Alexandre Kojève (1902—1968)

Alexandre Kojève was responsible for the serious introduction of Hegel into 20th Century French philosophy, influencing many leading French intellectuals who attended his seminar on The Phenomenology of Spirit in Paris in the 30s. He focused on Hegel’s philosophy of history and is best known for his theory of ‘the end of history’ and for initiating ‘existential Marxism.’ Kojève arrives at what is generally considered a truly original interpretation by reading Hegel through the twin lenses of Marx’s materialism and Heidegger’s temporalised ontology.

For Hegel, human history is the history of ‘thought’ as it attempts to understand itself and its relation to the world. He postulates that history began with unity, but into which man, a questioning ‘I’, emerges introducing dualism and splits. Man attempts to heal these sequences of ‘alienations’ dialectically, and drives history forwards, but in so doing causes new divisions which must then be overcome. Hegel sees the possibility of ‘historical reconciliation’ lying in the rational realization of underlying unity – the manifestation of an absolute spirit or ‘geist’ – leading to humanity living according to a unified, shared morality: the end of history.

Kojève takes these ideas of universal historical process and the reconciliation towards unity, and synthesizes them with theories of Marx and Heidegger. He takes Marx’s productivist philosophy that places the transformative activity of a desiring being centre-stage in the historical process, housing it within the conditions of material pursuit and ideological struggle. Drawing on Heidegger, he also defines this being as free, ‘negative’ and radically temporal, thereby recognizing and ‘reclaiming’ its mortality, ridding it of determinism and metaphysical illusion, allowing it to produce its own reality through experience alone.

This article examines the Hegelian context of Kojève’s work, and analyses how Marx and Heidegger contribute to his theory. It also outlines Kojeve’s vision of the culmination of history; how this fits into 20th Century politics; and the profound influence he had on French intellectuals including Sartre, Lacan and Breton, and on America intellectuals including Leo Strauss, Alan Bloom and Francis Fukuyama.

Table of Contents

  1. Chronology of Life and Works
  2. The Hegelian Context
  3. The Influence of Marx
  4. The Influence of Heidegger
  5. The End of History and the Last Man
  6. Kojève's Influence
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Chronology of Life and Works

French philosopher (1902-1968), born Aleksandr Vladimirovich Kozhevnikov in Russia. Kojève studied in Heidelberg, Germany where, under the supervision of Karl Jaspers, he completed a thesis (Die religöse Philosophie Wladimir Solowjews, 1931) on Vladimir Solovyov, a Russian religious philosopher deeply influenced by Hegel. He later settled in Paris, where he taught at the Ecole Pratique des Hautes Ētudes. Taking over from Alexandre Koyré, he taught a seminar on Hegel from 1933 till 1939. Along with Jean Hyppolite, he was responsible for the serious introduction of Hegel into French thought. His lectures exerted a profound influence (both direct and indirect) over many leading French philosophers and intellectuals - amongst them Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, Lacan, Bataille, Althusser, Queneau, Aron, and Breton. Via his friend Leo Strauss, Kojève's thought also exerted influence in America, most especially over Allan Bloom and, later, Francis Fukuyama. His lectures on Hegel were published in 1947 under the title Introduction à la lecture de Hegel, appearing in English as Introduction to the Reading of Hegel (1969). After the Second World War Kojève worked in the French Ministry of Economic Affairs, until his death in 1968. Here he exercised a profound, mandarin influence over French policy, including a role as one of the leading architects of the EEC and GATT. He continued to write philosophy over these years, including works on the pre-Socratics, Kant, the concept of right, the temporal dimensions of philosophical wisdom, the relationship between Christianity and both Western science and communism, and the development of capitalism. Many of these works were only published posthumously.

2. The Hegelian Context

Hegel's philosophy of history, most especially the historicist philosophy of consciousness developed in the Phenomenology of Spirit, provides the core of Kojève's own work. However, Kojève’s Hegel lectures are not so much an exegesis of Hegel's thought, as a profoundly original reinterpretation. By reading Hegel's philosophy of consciousness through the twin lenses of Marx's materialism and Heidegger’s temporalised ontology of human being (Dasein), Kojève can rightly be said to have initiated 'existential Marxism'. Here I will briefly sketch the most salient dimensions of Hegel's philosophy of history, before proceeding to outline Kojève's own interpretation of it.

Perhaps the core of Hegel's philosophy is the idea that human history is the history of thought as it attempts to understand itself and its relation to its world. History is the history of reason, as it grapples with its own nature and its relation to that with which it is confronted (other beings, nature, the eternal). The historical movement of this reason is one of a sequence of alienations (Entfremdungen) or splits, and the subsequent attempt to reconcile these divisions through a restoration of unity. Thus, for example, Hegel sees the world of the Athenian Greeks as one in which people lived in a harmonious relation to their community and the world about, the basis of this harmony being provided by a pre-reflective commitment to shared customs, conventions and habits of thought and action. With the beginnings of Socratic philosophy, however, division and separation is introduced into thought - customary answers to questions of truth, morality, and reality are brought under suspicion. A questioning 'I' emerges, one that experiences itself as distinct and apart from other beings, from customary rules, and from a natural world that becomes an 'object' for it. This introduces into experience a set of 'dualisms' - between subject and object, man and nature, desire and duty, the human and the divine, the individual and the collectivity. For Hegel, the historical movement of thought is a 'dialectical' process wherein these divisions are put through processes of reconciliation, producing in turn new divisions, which thought in turn attempts to reconcile. Historically, this task of reconciliation has been embodied in many forms - in art, in religion, and in philosophy. Enlightenment philosophy, the philosophy of Hegel's own time, is the latest and most sophisticated attempt to reconcile these divisions through reason alone, to freely find man's place amongst others and the universe as a whole. This, for Hegel, is only to be achieved through the overcoming (Aufhebung) of false divisions, by grasping that underlying apparent schisms (such as that between subject and object) there is a unity, with all elements being manifestations of an Absolute Spirit (Geist). Thus Hegel sees the key to historical reconciliation lying in the rational realisation of underlying unity, a unity that can, in time, come to connect individuals with each other and with the world in which they live. Universal history is the product of reason, leading (potentially) to a reconciled humanity, at one with itself, living according to a shared morality that is the outcome of rational reflection.

3. The Influence of Marx

Hegel's philosophy of universal history furnishes that basic framework of Kojève's philosophical stance. History is a processual movement in which division is subjected to reconciliation, culminating in 'the end of history', its completion in a universal society of mutual recognition and affirmation.

However, Kojève reworks Hegel in number of crucial (and, amongst Hegel scholars, controversial) ways. The first of these may be identified with the influence of Marx, especially the writings of the so-called '1848 manuscripts'. Kojève follows Marx's 'inverted Hegelianism’ by understanding the labor of historical development in broadly 'materialist' terms. The making of history is no longer simply a case of reason at work in the world, but of man's activity as a being who collectively produces his own being. This occurs through the labor of appropriating and transforming his material world in order to satisfy his own needs. Whereas Hegel's idealism gives priority to the forms of consciousness that produce the world as experienced, Kojève follows Marx in tying consciousness to the labor of material production and the satisfaction of human desires thereby. While Hegel recuperates human consciousness into a theological totality (Geist or 'Absolute Spirit'), Kojève secularises human history, seeing it as solely the product of man's self-production. Whereas Hegelian reconciliation is ultimately the reconciliation of man with God (totality or the Absolute), for Kojève the division of man from himself is transcended in humanist terms. If Hegel sees the end of history as the final moment of reconciliation with God or Spirit, Kojève (Like Feurbach and Marx) sees it as the transcendence of an illusion, in which God (man's alienated essence, Wesen) is reclaimed by man. Whereas the Hegelian totality provides a prior set of ontological relations between man and world waiting to be apprehended by a maturing consciousness, Kojève sees human action as the transformative process that produces those ontological relations. While Hegel arguably presents a 'panlogistic' relation between man and nature, unifying the two in the Absolute, Kojève sees a fundamental disjunction between the two domains, providing the conditions for human self-production through man's negating and transforming activities.

Perhaps the conceptual key to Kojève's understanding of universal history is desire. Desire functions as the engine of history - it is man's pursuit in realisation of his desires that drives the struggles between men. Desire is the permanent and universal feature of human existence, and when transformed into action it is the basis of all historical agency. The desire for 'recognition' (Anerkennung), the validation of human worth and the satisfaction of needs, propels the struggles and processes that make for historical progression. History moves through a series of determinate configurations, culminating in the end of history, a state in which a common and universal humanity is finally realised. This would entail 'the formation of a society...in which the strictly particular, personal, individual value of each is recognised as such'. Hence individual values and needs would converge upon a common settlement in which a shared human nature (comprising the desires and inclinations that define humanity as such) would find its satisfaction.

How and why is this realisation of mutuality and equality to come about? Kojève follows Hegel's famous presentation of the 'master-slave’ dialectic in order to deduce the necessary overcoming of inequality, division and subordination. The relation of 'master' and ‘slave’ is one in which the satisfaction of a dominant group's or class’ needs (the 'masters’) is met through the subordination of others (the 'slaves' or ‘bondsmen’). The ‘slave’ exists only to affirm the superiority and humanity of the 'master', and to furnish the 'master's’ needs by surrendering up his labor. However, this relation is doomed to failure, for two fundamental reasons. Firstly, the 'master' desires the recognition and affirmation of his full humanity and value, and uses the subordinated 'slave' for that end. This means that the 'master', perversely, is dependent upon the ‘slave’, thus inverting the relation of domination. Moreover, this forced relation of recognition remains thoroughly incomplete, since the 'slave' is not in a position to grant affirmation freely, but is compelled to do so due to his subordination. Affirmation or recognition that is not freely given counts for nothing. As Kojève puts it:

The relation between Master and Slave...is not recognition properly so-called...The Master is not the only one to consider himself Master. The Slave, also, considers him as such. Hence, he is recognized in his human reality and dignity. But this recognition is one-sided, for he does not recognize in turn the Slave's human reality and dignity. Hence, he is recognized by someone whom he does not recognize. And this is what is insufficient - what is tragic - in his situation...For he can be satisfied only by recognition from one whom he recognizes as worthy of recognizing him.

This establishes the constitutive need for mutual recognition and formal equality, if recognition of value is to be established. It is only when there is mutuality and recognition of all, that the recognition of any one becomes fully possible.

Secondly, for Kojève (as for Marx) it is the laboring 'slave' who is the key to historical progress. It is the ‘slave’ who works, and consequently it is he and not the 'master' who exercises his ‘negativity’ in transforming the world in line with human wants and desires. So, on the material level, the slave possesses the key to his own liberation, namely his active mastery of nature. Moreover, the 'master' has no desire to transform the world, whereas the 'slave', unsatisfied with his condition, imagines and attempts to realise a world of freedom in which his value will finally be recognised and his own desires satisfied. The slave's ideological struggle is to overcome his own fear of death and take-up struggle against the 'master', demanding the recognition of his value and freedom. The coincidence of material and ideological conditions of liberation were already made manifest, for Kojève, by the revolutions of the 18th, 19th and 20th centuries; these struggles set the conditions for the completion of history in the form of universal society.

4. The Influence of Heidegger

If Marx furnishes one central resource for Kojève's rereading of Hegel, Heidegger provides the other. From Heidegger, Kojève takes the insight that humankind is distinguished from nature through its distinctive ontological self-relation. Man's being is conditioned by its radically temporal character, its understanding of its being in time, with finitude or death as its ultimate horizon. Kojève's ontology is, pace Heidegger’s analysis of Dasein in Being & Time, first and foremost experiential and existential. By bringing together Hegel with Heidegger, Kojève attempts to radically historicise existentialism, while simultaneously giving Hegelian historicity a radically existential twist, wherein man's existential freedom defines his being. Freedom is understood as the ontological relation of 'negativity', the incompleteness of human being, its constitutive ‘lack’. It is precisely because of this lack of a fully constituted being that man experiences (or, more properly is nothing other than) desire. The negativity of being, manifest as desire, makes possible man's self-making, the process of 'becoming'. This position can be see to draw inspiration from Heidegger's critique of the transcendental preoccupations of Western thought, which he claims set reified, metaphysically assured figurations of Being over and above the processes of Becoming (wherein the 'Being of Beings', das Sein des Seieinden, is variously revealed within the horizon of temporality). The disavowal of such metaphysically anchored and ultimately timeless configurations of human being frees man from determinism and 'throws' him into his existential freedom. In Kojève's thinking, man’s struggle is to exercise this freedom in order to produce a world in which his desires are satisfied, in the course of which he comes to accept his own freedom, ridding himself of the illusions of religion and superstition, 'heroically' claiming his own finitude or mortality.

We can see, then, how Kojève attempts to synthesise Hegel, Marx and Heidegger. From Hegel he takes the notion of a universal historical process within which reconciliation unfolds through an intersubjective dialectic, resulting in unity. From Marx he takes a secularised, de-theologised, and productivist philosophical anthropology, one that places the transformative activity of a desiring being centre stage in the historical process. From Heidegger, he takes the existentialist interpretation of human being as free, negative, and radically temporal. Pulling three together, he presents a vision of human history in which man grasps his freedom to produce himself and his world in pursuit of his desires, and in doing so drives history toward its end (understood both as culmination or exhaustion, and its goal or completion).

5. The End of History and the Last Man

Kojève's vision of the culmination of history has, in recent years, exercised a renewed influence, not least in light of the collapse of Soviet communism and its satellite states. If we examine the vision of completion that Kojève held-out, we can see precisely why the advocates (or apologists) of a post-Cold War global capitalist order have drawn such inspiration from Kojève's thesis.

For Kojève, historical reconciliation will culminate in the equal recognition of all individuals. This recognition will remove the rationale for war and struggle, and so will usher-in peace. In this way, history, politically speaking, culminates in a universal (global) order which is without classes or distinctions - in Hegelian terms, there are no longer any 'masters' and ‘slaves’, only free human beings who mutually recognise and affirm each others' freedom. This political moment takes the form of law, which confers universal recognition upon all individuals, thereby satisfying the particular individual's desire to be affirmed as an equal amongst others.

Simultaneously, the progression of man's productive capacities, his ability to take nature and transform it in order to satisfy his own needs and desires, will result in prosperity and freedom from such want. For Kojève, the economic culmination of human productive capacities finds its apotheosis not in communism, but in capitalism. Like Marx, Kojève believed that capitalism had unleashed productive forces, generating heretofore unimagined wealth. Moreover, like Marx he believed that the expansion of capitalism was an homogenising force, producing a globalising cultural standard that laid waste to local attachments, traditions and boundaries, replacing them with bourgeoisie values. Kojève departs from Marxism (and its variants such as Leninism) by rejecting the notion that capitalism contained inherent contradictions that would inevitably bring about its demise and supercession by communism. Marx thought that the immiseration of workers under 19th century capitalism would worsen as the pressure of market competition would lead to ever-more brutal extraction of surplus from workers' labor, in attempt to offset the falling rate of profit. This would result in the pauperisation of the proletariat, and capitalism's inability to avoid such crisis would necessitate the overthrow of its relations by a proletariat raised up to class consciousness under the conditions of its immiseration. Kojève, in contrast, believed that 20th century capitalism had found a way out of these contradictions, finding ways to yoke the market system to a redistributive arrangement that managed to spread the wealth it produced. Far from becoming increasingly impoverished, the working class was coming to enjoy unprecedented prosperity. This is why Kojève, as early as 1948, was proclaiming the United States as the economic model for the 'post-historical' world, the most efficient and successful in conquering nature in order to provide for human material needs. Hence he asserted, long before the final collapse of the Soviet empire, that the Cold War would end in the triumph of the capitalist West, achieved through economic rather than military means.

The end of history would also usher-in other distinctive forms. Philosophically, it would end in absolute knowledge displacing ideology. Artistically, the reconciled consciousness would express itself through abstract art - while pictorial and representational art captured cultural specifics, these specifics would have been effaced, leaving abstract aesthetic forms as the embodiment of universal and homogeneous consciousness.

However, Kojève's disposition to the culmination of universal history is radically ambivalent. On the one hand, he follows Marx by seeing in idyllic terms the post-historical world, one of universal freedom, emancipation from war and want, leaving space for "art, love, play, and so forth; in short, everything that makes Man happy". However, Kojève is simultaneously beset by pessimism. In his philosophical anthropology, man is defined by his negating activity, by his struggle to overcome himself and nature through struggle and contestation. This is the ontological definition of man, his raison d'etre. Yet the end of history marks the end of this struggle, thereby exhausting man of the activity which has defined his essence. The end of history ushers-in the 'death of man'; paradoxically, man is robbed of the definitional core of his existence precisely at the moment of his triumph. Post-historical man will no longer be 'man' as we understand him, but will be 'reanimalized', such that the end of history marks the ‘definitive annihilation of Man properly so-called'.

6. Kojève's Influence

The influence of Kojève's thought has been profound, both within France and beyond. It is possible to trace many connections within French philosophy that owe varying degrees of debt to Kojève, given that his distinctive reinterpretation of Hegel was key for the French reception of Hegel's thought. However, there are also a number of important philosophers for whom Kojève's Hegelianism provided direct insights that were taken-up and in-turn used to found distinctive philosophical positions.

Firstly, we must note the importance of Kojève's Hegelianism for Sartre's philosophical development. It is a matter of on-going contention whether or not Sartre personally attended the Hegel seminars of the 1930s. However, it can reasonably be claimed that Kojève's existential and Marxian reading of the Phenomenology was equally important as Heidegger's Being & Time for the position presented in Sartre's Being & Nothingness. Central to Sartre’s account is a thoroughly Kojèveian philosophical anthropology, one which finds man's essence in his freedom as pure negative activity, existentially separating the human for-itself (pour-soi) from the natural world of reified Being (en-soi). Sartre's account of the 'master-slave' dialectic follows Kojève’s in its existential reworking, albeit without the optimism that finds a possibility of reconciliation in this intersubjective struggle (for Sartre, the dialectic is doomed to repeat a struggle for domination in which each party attempts to claim its own freedom via the mortification of the other's Being). Moreover, Sartre's subsequent attempts to reconcile historical materialism with existentialism owe more than a passing debt to Kojève's original formulation of an 'existential Marxist' position.

Another eminent thinker for whom Kojève proved decisive was Jacques Lacan. Lacan's account of psycho-social formation was developed through a synthesis of Freud and structuralism, read through Kojève's ontologised version of the 'master-slave' dialectic. For Lacan, following Kojève, human subjectivity is defined first and foremost by desire. It is the experience of lack, the twin of the experience of desire, that provides the ontological condition of subject formation; it is only through the lack-desire dyad that a being comes into the awareness of its own separation from the world in which it is, at first, thoroughly immersed. Moreover, Lacan's account of the childhood development of self-consciousness, captured through his analysis of the 'mirror-stage', replays the intersubjective mediation of consciousness that Kojève presented to his French students (Lacan amongst them) in the Hegel lectures.

Kojève also profoundly influenced the likes of Georges Bataille and Raymond Queneau, both through the lectures they attended, and through the friendships he maintained with them for many years after. Queneau is often associated with Andre Breton and the surrealists (with whom he broke in 1929), but his novels present a vision of the world that is profoundly indebted to Kojève. Many of his most famous books depict life at the end of history; there is no more historical movement, progress or transformation to come, and his characters live in a kind of 'eternal present' attending to the activities of everyday enjoyment. History recurs as something that can only be enjoyed as a tourist attraction, or as a reverie of the past, viewed from the vantage point of its demise. Bataille (anthropologist, philosopher and pornographer, a doyen of recent postmodern aestheticism and anti-rationalism) was perhaps the most powerful articulator of Kojève's pessimism in the face of the 'death of man'. The victory of reason was, for Bataille, a curse; its inevitable triumph in the unstoppable march of modernity brought with it homogeneity, order, and disenchantment. The triumph of reason as history meant the twilight and death of man, as the excessive and destructive power of negativity was displaced by harmonious, reciprocal equilibrium. Bataille's response, a liberatory struggle against these forces through the evocation of perverse desires, madness, and anguish, takes Kojève's prognosis at its word, and stages a heroic resistance against the tide of historical forces.

The influence of Kojève outside France has probably been most pronounced in the United States. His ideas achieved a new salience and exposure with the publication of Francis Fukayama's The End of History and the Last Man (1992), in the wake of the Cold War. Fukayama was a student of Allan Bloom's, who in turn was a 'disciple' of the 'esoteric' émigré political philosopher Leo Strauss. It was Strauss who introduced a generation of his students to Kojève's thought, and in Bloom’s case, arranged for him to study with Kojève in Paris in the 1960s. The book, an international bestseller, presents nothing less than a triumphal vindication of Kojève's supposedly prescient thesis that history has found its end in the global triumph of capitalism and liberal democracy. With the final demise of Soviet Marxism, and the global hegemony of capitalism, we have finally reached the end of history. There are no more battles to be fought, no more experiments in social engineering to be attempted; the world has arrived at a homogenised state in which the combination of capitalism and liberal democracy will reign supreme, and all other cultural and ideological systems will be consigned irretrievably to the past. Fukayama follows Kojève in tying the triumph of capitalism to the satisfaction of material human needs. Moreover, he sees it as the primary mechanism for the provision of recognition and value. Consumerism and the commodity form, for Fukayama, present the means by which recognition is mediated. Humans desire to be valued by others, and the means of appropriating that valuation is the appropriation of the things that others themselves value; hence lifestyle and fashion become the mechanisms of mutual esteem in a post-historical world governed by the logic of capitalist individualism.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Butler, Judith: Subjects of Desire: Hegelian Reflections in Twentieth Century France. New York, Columbia University Press, 1999
  • Descombes, Vincent: Modern French Philosophy. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1980
  • Drury, Shadia B: Alexandre Kojève: The Roots of Postmodern Politics. Basingstoke, Macmillan, 1994
  • Fukuyama, Francis: The End of History and the Last Man. Harmondsworth, Penguin, 1992
  • Hegel, G.W.F: Phenomenology of Spirit. Oxford, Oxford University Press, 1977
  • Heidegger, Martin: Being and Time. Oxford, Blackwell, 1962
  • Kojève, Alexander: Introduction to the Reading of Hegel. New York, Basic Books, 1969
  • Kojève, Alexander: Kant. Paris, Gallimard, 1973
  • Kojève, Alexander: Le Concept, le Temps et le Discours. Paris, Gallimard, 1991
  • Kojève, Alexander: Outline of a Phenomenology of Right. London, Rowman & Littlefield, 2000
  • Lacan, Jacques: Ecrits: A Selection. London, Tavistock, 1977
  • Poster, Mark: Existential Marxism in Postwar France: From Sartre to Althusser. Princeton, Princeton University Press, 1975
  • Roth, Michael S: Knowing and History: Appropriations of Hegel in Twentieth Century France. Ithaca and London, Cornell University Press, 1988
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul: Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology. London, Routledge , 1989

Author Information

Majid Yar
Email: m_yar@hotmail.com
United Kingdom