a house, a tent, and a cave.
The empiricist might object at this point by insisting that such concepts do arise from experience, raising questions about Kant’s claim that the mind brings an a priori conceptual structure to the world. Indeed, concepts like “shelter” do arise partly from experience. But Kant raises a more fundamental issue. An empirical derivation is not sufficient to explain all of our concepts. As we have seen, Hume argued, and Kant accepts, that we cannot empirically derive our concepts of causation, substance, self, identity, and so forth. What Hume had failed to see, Kant argues, is that even the possibility of making judgments about objects, to which Hume would assent, presupposes the possession of these fundamental concepts. Hume had argued for a sort of associationism to explain how we arrive at causal beliefs. My idea of a moving cue ball, becomes associated with my idea of the eight ball that is struck and falls into the pocket. Under the right circumstances, repeated impressions of the second following the first produces a belief in me that the first causes the second.
The problem that Kant points out is that a Humean association of ideas already presupposes that we can conceive of identical, persistent objects that have regular, predictable, causal behavior. And being able to conceive of objects in this rich sense presupposes that the mind makes several a priori contributions. I must be able to separate the objects from each other in my sensations, and from my sensations of myself. I must be able to attribute properties to the objects. I must be able to conceive of an external world with its own course of events that is separate from the stream of perceptions in my consciousness. These components of experience cannot be found in experience because they constitute it. The mind’s a priori conceptual contribution to experience can be enumerated by a special set of concepts that make all other empirical concepts and judgments possible. These concepts cannot be experienced directly; they are only manifest as the form which particular judgments of objects take. Kant believes that formal logic has already revealed what the fundamental categories of thought are. The special set of concepts is Kant’s Table of Categories, which are taken mostly from Aristotle with a few revisions:
|Of Quality||Of Relation|
|Reality||Inherence and Subsistence|
|Negation||Causality and Dependence|
While Kant does not give a formal derivation of it, he believes that this is the complete and necessary list of the a priori contributions that the understanding brings to its judgments of the world. Every judgment that the understanding can make must fall under the table of categories. And subsuming spatiotemporal sensations under the formal structure of the categories makes judgments, and ultimately knowledge, of empirical objects possible.
Since objects can only be experienced spatiotemporally, the only application of concepts that yields knowledge is to the empirical, spatiotemporal world. Beyond that realm, there can be no sensations of objects for the understanding to judge, rightly or wrongly. Since intuitions of the physical world are lacking when we speculate about what lies beyond, metaphysical knowledge, or knowledge of the world outside the physical, is impossible. Claiming to have knowledge from the application of concepts beyond the bounds of sensation results in the empty and illusory transcendent metaphysics of Rationalism that Kant reacts against.
It should be pointed out, however, that Kant is not endorsing an idealism about objects like Berkeley’s. That is, Kant does not believe that material objects are unknowable or impossible. While Kant is a transcendental idealist–he believes the nature of objects as they are in themselves is unknowable to us–knowledge of appearances is nevertheless possible. As noted above, in The Refutation of Material Idealism, Kant argues that the ordinary self-consciousness that Berkeley and Descartes would grant implies “the existence of objects in space outside me.” (B 275) Consciousness of myself would not be possible if I were not able to make determinant judgments about objects that exist outside of me and have states that are independent of my inner experience. Another way to put the point is to say that the fact that the mind of the knower makes the a priori contribution does not mean that space and time or the categories are mere figments of the imagination. Kant is an empirical realist about the world we experience; we can know objects as they appear to us. He gives a robust defense of science and the study of the natural world from his argument about the mind’s role in making nature. All discursive, rational beings must conceive of the physical world as spatially and temporally unified, he argues. And the table of categories is derived from the most basic, universal forms of logical inference, Kant believes. Therefore, it must be shared by all rational beings. So those beings also share judgments of an intersubjective, unified, public realm of empirical objects. Hence, objective knowledge of the scientific or natural world is possible. Indeed, Kant believes that the examples of Newton and Galileo show it is actual. So Berkeley’s claims that we do not know objects outside of us and that such knowledge is impossible are both mistaken.
In conjunction with his analysis of the possibility of knowing empirical objects, Kant gives an analysis of the knowing subject that has sometimes been called his transcendental psychology. Much of Kant’s argument can be seen as subjective, not because of variations from mind to mind, but because the source of necessity and universality is in the mind of the knowing subject, not in objects themselves. Kant draws several conclusions about what is necessarily true of any consciousness that employs the faculties of sensibility and understanding to produce empirical judgments. As we have seen, a mind that employs concepts must have a receptive faculty that provides the content of judgments. Space and time are the necessary forms of apprehension for the receptive faculty. The mind that has experience must also have a faculty of combination or synthesis, the imagination for Kant, that apprehends the data of sense, reproduces it for the understanding, and recognizes their features according to the conceptual framework provided by the categories. The mind must also have a faculty of understanding that provides empirical concepts and the categories for judgment. The various faculties that make judgment possible must be unified into one mind. And it must be identical over time if it is going to apply its concepts to objects over time. Kant here addresses Hume’s famous assertion that introspection reveals nothing more than a bundle of sensations that we group together and call the self. Judgments would not be possible, Kant maintains, if the mind that senses is not the same as the mind that possesses the forms of sensibility. And that mind must be the same as the mind that employs the table of categories, that contributes empirical concepts to judgment, and that synthesizes the whole into knowledge of a unified, empirical world. So the fact that we can empirically judge proves, contra Hume, that the mind cannot be a mere bundle of disparate introspected sensations. In his works on ethics Kant will also argue that this mind is the source of spontaneous, free, and moral action. Kant believes that all the threads of his transcendental philosophy come together in this “highest point” which he calls the transcendental unity of apperception.
We have seen the progressive stages of Kant’s analysis of the faculties of the mind which reveals the transcendental structuring of experience performed by these faculties. First, in his analysis of sensibility, he argues for the necessarily spatiotemporal character of sensation. Then Kant analyzes the understanding, the faculty that applies concepts to sensory experience. He concludes that the categories provide a necessary, foundational template for our concepts to map onto our experience. In addition to providing these transcendental concepts, the understanding also is the source of ordinary empirical concepts that make judgments about objects possible. The understanding provides concepts as the rules for identifying the properties in our representations.
Kant’s next concern is with the faculty of judgment, “If understanding as such is explicated as our power of rules, then the power of judgment is the ability to subsume under rules, i.e., to distinguish whether something does or does not fall under a given rule.” (A 132/B 172). The next stage in Kant’s project will be to analyze the formal or transcendental features of experience that enable judgment, if there are any such features besides what the previous stages have identified. The cognitive power of judgment does have a transcendental structure. Kant argues that there are a number of principles that must necessarily be true of experience in order for judgment to be possible. Kant’s analysis of judgment and the arguments for these principles are contained in his Analytic of Principles.
Within the Analytic, Kant first addresses the challenge of subsuming particular sensations under general categories in the Schematism section. Transcendental schemata, Kant argues, allow us to identify the homogeneous features picked out by concepts from the heterogeneous content of our sensations. Judgment is only possible if the mind can recognize the components in the diverse and disorganized data of sense that make those sensations an instance of a concept or concepts. A schema makes it possible, for instance, to subsume the concrete and particular sensations of an Airedale, a Chihuahua, and a Labrador all under the more abstract concept “dog.”
The full extent of Kant’s Copernican revolution becomes even more clear in the rest of the Analytic of Principles. That is, the role of the mind in making nature is not limited to space, time, and the categories. In the Analytic of Principles, Kant argues that even the necessary conformity of objects to natural law arises from the mind. Thus far, Kant’s transcendental method has permitted him to reveal the a priori components of sensations, the a priori concepts. In the sections titled the Axioms, Anticipations, Analogies, and Postulates, he argues that there are a priori judgments that must necessarily govern all appearances of objects. These judgments are a function of the table of categories’ role in determining all possible judgments, so the four sections map onto the four headings of that table. I include all of the a priori judgments, or principles, here to illustrate the earlier claims about Kant’s empirical realism, and to show the intimate relationship Kant saw between his project and that of the natural sciences:
|Axioms of Intuition|
|All intuitions are extensive magnitudes.|
|Anticipations of Perception||Analogies of Experience|
|In all appearances the real that is an object of sensation has intensive magnitude, i.e., a degree.||In all variations by appearances substance is permanent, and its quantum in nature is neither increased nor decreased.|
|All changes occur according to the law of the connection of cause and effect.|
|All substances, insofar as they can be perceived in space as simultaneous, are in thoroughgoing interaction.|
|Postulates of Empirical Thought|
|What agrees (in terms of intuition and concepts) with the formal conditions of experience is possible.|
|What coheres with the material conditions of experience (with sensation) is actual.|
|That whose coherence with the actual is determined according to universal conditions of experience is necessary (exists necessarily)|
The discussion of Kant’s metaphysics and epistemology so far (including the Analytic of Principles) has been confined primarily to the section of the Critique of Pure Reason that Kant calls the Transcendental Analytic. The purpose of the Analytic, we are told, is “the rarely attempted dissection of the power of the understanding itself.” (A 65/B 90). Kant’s project has been to develop the full argument for his theory about the mind’s contribution to knowledge of the world. Once that theory is in place, we are in a position to see the errors that are caused by transgressions of the boundaries to knowledge established by Kant’s transcendental idealism and empirical realism. Kant calls judgments that pretend to have knowledge beyond these boundaries and that even require us to tear down the limits that he has placed on knowledge, transcendent judgments. The Transcendental Dialectic section of the book is devoted to uncovering the illusion of knowledge created by transcendent judgments and explaining why the temptation to believe them persists. Kant argues that the proper functioning of the faculties of sensibility and the understanding combine to draw reason, or the cognitive power of inference, inexorably into mistakes. The faculty of reason naturally seeks the highest ground of unconditional unity. It seeks to unify and subsume all particular experiences under higher and higher principles of knowledge. But sensibility cannot by its nature provide the intuitions that would make knowledge of the highest principles and of things as they are in themselves possible. Nevertheless, reason, in its function as the faculty of inference, inevitably draws conclusions about what lies beyond the boundaries of sensibility. The unfolding of this conflict between the faculties reveals more about the mind’s relationship to the world it seeks to know and the possibility of a science of metaphysics.
Kant believes that Aristotle’s logic of the syllogism captures the logic employed by reason. The resulting mistakes from the inevitable conflict between sensibility and reason reflect the logic of Aristotle’s syllogism. Corresponding to the three basic kinds of syllogism are three dialectic mistakes or illusions of transcendent knowledge that cannot be real. Kant’s discussion of these three classes of mistakes are contained in the Paralogisms, the Antinomies, and the Ideals of Reason. The Dialectic explains the illusions of reason in these sections. But since the illusions arise from the structure of our faculties, they will not cease to have their influence on our minds any more than we can prevent the moon from seeming larger when it is on the horizon than when it is overhead. (A 297/B 354).
In the Paralogisms, Kant argues that a failure to recognize the difference between appearances and things in themselves, particularly in the case of the introspected self, leads us into transcendent error. Kant argues against several conclusions encouraged by Descartes and the rational psychologists, who believed they could build human knowledge from the “I think” of the cogito argument. From the “I think” of self-awareness we can infer, they maintain, that the self or soul is 1) simple, 2) immaterial, 3) an identical substance and 4) that we perceive it directly, in contrast to external objects whose existence is merely possible. That is, the rational psychologists claimed to have knowledge of the self as transcendentally real. Kant believes that it is impossible to demonstrate any of these four claims, and that the mistaken claims to knowledge stem from a failure to see the real nature of our apprehension of the “I.” Reason cannot fail to apply the categories to its judgments of the self, and that application gives rise to these four conclusions about the self that correspond roughly to the four headings in the table of categories. But to take the self as an object of knowledge here is to pretend to have knowledge of the self as it is in itself, not as it appears to us. Our representation of the “I” itself is empty. It is subject to the condition of inner sense, time, but not the condition of outer sense, space, so it cannot be a proper object of knowledge. It can be thought through concepts, but without the commensurate spatial and temporal intuitions, it cannot be known. Each of the four paralogisms explains the categorical structure of reason that led the rational psychologists to mistake the self as it appears to us for the self as it is in itself.
We have already mentioned the Antinomies, in which Kant analyzes the methodological problems of the Rationalist project. Kant sees the Antinomies as the unresolved dialogue between skepticism and dogmatism about knowledge of the world. There are four antinomies, again corresponding to the four headings of the table of categories, that are generated by reason’s attempts to achieve complete knowledge of the realm beyond the empirical. Each antinomy has a thesis and an antithesis, both of which can be validly proven, and since each makes a claim that is beyond the grasp of spatiotemporal sensation, neither can be confirmed or denied by experience. The First Antinomy argues both that the world has a beginning in time and space, and no beginning in time and space. The Second Antinomy’s arguments are that every composite substance is made of simple parts and that nothing is composed of simple parts. The Third Antinomy’s thesis is that agents like ourselves have freedom and its antithesis is that they do not. The Fourth Antinomy contains arguments both for and against the existence of a necessary being in the world. The seemingly irreconcilable claims of the Antinomies can only be resolved by seeing them as the product of the conflict of the faculties and by recognizing the proper sphere of our knowledge in each case. In each of them, the idea of “absolute totality, which holds only as a condition of things in themselves, has been applied to appearances” (A 506/B534).
The result of Kant’ analysis of the Antinomies is that we can reject both claims of the first two and accept both claims of the last two, if we understand their proper domains. In the first Antinomy, the world as it appears to us is neither finite since we can always inquire about its beginning or end, nor is it infinite because finite beings like ourselves cannot cognize an infinite whole. As an empirical object, Kant argues, it is indefinitely constructable for our minds. As it is in itself, independent of the conditions of our thought, it should not be identified as finite or infinite since both are categorical conditions of our thought. Kant’s resolution of the third Antinomy (A 445/B 473) clarifies his position on freedom. He considers the two competing hypotheses of speculative metaphysics that there are different types of causality in the world: 1) there are natural causes which are themselves governed by the laws of nature as well as uncaused causes like ourselves that can act freely, or 2) the causal laws of nature entirely govern the world including our actions. The conflict between these contrary claims can be resolved, Kant argues, by taking his critical turn and recognizing that it is impossible for any cause to be thought of as uncaused itself in the realm of space and time. But reason, in trying to understand the ground of all things, strives to unify its knowledge beyond the empirical realm. The empirical world, considered by itself, cannot provide us with ultimate reasons. So if we do not assume a first or free cause we cannot completely explain causal series in the world. So for the Third Antinomy, as for all of the Antinomies, the domain of the Thesis is the intellectual, rational, noumenal world. The domain of the Antithesis is the spatiotemporal world.
The faculty of reason has two employments. For the most part, we have engaged in an analysis of theoretical reason which has determined the limits and requirements of the employment of the faculty of reason to obtain knowledge. Theoretical reason, Kant says, makes it possible to cognize what is. But reason has its practical employment in determining what ought to be as well. (A 633/B 661) This distinction roughly corresponds to the two philosophical enterprises of metaphysics and ethics. Reason’s practical use is manifest in the regulative function of certain concepts that we must think with regard to the world, even though we can have no knowledge of them.
Kant believes that, “Human reason is by its nature architectonic.” (A 474/B 502). That is, reason thinks of all cognitions as belonging to a unified and organized system. Reason is our faculty of making inferences and of identifying the grounds behind every truth. It allows us to move from the particular and contingent to the global and universal. I infer that “Caius is mortal” from the fact that “Caius is a man” and the universal claim, “All men are mortal.” In this fashion, reason seeks higher and higher levels of generality in order to explain the way things are. In a different kind of example, the biologist’s classification of every living thing into a kingdom, phylum, class, order, family, genus, and species, illustrates reason’s ambition to subsume the world into an ordered, unified system. The entire empirical world, Kant argues, must be conceived of by reason as causally necessitated (as we saw in the Analogies). We must connect, “one state with a previous state upon which the state follows according to a rule.” Each cause, and each cause’s cause, and each additional ascending cause must itself have a cause. Reason generates this hierarchy that combines to provide the mind with a conception of a whole system of nature. Kant believes that it is part of the function of reason to strive for a complete, determinate understanding of the natural world. But our analysis of theoretical reason has made it clear that we can never have knowledge of the totality of things because we cannot have the requisite sensations of the totality, hence one of the necessary conditions of knowledge is not met. Nevertheless, reason seeks a state of rest from the regression of conditioned, empirical judgments in some unconditioned ground that can complete the series (A 584/B 612). Reason’s structure pushes us to accept certain ideas of reason that allow completion of its striving for unity. We must assume the ideas of God, freedom, and immortality, Kant says, not as objects of knowledge, but as practical necessities for the employment of reason in the realm where we can have knowledge. By denying the possibility of knowledge of these ideas, yet arguing for their role in the system of reason, Kant had to, “annul knowledge in order to make room for faith.” (B xxx).
It is rare for a philosopher in any era to make a significant impact on any single topic in philosophy. For a philosopher to impact as many different areas as Kant did is extraordinary. His ethical theory has been as influential as, if not more influential than, his work in epistemology and metaphysics. Most of Kant’s work on ethics is presented in two works. The Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) is Kant’s “search for and establishment of the supreme principle of morality.” In The Critique of Practical Reason (1787) Kant attempts to unify his account of practical reason with his work in the Critique of Pure Reason. Kant is the primary proponent in history of what is called deontological ethics. Deontology is the study of duty. On Kant’s view, the sole feature that gives an action moral worth is not the outcome that is achieved by the action, but the motive that is behind the action. The categorical imperative is Kant’s famous statement of this duty: “Act only according to that maxim by which you can at the same time will that it should become a universal law.”
For Kant, as we have seen, the drive for total, systematic knowledge in reason can only be fulfilled with assumptions that empirical observation cannot support. The metaphysical facts about the ultimate nature of things in themselves must remain a mystery to us because of the spatiotemporal constraints on sensibility. When we think about the nature of things in themselves or the ultimate ground of the empirical world, Kant has argued that we are still constrained to think through the categories, we cannot think otherwise, but we can have no knowledge because sensation provides our concepts with no content. So, reason is put at odds with itself because it is constrained by the limits of its transcendental structure, but it seeks to have complete knowledge that would take it beyond those limits.
Freedom plays a central role in Kant’s ethics because the possibility of moral judgments presupposes it. Freedom is an idea of reason that serves an indispensable practical function. Without the assumption of freedom, reason cannot act. If we think of ourselves as completely causally determined, and not as uncaused causes ourselves, then any attempt to conceive of a rule that prescribes the means by which some end can be achieved is pointless. I cannot both think of myself as entirely subject to causal law and as being able to act according to the conception of a principle that gives guidance to my will. We cannot help but think of our actions as the result of an uncaused cause if we are to act at all and employ reason to accomplish ends and understand the world.
So reason has an unavoidable interest in thinking of itself as free. That is, theoretical reason cannot demonstrate freedom, but practical reason must assume for the purpose of action. Having the ability to make judgments and apply reason puts us outside that system of causally necessitated events. “Reason creates for itself the idea of a spontaneity that can, on its own, start to act–without, i.e., needing to be preceded by another cause by means of which it is determined to action in turn, according to the law of causal connection,” Kant says. (A 533/B 561) In its intellectual domain, reason must think of itself as free.
It is dissatisfying that he cannot demonstrate freedom; nevertheless, it comes as no surprise that we must think of ourselves as free. In a sense, Kant is agreeing with the common sense view that how I choose to act makes a difference in how I actually act. Even if it were possible to give a predictive empirical account of why I act as I do, say on the grounds of a functionalist psychological theory, those considerations would mean nothing to me in my deliberations. When I make a decision about what to do, about which car to buy, for instance, the mechanism at work in my nervous system makes no difference to me. I still have to peruse Consumer Reports, consider my options, reflect on my needs, and decide on the basis of the application of general principles. My first person perspective is unavoidable, hence the deliberative, intellectual process of choice is unavoidable.
The question of moral action is not an issue for two classes of beings, according to Kant. The animal consciousness, the purely sensuous being, is entirely subject to causal determination. It is part of the causal chains of the empirical world, but not an originator of causes the way humans are. Hence, rightness or wrongness, as concepts that apply to situations one has control over, do not apply. We do not morally fault the lion for killing the gazelle, or even for killing its own young. The actions of a purely rational being, by contrast, are in perfect accord with moral principles, Kant says. There is nothing in such a being’s nature to make it falter. Its will always conforms with the dictates of reason. Humans are between the two worlds. We are both sensible and intellectual, as was pointed out in the discussion of the first Critique. We are neither wholly determined to act by natural impulse, nor are we free of non-rational impulse. Hence we need rules of conduct. We need, and reason is compelled to provide, a principle that declares how we ought to act when it is in our power to choose
Since we find ourselves in the situation of possessing reason, being able to act according to our own conception of rules, there is a special burden on us. Other creatures are acted upon by the world. But having the ability to choose the principle to guide our actions makes us actors. We must exercise our will and our reason to act. Will is the capacity to act according to the principles provided by reason. Reason assumes freedom and conceives of principles of action in order to function.
Two problems face us however. First, we are not wholly rational beings, so we are liable to succumb to our non-rational impulses. Second, even when we exercise our reason fully, we often cannot know which action is the best. The fact that we can choose between alternate courses of actions (we are not determined to act by instinct or reason) introduces the possibility that there can be better or worse ways of achieving our ends and better or worse ends, depending upon the criteria we adopt. The presence of two different kinds of object in the world adds another dimension, a moral dimension, to our deliberations. Roughly speaking, we can divide the world into beings with reason and will like ourselves and things that lack those faculties. We can think of these classes of things as ends-in-themselves and mere means-to-ends, respectively. Ends-in-themselves are autonomous beings with their own agendas; failing to recognize their capacity to determine their own actions would be to thwart their freedom and undermine reason itself. When we reflect on alternative courses of action, means-to-ends, things like buildings, rocks, and trees, deserve no special status in our deliberations about what goals we should have and what means we use to achieve them. The class of ends-in-themselves, reasoning agents like ourselves, however, do have a special status in our considerations about what goals we should have and the means we employ to accomplish them. Moral actions, for Kant, are actions where reason leads, rather than follows, and actions where we must take other beings that act according to their own conception of the law into account.
The will, Kant says, is the faculty of acting according to a conception of law. When we act, whether or not we achieve what we intend with our actions is often beyond our control, so the morality of our actions does not depend upon their outcome. What we can control, however, is the will behind the action. That is, we can will to act according to one law rather than another. The morality of an action, therefore, must be assessed in terms of the motivation behind it. If two people, Smith and Jones, perform the same act, from the same conception of the law, but events beyond Smith’s control prevent her from achieving her goal, Smith is not less praiseworthy for not succeeding. We must consider them on equal moral ground in terms of the will behind their actions.
The only thing that is good without qualification is the good will, Kant says. All other candidates for an intrinsic good have problems, Kant argues. Courage, health, and wealth can all be used for ill purposes, Kant argues, and therefore cannot be intrinsically good. Happiness is not intrinsically good because even being worthy of happiness, Kant says, requires that one possess a good will. The good will is the only unconditional good despite all encroachments. Misfortune may render someone incapable of achieving her goals, for instance, but the goodness of her will remains.
Goodness cannot arise from acting on impulse or natural inclination, even if impulse coincides with duty. It can only arise from conceiving of one’s actions in a certain way. A shopkeeper, Kant says, might do what is in accord with duty and not overcharge a child. Kant argues, “it is not sufficient to do that which should be morally good that it conform to the law; it must be done for the sake of the law.” (Foundations of the Metaphysics of Morals, Akademie pagination 390) There is a clear moral difference between the shopkeeper that does it for his own advantage to keep from offending other customers and the shopkeeper who does it from duty and the principle of honesty.(Ibid., 398) Likewise, in another of Kant’s carefully studied examples, the kind act of the person who overcomes a natural lack of sympathy for other people out of respect for duty has moral worth, whereas the same kind act of the person who naturally takes pleasure in spreading joy does not. A person’s moral worth cannot be dependent upon what nature endowed them with accidentally. The selfishly motivated shopkeeper and the naturally kind person both act on equally subjective and accidental grounds. What matters to morality is that the actor think about their actions in the right manner.
We might be tempted to think that the motivation that makes an action good is having a positive goal–to make people happy, or to provide some benefit. But that is not the right sort of motive, Kant says. No outcome, should we achieve it, can be unconditionally good. Fortune can be misused, what we thought would induce benefit might actually bring harm, and happiness might be undeserved. Hoping to achieve some particular end, no matter how beneficial it may seem, is not purely and unconditionally good. It is not the effect or even the intended effect that bestows moral character on an action. All intended effects “could be brought about through other causes and would not require the will of a rational being, while the highest and unconditional good can be found only in such a will.” (Ibid., 401) It is the possession of a rationally guided will that adds a moral dimension to one’s acts. So it is the recognition and appreciation of duty itself that must drive our actions.
What is the duty that is to motivate our actions and to give them moral value? Kant distinguishes two kinds of law produced by reason. Given some end we wish to achieve, reason can provide a hypothetical imperative, or rule of action for achieving that end. A hypothetical imperative says that if you wish to buy a new car, then you must determine what sort of cars are available for purchase. Conceiving of a means to achieve some desired end is by far the most common employment of reason. But Kant has shown that the acceptable conception of the moral law cannot be merely hypothetical. Our actions cannot be moral on the ground of some conditional purpose or goal. Morality requires an unconditional statement of one’s duty.
And in fact, reason produces an absolute statement of moral action. The moral imperative is unconditional; that is, its imperative force is not tempered by the conditional “if I want to achieve some end, then do X.” It simply states, do X. Kant believes that reason dictates a categorical imperative for moral action. He gives at least three formulations of the Categorical Imperative.
What are Kant’s arguments for the Categorical Imperative? First, consider an example. Consider the person who needs to borrow money and is considering making a false promise to pay it back. The maxim that could be invoked is, “when I need of money, borrow it, promising to repay it, even though I do not intend to.” But when we apply the universality test to this maxim it becomes clear that if everyone were to act in this fashion, the institution of promising itself would be undermined. The borrower makes a promise, willing that there be no such thing as promises. Thus such an action fails the universality test.
The argument for the first formulation of the categorical imperative can be thought of this way. We have seen that in order to be good, we must remove inclination and the consideration of any particular goal from our motivation to act. The act cannot be good if it arises from subjective impulse. Nor can it be good because it seeks after some particular goal which might not attain the good we seek or could come about through happenstance. We must abstract away from all hoped for effects. If we remove all subjectivity and particularity from motivation we are only left with will to universality. The question “what rule determines what I ought to do in this situation?” becomes “what rule ought to universally guide action?” What we must do in any situation of moral choice is act according to a maxim that we would will everyone to act according to.
The second version of the Categorical Imperative invokes Kant’s conception of nature and draws on the first Critique. In the earlier discussion of nature, we saw that the mind necessarily structures nature. And reason, in its seeking of ever higher grounds of explanation, strives to achieve unified knowledge of nature. A guide for us in moral matters is to think of what would not be possible to will universally. Maxims that fail the test of the categorical imperative generate a contradiction. Laws of nature cannot be contradictory. So if a maxim cannot be willed to be a law of nature, it is not moral.
The third version of the categorical imperative ties Kant’s whole moral theory together. Insofar as they possess a rational will, people are set off in the natural order of things. They are not merely subject to the forces that act upon them; they are not merely means to ends. They are ends in themselves. All means to an end have a merely conditional worth because they are valuable only for achieving something else. The possessor of a rational will, however, is the only thing with unconditional worth. The possession of rationality puts all beings on the same footing, “every other rational being thinks of his existence by means of the same rational ground which holds also for myself; thus it is at the same time an objective principle from which, as a supreme practical ground, it must be possible to derive all laws of the will.” (Ibid., 429)
Kant’s criticisms of utilitarianism have become famous enough to warrant some separate discussion. Utilitarian moral theories evaluate the moral worth of action on the basis of happiness that is produced by an action. Whatever produces the most happiness in the most people is the moral course of action. Kant has an insightful objection to moral evaluations of this sort. The essence of the objection is that utilitarian theories actually devalue the individuals it is supposed to benefit. If we allow utilitarian calculations to motivate our actions, we are allowing the valuation of one person’s welfare and interests in terms of what good they can be used for. It would be possible, for instance, to justify sacrificing one individual for the benefits of others if the utilitarian calculations promise more benefit. Doing so would be the worst example of treating someone utterly as a means and not as an end in themselves.
Another way to consider his objection is to note that utilitarian theories are driven by the merely contingent inclination in humans for pleasure and happiness, not by the universal moral law dictated by reason. To act in pursuit of happiness is arbitrary and subjective, and is no more moral than acting on the basis of greed, or selfishness. All three emanate from subjective, non-rational grounds. The danger of utilitarianism lies in its embracing of baser instincts, while rejecting the indispensable role of reason and freedom in our actions.
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.
Last updated: June 30, 2005 | Originally published: