Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
Our own experiences of pain are better known to us than the bio-chemical structure of our brains. Some philosophers hold that this difference is due to different kinds of knowledge: knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. I have first-hand or direct knowledge of my own experiences; whereas I have only second-hand or indirect knowledge of my brain’s being in a particular bio-chemical state. These two different kinds of knowledge indicate an essential difference in one’s awareness of certain kinds of truths. There is, however, considerable controversy among philosophers whether this distinction can consistently be applied and whether generally knowledge by acquaintance offers a stronger or better perspective on one’s knowledge than other kinds of knowledge.
Some philosophers distinguish knowledge by acquaintance from knowledge by description roughly along the following lines: knowledge by acquaintance is a unique form of knowledge where the subject has direct, unmediated, and non-inferential access to what is known whereas knowledge by description is a type of knowledge that is indirect, mediated, and inferential. There are some significant philosophical issues in spelling out how exactly to make this distinction and even whether it is possible to maintain that there is a privileged kind of knowledge by acquaintance. Nonetheless, many philosophers have put this distinction to work in issues related to epistemology and philosophy of mind.
Table of Contents
- The Distinction: Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
- The Epistemology of Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
- The Philosophy of Mind and Knowledge by Acquaintance
- References and Further Reading
The concept of acquaintance was introduced to contemporary philosophy by Bertrand Russell in his seminal article “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description” (1910) and in chapter five of The Problems of Philosophy (1912) (although see Russell 1905, pp. 479-480, 492-493 for an earlier passing discussion of it). Russell explains that a person is acquainted with an object when he stands in a “direct cognitive relation to the object, i.e. when [the subject is] directly aware of the object itself” (Russell 1910, p. 108). In another place, he writes “we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths” (Russell 1912, p. 46). To have knowledge by acquaintance, according to Russell, occurs when the subject has an immediate or unmediated awareness of some propositional truth. Knowledge by description, by contrast, is propositional knowledge that is inferential, mediated, or indirect.
The traditional account of knowledge by acquaintance is susceptible to being misunderstood or conflated with merely being directly acquainted with something (on this point see Russell 1914, p. 151). It is important to notice that there is a difference between being directly acquainted with something and having knowledge by acquaintance that something is the case. For a subject to be directly acquainted with something only requires for the subject to have unmediated access to the object of awareness. Knowledge by acquaintance that something is the case, however, is more than being directly acquainted with something’s being the case. Knowledge by acquaintance, after all, is a kind of knowledge, which requires the subject to hold a belief under the right conditions. For a subject to be directly acquainted with something does not necessarily require the subject to hold a belief about it. Notice the difference in the following claims:
(1) S is directly acquainted with p
(2) S knows by direct acquaintance that p.
Propositions (1) and (2) do not mean the same thing. The truth-conditions for (1) are different than the truth-conditions for (2). In order for (1) to be true, it needs to be the case that the subject is in fact acquainted with p. For example, when p is the fact that one is experiencing a mild pain, all it takes for (1) to be true is that the subject has some unmediated access or awareness of his pain experience. However, for (2) to be true, more is required. Some person may be directly acquainted with his mild pain experience but fail to have knowledge that he is having a pain experience, perhaps by failing to attend to this experience in such a way that he forms a propositional belief on the basis of his direct acquaintance with the pain experience. (Consider the possibility of an animal–perhaps a fish or a worm–that has the capacity to be acquainted with its pains, but lacks the capacity to form any propositional attitudes.) Thus, (1) may be a necessary condition for (2), but it would be hasty to conclude that (1) is sufficient for (2) or that (1) and (2) are equivalent. The subject needs to be aware of no propositional content about p to satisfy (1). But in order to satisfy (2), the subject needs to have a belief with propositional content about p, which is properly based on his direct acquaintance with p.
The epistemological issues involving the distinction, knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description, have focused primarily on whether there is privileged unmediated knowledge by acquaintance. I begin with Russell’s epistemic use of the distinction, and then I will survey some contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance. Finally, to round out this overview of the epistemic applications of this distinction I will highlight a couple of criticisms of classical accounts of knowledge by acquaintance and responses to them.
Russell used the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and description to articulate a foundationalist epistemology where knowledge by acquaintance is the most basic kind of knowledge and knowledge by description is inferential (Russell 1910 and 1912, ch. 5). “All our knowledge,” wrote Russell, “rests upon acquaintance for its foundation” (Russell 1912, p. 48). Knowledge by acquaintance, therefore, is a direct kind of knowledge; it is a kind of knowledge that does not depend on inference or mediation. The test Russell employs for determining what someone knows by acquaintance is based on dubitability. For this reason, Russell maintained a person cannot know by acquaintance that physical objects, like an iPod, exist; after all, even when someone is seeing an iPod, it is possible to doubt whether the iPod exists (due to the possibilities of dreaming, illusion, hallucination, and so forth). The sense data, or sensory experiences, of an iPod, however, cannot consistently be doubted by a person who is experiencing them. Thus, sense data can be known by acquaintance, whereas physical objects cannot. Russell also believed that one could be directly acquainted with memory experiences, introspective experiences (awareness of one’s own direct acquaintances and other internal sensations), universals, and (probably) even one’s own self (see Russell 1912, ch. 5; however, for one place where he is less confident of being directly acquainted with the self, see his 1914, p. 81).
On Russell’s view one cannot know by acquaintance that physical objects exist. Consequently, knowledge by description provides the only possibility of knowing physical objects. Knowledge by description, according to Russell, is dependent on direct acquaintance in at least two ways. First, knowledge by description depends on acquaintance for its propositional content. Russell unequivocally stated, “every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted” (Russell 1912, p. 58). Although one’s knowledge by description may concern objects that outstrip the range of one’s immediate acquaintance, the propositional content is composed of concepts with which the subject is directly acquainted.
There is a similarity between the way one can know something about particular things outside of one’s experience and the way Russell envisioned knowledge by description to allow a person to think about physical objects. Consider the belief that the tallest living man in the world exists. Someone can form this belief, even though he may have no clue who this individual is. Understanding the concepts of being the tallest, being alive, and being a man are sufficient for allowing a person to hold this belief, even though its referent may lie beyond the set of people that one has met first-hand. Likewise, Russell believed that one could form beliefs about physical objects, despite the fact that one cannot ever be directly acquainted with them. When a person holds the belief, for example, that there is a cup of coffee, he is not directly acquainted with the coffee as a physical object, but he is able to think about the physical object through descriptions with which he is directly acquainted. The descriptive content might consist of there being an object that is the cause of his experiences of blackness, bitterness, hotness, and liquidness. On Russell’s account, the subject’s acquaintance with the right concepts allows him to form beliefs about physical objects.
The second way in which knowledge by description depends on acquaintance is that knowledge by description is inferentially dependent on knowledge by acquaintance. In other words, the propositions one knows by description ultimately are inferred from one’s propositional knowledge by acquaintance. Consequently, this gives rise to a foundationalist epistemology in which all of one’s knowledge is either foundational or inferentially based on foundational knowledge. It is well-known that Russell believed one’s knowledge of the world beyond his or her own mind needed to be inferred from more basic knowledge of one’s own mental experiences (see Russell 1912, ch. 2 and Russell 1914). This raises the difficulty for Russell’s position of how to provide a plausible account of this inferential relationship between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description in a way that successfully accommodates the commonsense notion that most people know that physical objects exist.
Since Russell, much work has been advanced in his name promoting and applying the distinction of knowledge by acquaintance and description to use in epistemology. On the one hand, there have been traditional acquaintance theorists who have more-or-less kept the original Russellian conception of knowledge by acquaintance; namely the view that one is directly acquainted with one’s own states of mind and not the extra-mental world. Brie Gertler helpfully characterizes contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance as involving judgments that are (a) tied directly to their truthmakers, (b) depend only on the subject’s conscious states of mind for their justification, and (c) are more strongly justified than any empirical judgments that are not directly tied to their truthmakers and dependent only on conscious states of mind for their justification (Gertler 2012, p. 99). The traditional position on knowledge by acquaintance has been most influentially promulgated by the works of Richard Fumerton and Laurence BonJour (for other accounts related to the traditional approach see Balog 2012, Chalmers 2003, Fales 1996, Feldman 2004, Gertler 2001, Gertler 2011, Gertler 2012, Hasan forthcoming, and Pitt 2004).
Fumerton has proposed the following three conditions as necessary and sufficient for knowledge by acquaintance: (i) S is directly acquainted with the fact that p; (ii) S is directly acquainted with the thought that p; and (iii) S is directly acquainted with the correspondence that holds between the fact that p and the thought that p (Fumerton 1995, pp. 73-79). These three acquaintances parallel the requirements for a proposition’s being true (on a correspondence theory of truth): (a) the truth-maker (S is directly acquainted with the fact that p); (b) the truth-bearer (S is directly acquainted with the thought that p); and (c) the correspondence relation (S is directly acquainted with the correspondence between the fact that p and the thought that p). Given the subject’s direct acquaintance with (i), (ii), and (iii), he is directly acquainted with everything necessary to constitute being directly acquainted with a true proposition.
To the extent that BonJour provides an account of knowledge by acquaintance, it is directed exclusively to basic empirical beliefs. BonJour describes his theory of basic empirical justification as taking place when a person directly apprehends that his experience fits or satisfies the description offered by the content of his belief (BonJour 2001; BonJour 2003, especially pp. 60-76, 191-193; BonJour uses the language of “direct acquaintance” in 2001, while he prefers “direct apprehension” in 2003). It is the subject’s ability to have a direct acquaintance or apprehension of the contents of one’s own conscious experiences and how they fit or satisfy the content of one’s basic beliefs that makes knowledge by acquaintance possible. BonJour stresses, however, that fallibility can occur due to the subject’s misapprehension of one’s experience or failure to see the fit between the experience and the belief. Despite the possibility of error, he believes that this does not undermine genuine cases when a subject does correctly apprehend the character of experience and sees its fit with one’s basic belief.
On the other hand, there are non-traditional acquaintance theorists who have modified knowledge by acquaintance in such a way that one can be acquainted with and know physical objects directly (such as Brewer 2011). Another deviation from the Russellian tradition is to maintain that knowledge by acquaintance is a different kind of knowledge than propositional knowledge (Tye 2009, pp. 95-102). On this non-propositional approach to knowledge by acquaintance, there is a sense in which one can be said to know something with which one is acquainted, even though the person does not necessarily have any propositional belief states about the thing that is said to be known by acquaintance.
Perhaps the most influential problem raised for knowledge by acquaintance is commonly called the problem of the speckled hen (due to Gilbert Ryle as reported by Chisholm 1942). The problem arises by considering the case where someone looks at a hen with exactly 48 speckles on one side. Yet, the perceiver’s experience is not adequate grounds for him to distinguish an experience of a hen with exactly 47 or 49 speckles. Indeed, even if someone were to hold the belief that one’s experience is of a hen with exactly 48 speckles, it would by most standards fail to count as knowledge because the subject could have easily formed a false belief (for example, that the hen has 47 or 49 speckles) on the basis of being acquainted with that very experience (for one way to understand this epistemic principle see “The Safety Condition for Knowledge”). In other words, typically people cannot distinguish between having a visual experience of a 47, 48, or 49 speckled hen. However, if a person is directly acquainted with these experiences and can plausibly satisfy the other conditions required for knowledge by acquaintance, then cases of this sort stand as potential counterexamples to possessing knowledge or justification through direct acquaintance. Given the indiscernibility of the contents of mental states through direct acquaintance, this raises doubts whether one’s justification based on direct acquaintance can offer some unique, privileged state of knowledge. After all, one motivation for accepting knowledge by acquaintance is that the subject’s knowledge of his own mental states may be indubitable, whereas other kinds of knowledge cannot. The problem of the speckled hen challenges the idea that one may fail to have indubitable justification through knowledge by acquaintance because for just about any putative mental state with which one is acquainted, since there may be a different mental state that is virtually indistinguishable from it. It even raises the question whether these closely related states constitute genuinely different experiences for the subject at all.
The problem of the speckled hen has continued to challenge contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance (see Sosa 2003a, 2003b; Markie 2009; Poston 2010). The challenge, as Sosa puts it, is for the acquaintance theorist to “tell us which sorts of features of our states of consciousness are epistemically effective ones, the ones such that by corresponding to them specifically that our basic beliefs acquire epistemically foundational status” (Sosa 2003, pp. 277-278, similar remarks can be found in Sosa 2003b, p.121). Here the concern is that the acquaintance theorist has no principled way of explaining why one’s acquaintance with a simple mental state (for example, an experience of three black dots against a white background) is able to ground a justified belief, whereas one’s acquaintance with a complex mental state (for example, a hen with 48 speckles) fails to serve as appropriate grounds for a justified belief. The problem is for acquaintance theorists to provide a plausible account of the conditions and limits of knowledge by acquaintance that naturally explains cases like the speckled hen.
A second influential problem for knowledge by acquaintance is due to Wilfrid Sellars. Sellars (1963) famously critiqued the possibility of acquiring non-inferentially justified beliefs through some privileged, direct relation to one’s sensory experience. The problem that Sellars has raised can be put in terms of a dilemma (for a recent defense of this type of dilemma, see Williams 1999). The dilemma focuses on whether the conscious experiential states of mind are propositional or non-propositional. If, on the one hand, mental experiences are non-propositional, then it is mysterious (at best) to explain how a belief can derive any justification from a non-propositional basis. Donald Davidson expresses the core intuition behind this horn of the dilemma: “nothing can count as a reason for holding a belief except another belief” (1986, p. 126). The central claim at the crux of this side of the dilemma is that only propositional entities can stand in logical or justificatory relations to other propositional entities.
On the other side of the dilemma, if one accepts that mental experiences are propositional, then the problem for acquaintance theorists is to explain how one is justified in accepting the propositional content of experiences. Defenders of this objection stress that this horn of the dilemma pushes the problem of generating non-inferential justification back a step. If beliefs derive their justification from the propositional contents of experiences, then experiences too must derive their justification from some other appropriate source of propositional content. Contrary to the kind of foundationalism proposed by the acquaintance theorist, this horn of the dilemma essentially states that mental experiences do not constitute a non-arbitrary way to stop the regress of justification needed to arrive at a foundational bedrock for empirical knowledge or justification.
Thus, the Sellarsian dilemma appears to leave no viable alternative for the defender of direct acquaintance: (i) if experiences are non-propositional, then they cannot stand in justificatory relations to propositional beliefs; (ii) if experiences are propositional, then there must be some further basis for one to be justified in holding the propositional content of the experiences. The first option alleges that deriving justification from non-propositional content is mysterious and inexplicable. The second option alleges that granting propositional content to experiences does not stop the regress of reasons. Either way, the foundational and unique role that is supposed to be filled by knowledge by acquaintance is undermined.
In response to the problem of the speckled hen, Fumerton (2005) has suggested a variety of options available to the acquaintance theorist. First, it is possible that knowledge by acquaintance fails in cases like the speckled hen because the subject fails to have an acquaintance with the correspondence that holds between the character of his experience and the thought that the experience has a specific character (compare Poston 2007). Recall that on the traditional account, knowledge by acquaintance requires more than only being acquainted with the truth-maker for one’s belief, it also involves some kind of awareness of the correspondence or fit that holds between one’s thought and the experience that is the basis for one’s thought. A second proposal is based on phenomenal concepts (compare Feldman 2004). A phenomenal concept is a concept that one can immediately recognize (for example, being three-sided) as opposed to a concept that involves a process of thought to recognize (for example, being 27-sided). Restricting knowledge by acquaintance to belief-states involving phenomenal concepts can accommodate the challenge of the speckled hen by plausibly maintaining that the concept of being 48-speckled is not a phenomenal concept and thereby not a candidate for knowledge by acquaintance. Third, one can maintain that there are degrees between determinate and determinable properties with which one is acquainted (compare Fales 1996, pp. 173-180). Properties fall on a continuum between being more general to being more specific or determined. For example, a ripe tomato’s surface can be described generally as colored, more determinately as red, or even more determinately as vermilion. Given this distinction in the determinateness of properties, it is possible that one could be directly acquainted with differing degrees of determinable properties. If experiences can instantiate varying degrees of these determinable properties (and this is a matter of controversy that cannot be addressed here), then in cases like the speckled hen the acquaintance theorist may hold that the subject is not directly acquainted with the experience of a hen with 48 speckles but with the experience having a less determinate property such as the property of being many-speckled. Thus, in cases akin to the speckled hen, the subject may not be acquainted with the property of being 48-speckled, but with a less determinate property like being many-speckled.
Another proposed solution to the problem of the speckled hen follows from distinguishing between the phenomenal and epistemic appearances of an experience (Gertler 2011, pp. 103-106). The phenomenal appearance of an experience is determined by the properties that constitute the experience. The epistemic appearance of an experience is what the experience inclines the subject to believe. For example, if someone takes a white plate and holds it under a green light, the plate phenomenally appears green (that is, the property of being green partly constitutes the experience of the plate) but with sufficient knowledge of the effects of green lighting on white objects, it does not epistemically appear green (that is, the subject is not inclined to think that the plate is green). In cases like the speckled hen, then, the experience may phenomenally appear to be 48-speckled, but it may only epistemically appear to be many-speckled. The key to this solution is disambiguating the meaning of “appearance” to explain how in one sense the subject may have an appearance of a hen with 48 speckles (phenomenally) and in another sense the subject may not have an appearance of a hen with 48 speckles (epistemically).
With respect to the Sellarsian dilemma, one response takes the horn of the dilemma that states propositional beliefs derive their justification from non-propositional experiences. For instance, Fumerton (1995, pp. 74-76) proposes an account of knowledge by acquaintance (see above section 2b) where the subject is in a position to know a truth through three acquaintances. Since acquaintance by itself is not an epistemic concept in need of justification, it enables the subject to be appropriately related to the source of one’s justification without necessitating further levels of justification. Thus, in response to the challenge to explain how non-propositional experiences (such as the raw experience of searing pain) can justify propositional thoughts (such as the belief that I am experiencing pain), Fumerton maintains that justification is made possible by being directly acquainted with the relation of correspondence that holds between the non-propositional experience and the propositional thought.
BonJour offers another influential response to Sellars’s dilemma (2001, pp. 28-34; 2003, especially pp. 69-74). On BonJour’s account of basic empirical knowledge (see above section 2b), the awareness or apprehension of the justification for one’s belief is built-in or partly constitutive of the justifying non-conceptual experience. While non-conceptual experiences do not stand in certain kinds of logical relations (for example, inferring) to conceptual beliefs, there is a relation of description or fit that holds between experiences and beliefs. Since certain kinds of experiences have a built-in awareness of their contents, these experiences contain within themselves a kind of reason for thinking that the given description accurately fits. The crucial move in BonJour’s solution is to see that the built-in awareness renders the basic empirical belief justified without any further need for justification.
Staunch defenders of the Sellarsian dilemma will likely remain unimpressed with these responses. The problem, they might urge, is that these alleged solutions push the problem back a level. Those defending the dilemma will press these proposals to explain how propositional beliefs can correspond or accurately describe non-propositional experiences. In some places, Fumerton and BonJour seem to suggest that first-hand experience with our own conscious states of mind adequately demonstrate how these relations are able to hold (Fumerton 1995, p. 77; BonJour 2003, pp. 69-74).
Other friends of direct acquaintance have suggested that experiences, while being non-propositional, may have a propositional structure (or proto-propositional structure) that allows for propositional content to map onto it (Fales 1996, pp. 166-169). For example, a non-propositional experience may be constituted by presenting particulars exemplifying specific properties, which naturally provides a structure resembling statements in the subject-predicate form. Timothy McGrew contends that basic empirical beliefs can be formed by indexically referring to one’s non-propositional experience as part of what constitutes the propositional content of the belief (1995, especially pp. 89-90). By embedding the non-propositional content as a constituent part of the belief (for example, “I am being appeared to thusly”), it is possible to show how non-propositional experiences may provide a basis for forming justified propositional beliefs (for some concerns about the richness of indexically formed beliefs to serve as a foundation see Sosa 2003b, especially pp. 122-124).
While knowledge by acquaintance has its most immediate application to philosophical topics in epistemology, it has increasingly been applied to issues in metaphysics, especially in the philosophy of mind. In particular, knowledge by acquaintance has played a role in the knowledge argument against physicalism. Some argue that knowledge of qualia is direct and unmediated, which provides an insight into the nature of the mind that cannot be known through the physical sciences. Frank Jackson presents this argument through a compelling thought experiment about Mary (Jackson 1982; 1986). Mary is a scientist who learns all the physical truths from her exhaustive study of the completed physics. For whatever reasons, Mary has lived her entire life without experiencing any colors besides black, white, and shades of gray. One day after she has mastered all the physical truths and everything that can be deduced a priori from them, Mary leaves her black-and-white environment and sees a ripe tomato. Intuitively, it seems that Mary learns something new with this experience; she learns this is what it’s like to have a red experience. Since Mary knew all the physical truths prior to seeing the ripe tomato and since Mary learned something new about the world after seeing the ripe tomato, the implication of the thought experiment, then, is that physicalism is false.
More recently David Chalmers has made use of knowledge by acquaintance to support property dualism in the same vein as the knowledge argument. His arguments rely in part on the notion that our direct knowledge of phenomenal conscious states justifies our beliefs about them (see Chalmers 1996, especially pp. 196-198; 2004; 2007). Among his arguments is the case from the asymmetry between one’s knowledge of consciousness and the rest of the world (Chalmers 1996, pp. 101-103). A person’s knowledge of consciousness is based on first-hand, direct experiences of it, not evidence that is external to one’s immediate access. His argument, roughly stated, is that since subjects know by acquaintance that phenomenal consciousness exists and possesses certain features, and this knowledge cannot be deduced a priori from one’s knowledge of physical truths, it follows that these features of conscious experience are not physical.
Some philosophers have attempted to defend physicalist theories of mind with the notion of knowledge by acquaintance, albeit by employing a non-traditional approach to knowledge by acquaintance (compared to the traditional approach as described in section 1 and section 2). Generally these approaches have endorsed that knowledge by acquaintance is nothing more than a subject’s being directly acquainted with a property or fact, and they have deviated from the traditional position that knowledge by acquaintance requires propositional belief (see Conee 1994 and Tye 2009). Those who use knowledge by acquaintance to defend physicalism claim that the knowledge argument only highlights two different ways of knowing the same thing. One way this case has been made is by suggesting that one can know all the propositional truths about something (for example, the city of Houston) and yet not know it directly. The difference between knowledge of phenomenal consciousness and knowledge of brain states is like the difference between knowing about Houston (by reading a very thorough visitor’s guide) and knowing Houston directly (by visiting the city). According to these views, it is because knowledge by acquaintance is a different kind of knowledge that phenomenal knowledge appears to differ from descriptive, physical knowledge about brain states. Although there is not space for a full evaluation of these views, one problem that has been raised is that knowledge by acquaintance cannot by itself account for the epistemic disparity that this solution is attempting to solve (see Nida-Rümelin 1995; Gertler 1999). In other words, the problem is that there appears to be propositional, factual content about the properties of conscious experience that these non-standard accounts of knowledge by acquaintance fail to capture.
The distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description has a number of important applications in philosophy. In epistemology, it underwrites a tradition from Bertrand Russell that continues to influence debates on the nature of foundationalism and the possibility of a privileged class of knowledge. In metaphysics, knowledge by acquaintance has increasingly been incorporated into arguments concerning the nature of conscious experience and the viability of physicalism. The current trend suggests that knowledge by acquaintance will continue to be refined and put to work on a variety of philosophical fronts.
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John M. DePoe
U. S. A.
Last updated: January 6, 2013 | Originally published: January 1, 2012