What is commonly called “Kashmiri Shaivism” is actually a group of several monistic and tantric religious traditions that flourished in Kashmir from the latter centuries of the first millennium C.E. through the early centuries of the second. These traditions have survived only in an attenuated form among the Brahmans of Kashmir, but there have recently been efforts to revive them in India and globally. These traditions must be distinguished from a dualistic Shaiva Siddhānta tradition that also flourished in medieval Kashmir. The most salient philosophy of monistic Kashmiri Shaivism is the Pratyabhijnā, or “Recognition,” system propounded in the writings of Utpaladeva (c. 925-975 C.E.) and Abhinavagupta (c. 975-1025 C.E.). Abhinavagupta’s disciple Kshemarāja (c. 1000-1050) and other successors interpreted that philosophy as defining retrospectively the significance of earlier monistic Shaiva theology and philosophy. This article will focus on the historical development and basic teachings of the Pratyabhijnā philosophy.
The great cultural dynamism of medieval Kashmir included a number of cults that scholars now classify as “tantric,” including the interweaving Shaiva (Siva worshiping) and Shākta (Goddess worshiping) lineages the Vaishnava Pancarātra (an esoteric tradition centered around the worship of Visnu) and the Buddhist Vajrāyana tradition.
While tantrism is a complex and controversial subject, one of its most definitive characteristics for contemporary classifications—if not its most definitive one—is the pursuit of power. Tantric traditions are thus those that aim at increasing the power of the practitioner. The theological designation for the essence of such power is Shakti (the female counterpart to the male divine principle, whose essence is power). The manifestations of Shakti that the practitioner of tantra aspire after vary greatly, from relatively limited magical proficiencies (siddhis or vibhūtis), through royal power, to the deindividualized and liberated saint’s omnipotence to the performance of God’s cosmic acts.
In his seminal essay, “Purity and Power among the Brahmans of Kashmir,” the Oxford historian Alexis Sanderson elucidates that the tantric pursuit of such power transgresses orthodox, mainstream Hindu norms that delimit human agency for the sake of symbolic and ritual purity (shuddhi) (Sanderson 1985). Violating prescriptions regarding caste, sexuality, diet and death, many of the tantric rites were originally performed in cremation grounds.
Whereas in Shākta tantrism, Shakti as a Goddess is herself the ultimate deity, in monistic Kashmiri Shaivism she is incorporated into the metaphysical essence of the God Shiva. Shiva is the Shaktiman (the “possessor of Shakti”) encompassing her within his androgynous nature as his integral power and consort. According to the predominant monistic Shaiva myth, Shiva out of a kind of play divides himself from Shakti and then in sexual union emanates and controls the universe through her.
The basic pattern of spiritual practice, which also reflects the appropriation of Goddess worship (Shaktism) by Shaivism is the approach to Shiva through Shakti. As the Shaiva scripture Vijnāna-Bhairava proclaims, Shakti is the door. The adept pursues the realization of identity with the omnipotent Shiva by assuming his mythic agency in emanating and controlling the universe through Shakti. Thus in the sexual ritual a man realizes himself as the possessor of Shakti within his partner. In more frequent internalized “theosophical” contemplations one realizes oneself as the possessor of Shakti in all her immanent modalities with the aid of circular diagrams of cosmogenesis (mandalas) and mantras.
Scholars identify some of the preconditions for the eventual development of monistic Shaiva philosophical discourse in the trend of medieval tantric movements to “domesticize” themselves by assimilating to upper-caste Hindu norms. Radical practices were toned down, concealed under the guise of propriety, or interpreted as metaphors of internal contemplations.
An expression of this same process was the production by monistic Shaiva Brahmans of increasingly systematic manuals of doctrines and practices on the model of Sanskrit scholastic texts (shāstras). This creation of what may be described as a religious mission to the educated elites also led to the increasing consolidation of the various streams of monistic Shaivism. This development began in the ninth century with Vasugupta’s transmission of the manual Shiva Sūtra, ostensibly revealed to him by Shiva himself; and the further systematization of its teachings by either Vasugupta or his disciple Kallata in the Spanda Kārikā. These two works and their commentaries form the core texts of the “Spanda system” of monistic Shaivism, known for its interpretation of Shakti as spanda, “cosmic pulsation.”
The tradition of monistic Shaivism called “Trika” (referring to its emphasis on various triads of modalities of Shakti and cosmic levels) produced the first work of full-fledged scholastic philosophy. This was the Shivadrishti, “Cognition of Shiva,” by Somānanda (c. 900-950 C.E.). (See the summary of themes of the Shivadrishti below.)
Utpaladeva, a student of Somānanda, wrote a commentary on the Shivadrishti, the Shivadrishtivritti. He also wrote several other works interpreting and furthering the work of Somānanda with much greater sophistication. Those texts are the foundational works of the Pratyabhijnā philosophy of focus in this article. The most comprehensive of these texts are the Īshvarapratyabhijnākārikā, “Verses on the Recognition of the Lord,” and two commentaries on the Verses, the short Īshvarapratyabhijnākārikāvritti, and the more detailed Īshvarapratyabhijnāvivriti. (The latter text has been accessible to contemporary scholars only in fragments.) Utpaladeva also wrote a trilogy of more specialized philosophical studies, the Siddhitrayī, “Three Proofs”—Īshvarasiddhi, “Proof of the Lord;” Ajadapramātrisiddhi, “Proof of a Subject who is not Insentient;” and Sambandhasiddhi, “Proof of Relation.”
Abhinavagupta, widely recognized as one of the greatest philosophers of South Asia, was a disciple of a disciple of Utpaladeva. Abhinava profoundly elaborated and augmented Utpaladeva’s arguments in long commentaries, one directly on the Verses, the Īshvarapratyabhijnāvimarshinī; and the other on Utpaladeva’s longer autocommentary, the Īshvarapratyabhijnāvivritivimarshinī.
While Abhinavagupta’s Pratyabhijnā commentaries are of paramount philosophical importance, this thinker’s greatest significance in the history of tantrism is probably his effort, in his monumental Tantrāloka and numerous other works, to systematize and provide a critical philosophical structure to non-philosophical tantric theology. Abhinava utilized categories from the Pratyabhijnā philosophy to interpret and organize the diverse aspects of doctrine and practice and Shaiva symbolism from the “Trika” sub-tradition; and he synthesized under the rubric of this philosophically rationalized Trika Shaivism an enormous range of symbolism and practice from other Shaiva and Shākta traditions as well. Abhinavagupta is also renowned for his works on Sanskrit poetics—in which he interpreted aesthetic experience as homologous to, and practically approaching the monistic Shaiva soteriological realization.
Abhinava’s own disciple, Kshemarāja, further pursued his teacher’s agendas with a simplified manual of monistic Shaiva doctrine and practice, the Pratyabhijnāhridaya, “Heart of Recognition,” and several lengthy commentaries on tantric scriptures. As further diffused through these and subsequent works, Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s philosophical thought came to have a large influence on tantric and devotional (bhakti) traditions throughout South Asia.
While the focus of this article is on Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s Pratyabhijnā philosophy, mention should be made of some of the basic themes of Somānanda’s precursory Shivadrishti.
Somānanda’s broadest concern is to explain how Shiva through the various modalities of his Shakti emanates a real universe that remains identical with himself. In establishing the Shaiva doctrine he refutes a number of alternative views on ultimate reality, the self, God and the metaphysical status of the world. He devotes the greatest polemical efforts against the theories of the 4th-6th century Vaiyākarana (or “Grammarian”) philosopher Bhartrihari.
According to Bhartrihari, the ultimate reality is the Word Absolute (shabdabrahman)—a super-linguistic plenum, which fragments and emanates into the multiplicity of forms of expressive speech and referents of that speech. Somānanda repudiates the view that a linguistic entity could be the ultimate reality, while at the same time identifying the true source of language as the Sound (nāda) integral to Shiva’s creative power.
Somānanda takes a less polemical approach towards Shāktism. He argues that there is ultimately no difference between Shakti and Shiva, who is the possessor of Shakti. He supports this contention with the analogy of the inseparability of heat from fire, which is the possessor of heat. Nevertheless, he asserts that it is more proper to refer to the ultimate reality as Shiva rather than Shakti. Other Hindu schools criticized by Somānanda include the Pancarātra as well as the Vedānta, Sāmkhya and Nyāya-Vaisheshika systems.
Somānanda briefly adduces some considerations against the Buddhist theory of momentariness, which were directly picked up and elaborated by Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta. The most important of these was his advertence to the experience of recognition (pratyabhijnā) as evidence both for the continuity of entities from the past through the present, and for the self that connects the past and present experiences of those entities. It was originally the Nyāya-Vaisheshika school that adduced such considerations against the Buddhists, and the ninth-century Shaiva Siddhānta thinker Sadyojyoti in his Nareshvaraparīkshā had also recently employed these arguments. Somānanda introduced them to monistic Shaiva philosophical reflection with great future consequences.
Somānanda’s claims that synthetic categories or universals are more primitive than particulars, and his invocation of Sanskrit syntax to explain Shiva’s agency likewise had an important impact on Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta. (See below.) Also noteworthy is Somānanda’s advocacy of a “panpsychist” theory that all things, which emanate from the consciousness of Shiva, have their own consciousness and agency. Somānanda additionally engages in reflecting on the contemplations that lead to the realization of identity with Shiva.
Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta ambitiously conceive the Pratyabhijnā system as both a philosophical apologetics (which follows Sanskritic standards of scholastic argument) and an internalized form of tantric ritual that leads students directly to identification with Shiva. They explain the basic means by which the system conveys Shiva-identity according to the same basic ritual pattern described above, as shaktyāvishkarana, “the revealing of Shakti.”
The Pratyabhijnā philosophers, however, also frame Shakti as the reason of a publicly assessable inference, or “inference for the sake of others” (parārthānumāna). According to the scholastic logic, the reason identifies a quality in the inferential subject “I” known to be invariably concomitant with the predicate, “Shiva.” Thus I am Shiva because I have his quality, that is, Shakti, the capacity of emanating and controlling the universe.
In order to address debates on epistemology that were then current, Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta further explain the mythic and ritual pattern of Shiva and Shakti in terms of recognition. The specific problem the writers address had been formulated by the Buddhist logic school of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti, which flourished in medieval Kashmir. Contemporary interpreters have characterized the philosophy of Buddhist logic as a species of phenomenalism akin to that of David Hume. According to this school, the foundation of knowledge is a series of momentary and discrete perceptual data (svalakshana). There are no grounds in those data for the recognitions of any enduring entities through ostensible cognitions utilizing linguistic or conceptual interpretation (savikalpaka jnāna). In debates over several centuries, the Buddhist logicians had propounded arguments attacking many concepts that seemed commonsensical and were religiously significant to the various orthodox Hindu philosophical schools—such as ideas of external objects, ordinary and ritual action, an enduring Self, God, and revelation.
The Pratyabhijnā philosophers’ response to the problematic posed by Buddhist logic revolutionized earlier approaches of the Nyaya philosophers, the Shaiva Siddhāntin Sadyojyoti and even Utpaladeva’s teacher Somānanda, and may be characterized as a form of transcendental argumentation. Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta interpret their central myth of Shiva’s emanation and control of the universe through Shakti as itself an act of self-recognition (ahampratyavamarsha, pratyabhijnā). Furthermore, abjuring Somānanda’s agonistic stance towards Bhartrihari, they also equate Shiva’s self-recognition (Shakti) with the principle of Supreme Speech (parāvāk), which they derive from the Grammarian. They thereby appropriate the Grammarian’s explanation of creation as linguistic in nature. Thus the Kashmiri Shaiva philosophers ascribe to Speech a primordial status, denied by the Buddhist logicians.
As ritual recapitulates myth, the Pratyabhijnā system endeavors to lead the student to participate in the recognition “I am Shiva,” by demonstrating that all experiences and contents of experience are expressions of the recognition that “I am Shiva.” The paradox of the Pratyabhijnā formulation of the inference for the sake of others is that the self-recognition “I am Shiva,” as an interpretation of Shakti, becomes in effect both the conclusion and the reason. This circularity of conclusion and reason is a consequence of the Kashmiri Shaiva monism. From the intratraditional perspective, there is no fact that can be adduced in support of another separate fact, as everything is always the same in essential nature. From the intertraditional perspective of philosophical debate, however, the circularity is not necessarily destructive. The Shaiva technical studies of various topics of epistemology and ontology in effect provide further ostensible justification for this apparent circularity.
Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s epistemology may best be illustrated by its approach to perceptual cognition. The Pratyabhijnā arguments on this subject may be divided into those centered around two sets of terms: prakāsha; and vimarsha and cognates such as pratyavamarsha and parāmarsha.
Prakāsha is the “bare subjective awareness” that validates each cognition, so that one knows that one knows. The thrust of the arguments about prakāsha is analogous to George Berkeley’s thesis of idealism that esse est percipi. The Shaivas contend that, as no object is known without validating awareness, this awareness actually constitutes all objects. There is no ground even for a “representationalist” inference of objects external to awareness that cause its diverse contents, because causality can be posited only between phenomena of which one has been aware. Furthermore, the Kashmiri Shaivas argue that there cannot be another subject outside of one’s own awareness. They conclude, however, not with solipsism as usually understood in the West, but a conception of a universal awareness. All sentient and insentient beings are essentially one awareness.
Vimarsha and its cognates have the significance of apprehension or judgment with a recognitive structure, and may be glossed as “recognitive apprehension.” (The recognitive is the act of recognizing or an awareness that something perceived has been perceived before.) Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s arguments centering on these terms develop earlier considerations of Bhartrihari on the linguistic nature of experience. Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta refute the Buddhist contention that recognition is a contingent reaction to direct experience by claiming that it is integral or transcendental to all experience. Some of the considerations they adduce to support this claim are the following: that children must build upon a subtle, innate form of linguistic apprehension in their learning of conventional language; that there must be a recognitive ordering of our most basic experiences of situations and movements in order to account for our ability to perform rapid behaviors; and that some form of subtle application of language in all experiences is necessary in order to account for our ability to remember them.
The two phases of argument operate together. The idealistic prakāsha arguments make the recognition shown by the vimarsha arguments to be integral to all epistemic processes, constitutive of them and their objects. Moreover, on the radical logic of the Kashmiri Shaiva idealism, the recognition generating all things belongs to one subject. It must therefore be his self-recognition. As it is through the monistic subject’s self-recognition that all phenomena are created, the Pratyabhijnā thinkers have ostensibly demonstrated their cosmogonic myth of Shiva’s emanation through Shakti in terms of self-recognition. The student, by coming to see this self-recognition as the inner reality of all that is experienced, is led to full participation in it.
Also noteworthy is the Kashmiri Shaiva theory of what may be called “semantic exclusion” (apoha). This concept had originally been formulated by the Buddhist logicians to explain a nonepistemic “coordination” (sārūpya) between language and momentary perceptual data as the basis for successful reference in communication and behaviors. According to the Buddhists, words have no isomorphism with the sense data, but only exclude other words that would not lead to successful behavior. The only reference of the word “cow” to a perceived particular is that it excludes non-cows, for example, a horse, a car, and so on. The Buddhist theory has an interesting point of agreement with contemporary structuralist and poststructuralist conceptions of the determination of linguistic value by difference, although it is not formulated like the latter (that is, on the basis of considerations about the systematicity of entire languages).
Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta argue that exclusion itself depends upon a comparative synthesis, or recognition, of what does and does not fit within particular categories. We recognize that the cow is not a non-cow such as a horse. The Pratyabhijnā theorists thus in effect explain difference itself as a kind of similarity. Difference is identified in various circumstances like other forms of similarity. According to the Shaivas such difference-identification is one of the principal expressions of Shiva’s emanating self-recognition.
Just as Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta appropriate Bhartrihari in equating self-recognition with Supreme Speech and thereby interpreting recognitive apprehension as linguistic in nature, they also follow the Grammarian school in interpreting being or existence (sattā) (the generic referent of language) as action (kriyā). The Grammarian view itself originated in Brahmanic interpretations of the Veda as expressing injunctions for sacrifice. The Kashmiri Shaivas further agree with much of Vedic exegetics in conceiving being as both narrative and recapitulatory ritual action. Following the account above, it is Shiva’s mythic action through Shakti as self-recognition that constitutes all experience and objects of experience, and that is reenacted by philosophical discourse.
The Pratyabhijnā thinkers propound their philosophy of Shiva’s action to explain a wide range of topics of ontology. One of their concerns is to describe how Shiva’s action generates a multiplicity of relationships (sambandha) or universals (sāmānya) as the referents of discrete instances of recognitive apprehension. With this theory they attempt to subvert the Buddhist logicians’ contention that evanescent particulars are ontologically fundamental. For the Shaivas, categories are primitive, and particulars are formed out of syntheses of those categories.
Most illustrative of the Pratyabhijnā thinkers’ “mythico-ritual approach” to ontology is their use of theories of Sanskrit syntax to explain Shiva’s action. Again reflecting the Vedic roots of South Asian philosophies, many schools of Hinduism and Buddhism—even those which do not view all existence as action—frequently advert to considerations of action syntax in treating ontological or metaphysical topics. The relevant considerations pertain to how verbs articulating action relate to declined nouns indicating the concomitants of action (kārakas)—in English, roughly, the agent, object, instrument, purpose, source and location. Now, most Sanskritic philosophies, Hindu as well as Buddhist, have tended to delimit the syntactic role of the agent (kartri kāraka)—to different degrees, but sometimes quite strongly. The explicit and implicit reasons for this tendency are complex. At one level it evidently reflects the orthodox Brahmanic norms that subordinate the individual’s agency to the order of objective ritual behavior—pertaining to sacrifice, caste, life cycle, and so on. It also seems more broadly to reflect both Hindu and Buddhist concepts of the agent’s bondage to the process of action and result (karma) extending across rebirths (see Gerow 1982). The mainstream Buddhist philosophies completely deny the existence of a self in the dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda) of karma.
Developing suggestions of Somānanda, the Pratyabhijnā philosophers expound a distinctive theory of agency to rationalize their tantric mythic and ritual drama of omnipotence. In their theory they take up several earlier understandings of the positive albeit delimited role of the agent and radicalize them. According to the Kashmiri Shaivas, all causal processes and other relationships constituting the universe are synthesized and impelled by the mythic agency of Shiva in his act of self-recognition. Shiva’s agency encompasses the actions of sentient beings as well as the motions and transformations of insentient beings. The Kashmiri Shaivas ultimately reduce the entire action of existence to agency. As Abhinavagupta explains, “Being is the agency of the act of becoming, that is, the freedom characteristic of an agent regarding all actions (Īshvarapratyabhijnāvimarshinī, 1.5.14, 1:258-59).”
Again, this theory of omnificent syntactic agency is ritually axiomatic as well as mythical. Utpaladeva describes the method of the Pratyabhijnā philosophy, in a manner homologous to the epistemology of recognition, as leading to salvation through the contemplation of one’s status as the agent of the universe. Abhinavagupta likewise, in his explanation of the preliminary ceremonies of the tantric ritual, identifies various components of the ritual—such as the location, ritual implements and object of sacrifice, flowers, and oblations—with the Sanskrit grammatical cases. He explains that the aspirant’s goal in the ritual action is identification with Shiva as agent of all the cases.
(References are given only to works available in English.)
David Peter Lawrence
University of Manitoba
Last updated: December 13, 2005 | Originally published: