Nasir Khusraw (1004-1060)
Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw is an important figure in the development of Ismaili philosophy. Much of his biography and philosophical ideology has been obtained through fragmented texts, both in poetry and prose. Born into a politically connected family, Khusraw was well-educated and in the sciences and humanities. Having spent most of his life occupying prestigious positions within the Sajuq court, Khusraw converted to the Ismaili faith at the age of forty after careful study. He spent the rest of his life writing and advocating for the Ismaili faith, and eventually was forced into exile by Sunni authorities.
Consistent with other Ismaili philosopher, Khusraw’s cosmology is heavily inspired by Neoplatonism. His metaphysics describes a God from which everything emanates and consistently strives back towards. Through God, existence is cast into being through Universal Soul and Universal Intellect. Each of these concepts provides the foundation for material objects, ascending from minerals to human beings. Within each human being exists a soul and intellect, imperfect in form but existing within the Universals. Khusraw interweaves his metaphysics within the Shi’i doctrine, requiring a divinely inspired guide to assist us in our journey to reconnect with Universal Intellect and Soul. In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw distinguishes his philosophy from previous Ismaili thought introduced by al-Farabi and picked up by Ibn Sina and al-Kirmani.
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In striking contrast to other Ismaili writers of the time (s.v., Hamid ai-din al Kirmani; Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani), many sources of information exist pertaining to Khusraw’s life. Documentation was recorded, with vary degrees of accuracy, by Khusraw himself, a (hostile) contemporary, and by later historians. Since his death, Khusraw has been included in every major literary or historical survey of Ismailism. Khusraw’s life can be divided into four periods: his early years up to the age of forty (discernible from fragments of various texts); his conversion to Ismailism (of which he has left two different versions in the form of prose and poetry); his seven-year journey (documented in Safarnama); and his years of preaching followed by persecution and exile (drawn primarily from his poetry, but also a few statements in his philosophical works).
In 1004, Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw was born in Qobadiyan, the district of Marv, in the eastern Iranian province of Khurasan. Along with two of his brothers, Khusraw occupied a high position in the administrative ranks of the Saljuq court – reportedly in the revenue department. Evidence also suggests that he was familiar with the court of previous dynasty, the Ghaznavids. Based on the quality of his writings, he received an excellent education in the sciences, literatures and philosophies of his time, including the study of Greek and Neoplatonic philosophy. In his writing, Khusraw reportes examining the doctrines of the different Islamic schools and not being satisfied until he found and understood the Ismaili faith. As a result of his conversion to Ismailism he embarked on a seven-year journey, during which time he spent three years in the Ismaili court in Cairo under the Fatimid caliph, al-Mustansir (1029-1094). The Fatimid dynasty (909-1171) aimed at creating an Islamic state based on Ismaili tenets, and thus presented a direct theological and military challenge to the Sunni ‘Abbasid caliphate based in Baghdad. Khusraw left Cairo as the head (hujjat) of Ismaili missionary activities in his home province of Khurasan. After leaving Cairo, Khusraw was forced into exile by the Sunni authorities. He spent the rest of his life exiled in the Pamir Mountains in Badakhshan, located in modern-day Tajikistan and Afghanistan.
Khusraw’s philosophical works reveal a strong Neoplatonic structure and vocabulary. For example, his cosmogony closely follows Plotinus, moving from God and God’s word (logos) to Intellect, Soul, and the world of Nature. Underlying each of the Ismaili cosmogonic systems is a fundamental division of the world into two realms, the esoteric (batin) and the exoteric (zahir). From this division, everything in the physical world points to its counterpart in the spiritual, which is seen as its source, or true form. The cosmogonic structure itself reveals a purposeful, providential unfolding from the spiritual realm into the physical world. Conversely, as a reflection, the physical world seeks to grasp the spiritual realm and comprehend it. In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw follows his fellow Ismailis (Nasafi and al-Sijistani) while differentiating his theory from the structure introduced by al-Farabi and later adopted by Ibn Sina and the Ismaili philosopher al-Kirmani.
Khusraw begins with a discussion of tawhid (oneness, God’s unity), the clear understanding of which is the only way to achieve spiritual perfection. For Nasir, God Himself is indescribable beyond all categories of being and non-being (nothing which has an opposite can be ascribed to Him, since that would be limiting Him to human concepts). However, from God emerges his Word (kalmia), ‘Be!’, which brings into existence Universal Intellect, perfect in potentiality and actuality. Universal Intellect transcends time and space, containing all being within itself. Universal Intellect enjoys a worshipful intimacy with God and derives perfection from this intimacy. From this worship emerges Universal Soul, perfect in potentiality but not in actuality because it is separated from God by Intellect. Universal Soul recognizes its separation from God, and moves closer to God in a desire for the perfection enjoyed by Intellect. Through its search for perfection, Universal Soul introduces the first movement into the entire structure, manifest in time and space.
The entire cosmos is set into motion through the movement of Universal Soul. As a corollary, being is differentiated into two sets of opposites: hot and cold, wet and dry. Derived from these sets of opposites are the four elements: earth, air, fire, and water. From these four elements arise the successive development of minerals, plants, and animals. Finally, as the summit of physical creation, human beings arise. Within each human being exists an individual intellect and individual soul manifesting the same characteristics (but on a smaller level) as the universals. In fact, the entire cosmos is formed on a matrix of Intellect and Soul; everything within the cosmos displays original intelligence and the search for perfection exhibited by the soul.
Khusraw’s ethics grow from and reflect this cosmogony. Each individual’s task is to recognize his or her own imperfections and then move to correct them, seeking the closest relationship possible with God. For Khusraw, this is achieved by stringent and repeated application of the intellect to both physical and spiritual matters. In order to correct these imperfections a believer must find a guide and study dilligently, perform all required religious acts with a full understanding, and supplement new understanding with higher levels of worldly activity. As an Ismaili, Khusraw held the Shi‘i doctrine that God would not send a revelation without a guide to interpret it. For the Ismailis, this guide must be a living person, the Imam of the Time. As a living bridge between the two realms, this person must be divinely inspired, infallible, and perfectly capable of providing guidance in spiritual and worldly affairs.
The following sources elucidate Khusraw’s philosophy:
- H. Corbin, “Nasir-i Khusrau and Iranian Ismailism,” in The Cambridge History of Iran: Volume 4, ed., R. N. Frye (Cambridge 1975), pp. 520-42 and 689-90;
- A. Hunsberger, “Nasir Khusraw: Fatimid Intellectual,” in F. Daftary, ed., Intellectual Traditions in Islam (London 2000), pp. 112-29;
- A. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw’s Doctrine of the Soul: From the Universal Intellect to the Physical World in Ismaili Philosophy, PhD thesis, Columbia University, New York, 1992;
- S. Meskoob, Shahrokh, “The Origin and Meaning of ‘Aql (Reason) in the View of Nasir Khusraw,” Iran Nameh, 6 (1989), pp. 239-57, and 7 (1989), pp. 405-29.
For a full bibliography of Nasir Khusraw’s works and ideas, see:
- A. C. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw, the Ruby of Badakhshan: A Portrait of the Persian Poet, Traveller and Philosopher (London 2000).
For works still in manuscript, see:
- I. K. Poonawala, Bibibliography of Ismaili Literature, Malibu, Calif., 1977, p. 123.
Alice C. Hunsberger
Institute of Ismaili Studies