Victor Kraft (1880—1975)

Victor KraftVictor Kraft was an Austrian philosopher and librarian. He was, as he himself emphasized, a “non-orthodox” member of the Vienna Circle and tried to reintroduce scientific philosophy in Austria after the Second World War. Beginning in 1903, Kraft argued for epistemology based on ontological realism. He did not claim that realism can be proven logically but is established as an (abductive) inference in order to explain the regularities of perception. In the philosophy of science, he was a proponent of the hypothetico-deductive method. Interestingly, Kraft used a lot of illustrative examples from the sciences and humanities to substantiate his methodological claims. Kraft was the only member of the Vienna Circle who claimed, against logical-empiricist conviction, that an analysis of values and ethics are an appropriate subject for philosophical analysis. Also, he combined insights from empirical sciences (especially psychology) and philosophical analysis in order to provide a non-relativistic basis for morals. From a historical point of view, it is especially remarkable that Kraft published for over seven decades without abandoning his initial position. Of particular importance is his impact on Karl Popper and Paul Feyerabend. His most important works are his Erkenntnislehre (Theory of Knowledge, 1960), his Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden (The Basic Forms of the Scientific Method, 1925, second edition 1973) and his Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value (second German edition 1951, English version published in 1981). He is also known as the author of the seminal monograph The Vienna Circle: the Origin of Neo-Positivism (1951, published in English in 1969).

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Work
    1. Epistemology and Ontology
    2. Philosophy of Science–Methodology
    3. Philosophy of Geography as an Example of Kraft’s Philosophy of Science
    4. Value Theory and Moral Philosophy
  3. Kraft’s Impact as a Philosopher
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Works by Kraft
    2. Quoted Literature and Suggestions for Further Reading

1. Life

Victor (or Viktor) Kraft was born on July 4, 1880 in Vienna, Austria. Both his father and his maternal grandfather were teachers. In 1899, he received the matura (the general qualification for university entrance) and enrolled in geography and history at the University of Vienna with the intention of becoming a teacher. There he attended lectures in economics, geology and botany. Kraft encountered philosophy for the first time as a member of the University of Vienna’s Philosophical Society and in private discussion circles. In 1903, Kraft completed his PhD thesis, “The Knowledge of the External World” (Die Erkenntnis der Außenwelt). The following year he studied under Wilhelm Dilthey, Georg Simmel, Carl Stumpf and Heinrich Wölfflin for one semester in Berlin. In 1914, he received the venia legendi, the right to teach at the university level, as a result of his book World-Concept and Knowledge-Concept (Weltbegriff und Erkenntnisbegriff). His supervisors for his “habilitation” were the psychologist and philosopher Friedrich Jodl and the philosopher Alois Höfler. Kraft’s original intention to pursue an academic career was regarded as futile by both Jodl and the philosopher Laurenz Müllner, which led Kraft to seek employment at the University of Vienna library. Though he held a full-time job, in which he ultimately reached the position of national librarian (Generalstaatsbibliothekar), he continued his work in philosophy. In 1924, he applied for a full professorship in Vienna, but for political reasons, the position was given to another candidate (Stadler 2001, 522 ff). Kraft received merely the title of associate professor. In the book he wrote for this application, The Basic Forms of the Scientific Method (Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden), which was published in 1925, Kraft outlined his hypothetico-deductive method. A second, completely revised edition was published in 1973.

In 1924, the Vienna Circle began as an informal discussion group led by the philosopher Moritz Schlick, and Kraft participated at these meetings. He was also a member of the so called Gomperz circle, which was named after its leader, the philosopher Heinrich Gomperz. Kraft never adhered to verificationism, the most radical thesis of the logical empiricists, because it was incompatible with his concept of realism. In 1937, he published Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Values (Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftlichen Wertlehre), a book which made early contributions to value theory and ethics. A second edition was released in 1951. In 1938, after the Anschluss (the occupation and annexation of Austria by Nazi Germany), a biographical caesura took place. Kraft was forced to retire due to the fact that he was married to a Jewish woman (Heiß 1993, 139, 157, n. 43; Topitsch 1981, xii). During World War II, he remained in his hometown of Vienna as an “inner emigrant” and wrote a manuscript that was lost in the final days of the war. During this time, he was able to publish in the Swedish journal Theoria. In 1947, he released Mathematics, Logic and Experience, a small volume based on the lost manuscript.

Kraft was finally reinstated as extraordinary professor in 1950, and at the age of seventy he received the title of ordentlicher Professor (full professor) at the University of Vienna. He tried to revitalize a kind of reformed logical empiricist philosophy but was unsuccessful; the political climate at that time was as hostile to logical-empirical philosophizing as it had been in the 1920s and 1930s. He became the academic head of a discussion group of students, which included Paul Feyerabend, who wrote his Ph.D. thesis under Kraft’s supervision. This group was part of the “Forum Alpach”, a non-profit organization that was most important for reintroducing scientific philosophy in Austria and Germany. Feyerabend served as the student leader of this group.

Kraft‘s most significant and mature monograph was published in 1960; the voluminous Theory of Knowledge (Erkenntnislehre) summarized his lifelong philosophical work, and he dedicated the book to himself on his eightieth birthday. Eight years later, he published a small book, The Fundamentals of Knowledge and of Morality (Die Grundlagen der Erkenntnis und der Moral). In 1974, Mathematics, Logic and Experience was reprinted in a substantially revised form. Kraft died on January 3, 1975, in Vienna. For Kraft’s biography see Kainz [1976].

2. Work

a. Epistemology and Ontology

The historical and thematic context in which Kraft developed his own philosophical position included the critique of immanence philosophy (a form of neutral monism developed by Richard Avenarius) and Ernst Mach’s positivism. Kraft was primarily concerned with defending the assumption of an external world. The Kantian (Critique of Pure Reason, B116) distinction between “question of fact” (quaestio facti) and “question of right” (quaestio iuris) was central for Kraft. In sharp contrast to any form of traditional Kantianism, Kraft did not intend to logically justify any answers to those “questions of right” but instead insisted on pragmatic vindication. This becomes remarkably clear in his attempts to stipulate the concept of knowledge, wherein only by presupposing some ends can an adequate normative definition of the concept of “knowledge” be reached. Kraft presupposes that knowledge must bear practical implications:

The only thing one can do is to make clear why a certain definition of knowledge is chosen, why those traits are regarded as essential for knowledge (Erkenntnis). These are not theoretical but practical claims of validity, which must be seen in the context of other ends, that is, that some consequences are preferred, or that some consequences or presuppositions are rejected (Kraft 1960, 31, my translation).

Later Kraft explains that the concept of knowledge is determined by human nature; that is, only a concept of knowledge that guarantees an invariant order of knowledge can be generally accepted. Human beings need information about the external world; otherwise, no orientation or human actions are possible. Hence, knowledge must be reliable, and it is reliable if it is not chaotic but ordered according to the laws of logic. Pragmatic utility is not enough; knowledge consists of invariant order (Kraft 1968, 17).

The same pattern can be found in his argumentation for a realistic ontology. Kraft states that he does not intend to logically prove the claim for the external world but maintains that the hypothesis of an external world is able to explain any inter- and intrasensual regularity. Examples of intersensual regularities would be: Every time you are served your favourite Indian curry, you recognize its taste and smell; you recognize your cell phone every time it rings. The latter is an example for an intrasensual regularity. In later years Kraft (Kraft 1968, 19) alludes to the infant’s psychological development to stress this point. In earlier years the same point was made without referring to developmental psychology (compare Kraft 1912, 60, 98 174, 181, 183; Kraft 1960, 115). An analogous argument can be constructed concerning the assumption of “other minds” (Fremdseelische). This is an inference to the best explanation. It is, however, not sufficient to simply postulate any explanatory hypothesis; it is also necessary to deduce regular experiential statements from this hypothesis. Kraft claims that his realism has advantages over  positivism because it is a “richer” position: one is able to use it to explain any form of inter- and intrasensual regularity, whereas the positivist must see a sheer miracle in this regularity (compare Kraft 1912, 168). He claims that the assumption of the existence of the external world is a condition for explaining experiential regularity.

It should be noted that Kraft’s starting point is the concept of “everyday realism;” it therefore lost some power in light of modern microphysics. As a consequence, he later emphasizes the subject’s perception of well-known objects (Kraft 1960, 321 f), such as a measuring instrument’s needle.

Any argument against abductive reasoning can be raised against Kraft. The objection that Kraft’s argument begs the question is especially important here; he starts with a realist’s assumption and tries to explicate the very same assumption. The skeptic (or positivist) cannot be convinced theoretically, and therefore, Kraft relies on praxis. Here, he turns the tables; it is not the realist who has to justify his claim but the positivist because the latter violates our commonly accepted principles of abductive reasoning.

b. Philosophy of Science–Methodology

Kraft’s epistemology cannot be separated from his methodology; his aim is to explicate the epistemological assumptions of any human cognitive practice. Science especially must be emphasized here because it notably fulfills the epistemological requirements mentioned above. It is useful to discuss Kraft’s philosophy of science by asking four questions:

  1. What is a (scientific) theory for Kraft?
  2. Why, for Kraft, does any theory have mere hypothetical validity?
  3. How can the theory’s axioms be reached?
  4. How is a theory anchored in experience?

Question 1: What is a (scientific) theory for Kraft?

Kraft adheres to the classical notion of a theory as a “deductive system” (Kraft, 1925, 126; 1960, 369 f). Explanation is deduction from axioms (Kraft 1912, 175). This notion was elaborated by Carl Hempel (see Theories of Explanation, sect. 2).

Question 2: Why, for Kraft, does any theory have mere hypothetical validity?

The answer is simple. Any theory contains sentences of a general nature, for example, “All bodies fall to earth.” This generalization can only be regarded as a hypothesis because it does not follow logically from single instances of falling bodies (problem of induction). This classical, logical uncertainty is supplemented by pragmatic underdetermination. In short, if several aims or concepts of knowledge are possible, as we have seen, how can the correctness of the chosen one be established? Thus, the answers to the first two questions can be conveniently labeled “hypothetico-deductivism.”

Question 3: How can the theory’s axioms be reached?

To begin with, there is an important distinction to keep in mind: “axioms” is Kraft’s wording; today, one would use the term “hypotheses”. Kraft’s use of words is not modified here for expository reasons. He mentions several times that any deduction is only valid if the axioms are accepted. The axioms are not freely chosen but are accepted on the basis of whether they could fulfill an explanatory task (Kraft, 1925, 157; 1947, 96 f). Given this, a hypothetical system can be established rationally because Kraft argues that the “immanent order of experience” guides the postulation of the axioms (Kraft 1947, 96 f). He claims that this order is sought because it guarantees technical and theoretical control of experiential facts (Erlebnistatsachen). In other words, experience guides the postulation of axioms in an unambiguous manner.

Axioms are postulates. In any kind of scientific research, they are the product of scientific genius and intuition or scintillation. Therefore, they cannot be explained and analyzed further. On the other hand, those very axioms must fulfill a practical task, for example, the explanation of inter- and intrasensual regularities. Immediately the question arises of what explanation consists in, because any set of axioms which does not fulfill its explanatory task cannot be regarded as practically relevant. Consequently, if those axioms in question do not provide the logical starting point for an explanatory deduction of the above mentioned regularities, they must be dismissed as practically irrelevant. Logical deduction, according to Kraft, is the standard form of a (scientific) explanation and science provides knowledge. Therefore, in order to establish the fundamental axioms of any form of (scientific) knowledge, one must refer to a basic or embryonic notion of (scientific) knowledge. In a nutshell, in order to establish knowledge one must already have knowledge. Although Kraft is aware of this so called “circle of epistemology” (a claim made by the German philosopher Leonard Nelson early in 1911, compare Kraft, 1960, 1 ff) his solution is not satisfactory because a conventional fixation of the term in question must be either arbitrary, hence irrational – a solution which is rejected by Kraft – or guided by rational philosophical argumentation. If the latter is the case, one begs the question, assuming that “rationality” is explicated at least partly by (logical) consistency of the propositions in question. This remarkable tension is overlooked by Kraft. The charge of circularity lurks again under the surface of his argumentation because Kraft claims that the axioms are chosen in order to be empirically applicable. However, this is problematic because counter-instances are excluded, and the very idea of falsification of a theory becomes questionable. Experience would lose its power as a corrective instance.

Question 4: How is a theory anchored in experience?

Kraft is an empiricist; that is, he sees the basis of any knowledge-claim in experience. Its foundation lies not in a pure atomistic “sense-datum” or any sensualistic equivalent. Instead, the sense-datum is embedded in an experiential complex that consists of experiential relations (Wahrnehmungsbeziehungen). Moreover, experiential relations are interpreted as signs for external objects. As a consequence, statements about those “external objects” can be tested because any statement about a mind-independent object implies existential statements as logical consequences. Kraft claimed that there is isomorphism between the class of existential statements (implied by the assumption of a mind-independent object) and the experiential regularity. (If there is no table in my room, neither you nor I will be able to perceive it; I will not be able to perceive any intrasensual, intersensual or intersubjective regularity.)

Given tables, flowers and honey bees as ordinary objects, no problems will arise. However, what will happen if electrons, quarks or other highly theoretical entities enter the stage? The layman will perhaps see nothing and will not be able to construct any regularities. To be sure, one is able to learn to “see” those theoretical regularities, but once again, Kraft seems to dismiss the role of dissent in science. He establishes the concept of a “well-known object,” a class of objects about which no dissent might arise. Researcher Miller “sees” electrons, researcher Smith sees another theoretical entity, but both see a screen. (This is a corollary to the idea of the theory-ladenness of observation.) It should be kept in mind, that the term “theory-ladenness” can be understood in two ways (Heidelberger, 2003, 138 f). First, it is the notion that perception is based on expectations and beliefs, hence no “neutral” sense-data is given. Second, “theory-ladennes” is a semantical notion: every (scientific) term gets its meaning through a (scientific) theory. Kraft rejects the second notion, and adheres to the first one: It is a matter of fact that there are no “neutral” sense data. In his earlier years, however, he makes this point without explicitly referring to psychology but admits that the idea of an objective external world is a necessary prerequisite for any rational construction of knowledge.

To summarize, Kraft argued for the assumption of an external world in order to explain perceptual regularities. The empirical basis is equivalent to “experiential relations,” which implies the assumption of the external world. Only because of this is one able to formulate fertile predictions and exclude metaphysical or theistic (pseudo-)explanations. The most important criticism that can be raised against Kraft’s attempt is that it is circular: he argued abductively for realism in order to exclude any form of idealism, solipsism or positivism. This maneuver begins with perceived regularities that demand explanation; however, these very regularities are the basis for his empiricist philosophy of science. Kraft rejected any other (pseudo-)explanation of these regularities. He upholds realism as an inference to the best explanation, and in so doing, he was able to formulate a criterion for rejecting non-realistic interpretations of regularity. Hence, his ontology and philosophy of science are entangled, to say the least. This reveals once again that the postulation of axioms cannot be a free decision but is at least partly guided by meta-theoretical considerations and leads quite naturally to Kraft’s moral philosophy, especially because the concept of knowledge is regarded as a normative concept.

c. Philosophy of Geography as an Example of Kraft’s Philosophy of Science

Kraft was not only a philosopher; he was also trained in geography. He studied under Albrecht Penck, an outstanding geographer who specialized in physical geography and geomorphology. Penck was influenced by William Morris Davis, an American geographer famous for the “cycle of erosion,” an explicitly deductive theory of geomorphological change. It can be argued that Kraft developed his methodology in part as a result of his association with Penck.

1914 and fifteen years later (1929a), Kraft wrote introductory treatises for students of geography that focused on methodology. As a discipline, geography was (at least in German-speaking countries) in an uncertain state. Is geography a generalizing science or merely descriptive? Is its object the need to simply describe the earth’s surface or should it also tackle the laws governing the changes that take place there, for example as a result of erosion?

Kraft stresses that this “double dualism” is the reason for the not-yet-settled scientific status of geography. The following table illustrates these challenges:

The “double dualism” of geography according to Kraft
Dualism according the epistemological aim of geography (question of right) Dualism according the object of geography (the question of fact)
regional geography (Länderkunde) general geography (Allgemeine Geographie) for example, physical geography; earth’s surface as physical object for example, historical geography; earth’s surface as humankind’s home
Is the dualism bridgeable? No, because both aims are mutually exclusive. Yes, because both are mutually dependent.

In this conundrum, Kraft took a generally “nomothetical” stance. That is, scientific explanation is deducing singular statements from general laws. Even if the aim is descriptive, some universal laws must be presupposed because every scientific description works with concepts of type. However, this is not the whole story. Kraft sees in abductive inferences to universal laws an important task for general geography (Kraft 1929a, 14). His use of the term “induction” is ambiguous; “abductive” would fit much better, because he did not refer to a merely enumerative induction. Such an “inductive inference” therefore presupposes hypothetical assumptions (Kraft 1925, 250f); only then can universal laws be postulated. These hypotheses can in turn be tested by deducing predictions. To summarize, “induction is not more than postulating a hypotheses and is not an epistemological procedure (Erkenntnisverfahren) on its own” (Kraft 1960, 257).

Description is important too. Descriptive geography presupposes universal laws, whereas general geography presupposes scientific description. The result of Kraft’s analysis is that the more fundamental epistemological dualism in geography cannot be bridged because there are two different epistemological aims—generalizing and describing—that cannot be reduced. However, this chasm must not be regarded as an ontological gap. The praxis of geography illustrates that human and physical geography need each other.

Finally, Kraft mentioned a holistic approach that was in fashion during the 1920s. The idea was that a landscape (Landschaft) could be grasped intuitively, much like a work of art is apprehended. According to Kraft, this “third way” is not scientific because a “synthetic approach” lacks any criteria to rationalize the material. Both treaties had some impact. The first (1914) led to a short correspondence between Kraft and the eminent German geographer Alfred Hettner. Fred K. Schaefer used the latter (1929a) to support his critique of Richard Hartshorne, who followed Hettner in some respects.

The “Schaefer-Hartshorne Debate” was the central methodological controversy in geography in the 1950s (compare Martin 1989). It followed the nomothetic-idiographic debate and helped to clarify the scientific status of the study of geography. (Basically, it was the aftermath of the old nomothetic-idiographic controversy.) Kraft developed the idea that any special epistemological status for geography as a science cannot be argued for, which was a straightforward rejection of Hettner’s approach. This is not surprising given the main tenets of logical empiricism, but researchers tend to overlook that Kraft came to his conclusion by dwelling on the (Kantian) distinction between “questions of fact” and “questions of right”. As a methodologist, Kraft proposes a unitarian or non-dualistic approach, and as an epistemologist, he refers to different aims of geography; in his view, geography’s basic aims are either individualistic or generalizing. (For further reading, see Radler, 2008.)

Although Kraft’s analysis of geography is of rather special interest for students of (general) philosophy of science, one can show that Kraft’s basic ideas can also be found in his criticism of the Verstehen approach in the humanities (compare Kraft 1929b). An intuitive grasping of a text’s meaning is rejected by Kraft with the same arguments he proposed against the grasping of the “essence” of a landscape. Besides, in his analysis of the methodology of historiography Kraft makes remarkably clear that the former cannot proceed without some nomothetical laws. At least implicitly, the historians have to refer to causal laws or statistical regularities if they aim to explain the behavior of an historical individual or group. The same holds for the philologist who wants to classify a historical document.

d. Value Theory and Moral Philosophy

In his value theory and moral philosophy, Kraft distinguishes between (a) value concepts, (b) value judgments and (c) the rational justification of morals. His Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value contains an extensive chapter about the psychology of value judgment.

(a) Value concepts.

Kraft’s primary aim is conceptual clarification and analysis. For example, consider the following statement: “Lassie is a loyal and healthy dog.” The subject Lassie is the bearer of value (Wertträger)—a good. The example can be generalized: a loyal or healthy dog is a good, a bearer of value. The adjectives “loyal” and “healthy” in the statement are value predicates. “Loyalty” and “health” are, according to Kraft, values. Values are the intension (Bedeutungsgehalt) of a value concept. Hence, values designate a general relation to a range of things; a comrade, a friend or a partner can be loyal as well. Thus, the bearer of value may change. In a corollary analysis, Kraft shows that the value concept can be divided into two components. First, it can be divided into a factual component, and second, it can be divided into a normative component (Wertcharakter). (A similar distinction was later made by R. M. Hare.) What does this mean? Consider the value “loyalty.” A loyal friend, comrade or dog may have some factual traits in common. One might argue that a specific form of subservient and respectful behavior might be called “loyal”. These factual traits become more evident if one considers “technical norms;” for example, it is easy to explain what a good tool is. Finally, consider the value “beauty.” Its factual component can be described as a harmonic relationship of the parts of a whole and therein lies its beauty (compare Aesthetics, especially sect. 3). The normative component denotes the value character that, generally speaking, signifies a distinction (Auszeichnung). A loyal dog is preferred over a dog that is disobedient; a masterful painting is preferred over a smearing of paint on a train station’s wall. It is this normative, distinctive component that is essential for value concepts. A large part of Kraft’s analysis consists in describing psychological investigations, or how the subject acquired the value component psychologically.

Valuations do not consist, according to Kraft, in their relation to emotions. Emotions merely cause valuations. An attitude or disposition to these emotions must be added, a normative stance to these emotions must be taken. An analysis of valuation must consider this attitude or disposition but must not be exhausted in the inquiry into emotions or feelings. Therefore, an equation of valuation and emotional affection or disaffection is ruled out. Of course, psychological aspects and problems enter the stage immediately if one analyzes the normative stance to relational feelings or emotions. It becomes clear here that Kraft abandoned the notion of purely semantic and syntactical consideration. Based on his assumptions and his conception of philosophy, it is not possible to analyze valuation without including empirical findings.

(b) Value judgments.

The distinction (Auszeichnung), the essential component of a value concept, can be explained psychologically. Its acquisition is an individual process. However, this is irrelevant in normative considerations because moral philosophy cannot, according to Kraft, be reduced to the description of psychological processes. Value judgments must be impersonal (Kraft, 1981, 129 ff). Kraft distinguishes between value judgments as propositions concerning actual determination of attitudes and value judgments that can be described as imperatives. Value judgments as propositions about actual determination of attitudes would be labeled as descriptive ethics today. The problem is that such a position cannot guarantee objectivity, insofar as moral relativism is regarded as fact:

General human structure as such is not sufficient to determine valuations unequivocally, and given individual differences between evaluations, we cannot in principle exclude the possibility that the same aspect of the same object maybe appraised differently by different persons. (Kraft, 1981, 137).

Kraft therefore offers value judgments as imperatives, as “general guidelines” (Kraft, 1981, 138 ff).

(c) The rational justification of morals.

For this reason, the very problem is that given the empirical findings that guided Kraft’s analysis of values and value judgments, how it is possible to establish an objective (and not merely subjective) moral (compare Kraft 1981, 142 ff)? Is a form of moral relativism not the unavoidable consequence of Kraft’s analysis? From the 1940s on, Kraft began to confront this problem. His main contribution to practical philosophy is an explication of objective morality in a form of the following argument, which can be generalized by substituting “we” for “I” (see also Radler 2010):

I (we) have desires which I am (we are) eager to satisfy.
If I (we) accept morality, I (we) could satisfy my (our) desires.
I (we) accept morality.

Kraft asserts that due to general human organization (allgemein menschliche Organisation), some basic valuations must be valid in every culture (Kraft 1981, 173). In his last monograph, “basic human organization” is not the reference point but rather the (even more vague) concept of “culture”, which is important for an individual’s morality:

Culture is not solely a means to reach happiness, culture is the manner in which humans live. Therefore, culture has to be human’s highest aim, regardless of whether culture makes men happier or not. Humans can only seek to induce happiness through culture” (Kraft, 1968, 141).

Hence, “[culture] is the means, to devise one’s life. Therefore the imperative to guide one’s life through culture is categorical” (Kraft, 1968, 143).

From a social point of view, morality can, according to Kraft, only be instrumentally argued for. He regarded the imperatives of social morality as necessary conditions for reaching aims decreed by human nature.

Kraft was aware of the problems inherent in this kind of reasoning. First, in social morality, only “hypothetical imperatives” can be formulated. The crucial question is how to deal with the apparent plurality of aims and means. Second, it is doubtful whether the conditional sentence in the premises formulates a necessary and sufficient condition. Third, Kraft was criticized because this position is circular; an unspecified moral stance must be taken, and morality is only binding for those who already have accepted its binding force. Kraft is therefore not able to convince those who are “moral outsiders.” His work was an attempt to clarify the cryptic normative inclinations of moral individuals. Kraft’s approach resembles “natural law” positions.

3. Kraft’s Impact as a Philosopher

Looking back one can summarize Kraft’s philosophy as empirically informed (naturalistic), anti-inductivistic, anti-relativistic and – on the other hand – anti-dogmatic. In this way, he is an adherent of “scientific philosophy.” To be more precise, Kraft’s philosophy is remarkable in several aspects: First, “inferences to the best explanations” are scattered throughout the entirety of his work, from epistemology to moral philosophy. Second, Kraft formulates his arguments on the basis of specific empirical findings and a metaphysical (ontological) position. It has also become clear that ontology, epistemology, methodology, value theory and moral philosophy are entangled. At the very center of his philosophical ideas stands the notion that “knowledge” must be regarded as a normative concept. It is this understanding of philosophy, an adherence to prescriptions and not only formal reconstruction, which is central for Kraft.

His bearing on the philosophy of geography was already mentioned. Far more importance seems to be his influence on Karl Popper (compare Schramm 1992, 135f). Popper admits that Kraft can be regarded as a forerunner of his deductivism, however Kraft criticized Popper where the latter argues for a kind of platonistic metaphysics, that is his world 3 (Kraft 1976). Besides this, Kraft criticized Popper’s contribution to the so called “protocol sentence debate”. With his critique of Hugo Dingler, a proponent of conventionalism, Kraft influenced Hans Albert, the leading adherent of Critical Rationalism in Germany. Since the late twentieth century, Kraft’s impact on Paul Feyerabend has been under investigation. It is significant that under Kraft’s guidance a discussion circle of young students in the 1950s in Vienna was established. This circle provided Feyerabend the platform for discussing his PhD-thesis, which is basically a post-war prolongation of the “protocol sentence debate.” Perhaps the most important impact of Kraft’s thinking on Feyerabend is his later admission that philosophy (of science) is empirically informed but basically grounded on pragmatically chosen principles. (The problems of this point were discussed in section 2b above.)

4. References and Further Reading

Most works by Kraft have not been translated into English. The two exceptions are Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value (1981) and The Vienna Circle, the origin of neo-positivism; a chapter in the history of recent philosophy (1969). Kraft’s most important works are Erkenntnislehre (Theory of Knowledge) (1960) and Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden (The Basic Forms of Scientific Methods) (1925). The only secondary sources in English are Topitsch (1981), Stadler (2001, 159-161; 666-673) and the review by Feyerabend (1962/1963) of Kraft’s Erkenntnislehre (1960). Kainz (1976) is the standard and still unsurpassed reference to Kraft’s life. For a complete bibliography, see Stadler (2001, 667-671) or Frey (1975a and 1975b).

Readers who are familiar with German might consult the following references. Radler (2006, 2008, 2010) provides a historical reconstruction and philosophical analysis of Kraft’s philosophy, and Vollbrecht (2004) investigates his moral philosophy. Short and concise overviews are given by Rutte (1973), Frey (1975a and 1976b), Haller (1976) and Schramm (1992).
Stadler (2001, 522ff) describes Kraft’s difficulties with securing a professorship in the 1920s. Reininger (1938 [ed.]; compare Stadler, 2001, 158) provides an overview of the “Philosophical Society of the University of Vienna”. Feyerabend (1982, 108f) mentions the Forum Alpbach and Kraft as an important influence. The above mentioned traces of Kraft’s philosophy can – for example –  be found in Feyerabend (1958/1981, 34n; 1960/1999, 42; 1972/1999, 158n). Kraft’s modified Kantian argumentation becomes most visible in his early works (compare Kraft, 1904; 1912). Kraft’s papers on philosophy and methodology of geography are discussed in Radler (2008), where one can also find relevant details and references to secondary literature. Hacohen (2002, 236) describes Popper’s friendly relationship to Kraft. Radler (2006), Kuby (2010) and Stadler (2010) focus on his relationship to Popper and Feyerabend. Kraft’s criticism of Dingler and conventionalism can be found in (1947). Kraft discusses aspects of physicalism and phenomenalism in (1969), readers who are interested in the “protocol sentence debate” in general should compare Kraft’s reconstruction with Uebel (2007).

a. Selected Works by Kraft

  • Kraft, Victor (1904), “Das Problem der Aussenwelt.” In Archiv für Philosophie. II. Abt.: Archiv für systematische Philosophie, N.F. X, 269-313.
  • Kraft, Victor (1912), Weltbegriff und Erkenntnisbegriff. Eine erkenntnistheoretische Untersuchung. Leipzig: Johann Ambrosius Barth.
  • Kraft, Victor (1914), “Gegenstand, Aufgaben und Methoden der Geographie als Wissenschaft.” In O. Kende (ed.), Handbuch der geographischen Wissenschaften, 1st part. Berlin: Vossische Buchhandlung [= Sammlung wissenschaftlicher Handbücher für Studierende I], 1-8.
  • Kraft, Victor (1925), Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden. Vienna /Leipzig: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky A.-G. [= Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften, Philosophisch-historische Klasse 203, Abh. 3].
  • Kraft, Victor (1929a), “Die Geographie als Wissenschaft.” In F. Lampe (ed.) Enzyklopädie der Erdkunde, 1st part: Methodenlehre der Geographie. Leipzig / Vienna: Franz Deuticke: 1-22.
  • Kraft, Victor (1929b), “Intuitives Verstehen in der Geschichtswissenschaft.” In W. Bauer (ed.), Mitteilungen des Österreichischen Instituts für Geschichtsforschung, Suplementary Volume XI, Innsbruck: Universitäts-Verlag Wagner, 1-30.
  • Kraft, Victor (1940b), “Über Moralbegründung.” In Theoria 6, 191-226.
  • Kraft, Victor (1947), Mathematik, Logik und Erfahrung. Vienna: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1951/1937), Die Grundlagen einer wissenschaftlichen Wertlehre. 2nd ed. Vienna: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1955), “Der Wissenschaftscharakter der Erkenntnislehre.” In Actes du deuxième congrès international de l’union de philosophie des sciences. Neuchatel: Èditions du Griffon I, 85-94.
  • Kraft, Victor (1960), Erkenntnislehre. Vienna: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1967/1950), Einführung in die Philosophie. Philosophie, Weltanschauung, Wissenschaft. 2nd ed. Vienna / New York: Springer.
  • Kraft, Victor (1968), Die Grundlagen der Erkenntnis und der Moral. Berlin: Duncker & Humblot.
  • Kraft, Victor (1969), The Vienna Circle : the origin of neo-positivism ; a chapter in the history of recent philosophy. – Reprinted. – New York, NY: Greenwood Press.
  • Kraft, Victor (1973/1925), Die Grundformen der wissenschaftlichen Methoden, Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften [= Österreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften. Philosophisch-historische Klasse 284, Abh. 5]. 2nd ed. Vienna: Verl. d. Österreich. Akad. d. Wiss.
  • Kraft, Victor (1973a), “Konstruktiver Realismus.” In Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie 4, 313-322.
  • Kraft, Victor (1973b), “Gespräch mit Viktor Kraft.” In Conceptus, 7 (21-23), 9-25.
  • Kraft, Victor (1974), “Popper and the Vienna Circle.” In P. A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of Karl Popper [= Library of Living Philosophers XIV]. La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 185-205.
  • Kraft, Victor (1976), “Das Universalienproblem.” In B. Kanitscheider (ed.), Sprache und Erkenntnis. Festschrift für Gerhard Frey zum 60. Geburtstag. Innsbruck: Amoe, 33-36.
  • Kraft, Victor (1981), Foundations for a scientific analysis of value. Ed. by Henk L. Mulder. Transl. by Elizabeth Hughes Schneewind. With an introd. by Ernst Topitsch. Dordrecht, Holland [u.a.]: Reidel.
  • Kraft, Victor (1997/1951), Der Wiener Kreis. Der Ursprung des Neopositivismus. 3rd ed. Vienna / New York: Springer.

b. Quoted Literature and Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Feyerabend, Paul (1962/63), “Erkenntnislehre, By Viktor Kraft” [Review], In The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 8, 319-323.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1981/1958), “An attempt at a realistic interpretation of experience.” In P. K.  Feyerabend, Realism, rationalism and scientific method. Philosophical Papers. Vol. 1, Cambridge et al.: Cambridge University Press, 17-37.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1982), Science in Free Society. London: Verso.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1999/1960), “The problem of the existence of theoretical entities.” In P. K. Feyerabend, Knowledge, Science and Relativism. Philosophical Papers Vol. 3. Ed. by John Preston. Cambridge et al.: Cambridge University Press, 16-50.
  • Feyerabend, Paul (1999/1972), “On the limited validity of methodological rules.” In P. K. Feyerabend, Knowledge, Science and Relativism. Philosophical Papers Vol. 3. Ed. by John Preston. Cambridge et al.: Cambridge University Press, 138-181.
  • Frey, Gerhard (1975a), “Logik, Erfahrung und Norm. Zum Tode Victor Krafts.” In Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie 6, 1-6.
  • Frey, Gerhard (1975b), “Nachträge und Ergänzungen zur Bibliographie der Schriften von Victor Kraft.” In Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie 6, 179-181.
  • Hacohen, Malachi Haim (2000), Karl Popper – The Formative Years 1902-1945. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Haller, Rudolf (1976), “Nachruf auf Victor Kraft.” In Zeitschrift für philosophische Forschung 30, 618-622.
  • Heidelberger, Michael (2003), “Theory Ladennes and Scientific Instruments in Experimentation.” In Hans Radder (ed.), The Philosophy of Scientific Experimentation. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 138-151.
  • Heiß, Gernot (1993), “… wirkliche Möglichkeiten für eine nationalsozialistische Philosophie? Die Reorganisation der Philosophie (Psychologie und Pädagogik) in Wien 1938 bis 1940.” In Kurt R. Fischer & F, M. Wimmer (eds.), Der geistige Anschluß. Philosophie und Politik an der Universität Wien 1930-1950. Vienna: WUV-Universitätsverlag, 130-170.
  • Kainz, Friedrich (1976), “Viktor Kraft [Nachruf].” In Almanach für das Jahr 1975 [der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften], 519-557.
  • Kuby, Daniel (2010), “Rational zu sein war damals für uns eine Lebensfrage.” Studien zu Paul Feyerabends Wiener Lehrjahren. Diploma thesis, University of Vienna.
  • Martin, Geoffrey (1989), “The Nature of Geography and the Schaefer-Hartshorne Debate.” In J. N. Entrikin & S. D. Brunn (eds.), Reflections on Richard Hartshorne’s The Nature of Geography,Washington, DC: Assoc. of American Geographers 69-89.
  • Radler, Jan (2006), Victor Krafts konstruktiver Empirismus. Eine historische und philosphische Untersuchung. Berlin: Logos.
  • Radler, Jan (2008), “Victor Kraft und die Geographie.” In M.Fürst et al. (eds.), Analysen, Argumente, Ansätze. Beiträge zum 8. Internationalen Kongress der Österreichischen Gesellschaft für Philosophie in Graz, II. Frankfurt (Main): Ontos, 65-75.
  • Radler, Jan (2010), “Abduktive Argumentationsformen in Krafts Moraltheorie.” In A. Siegetsleitner (ed), Logischer Empirismus, Werte und Moral. Eine Neubewertung. Vienna / New York: Springer, 157-176.
  • Reininger, Robert (1938, ed.), “50 Jahre Philosophische Gesellschaft an der Universität Wien 1888-1938.” Vienna: Verlag der Philosophischen Gesellschaft an der Universität Wien.
  • Rutte, Heiner (1973), “VIKTOR KRAFT. Eine philosophische Standortbestimmung.” In Conceptus 7, 5-8.
  • Schramm, Alfred (1992), “Viktor Kraft: Konstruktiver Realismus.” In J. Speck (ed.), Die Grundprobleme der großen Philosophen. Philosophie der Neuzeit, VI (Tarski, Reichenbach, Kraft, Gödel, Neurath). Göttingen: Vandenhoek & Ruprecht, 110-137
  • Stadler, Friedrich (2001), The Vienna Circle. Studies in the Origins, Development, and Influence of Logical Empiricism. Wien / New York: Springer.
  • Stadler, Friedrich (2010), “Paul Feyerabend and the Forgotten ‘Third Vienna Circle’.” In F. Stadler (ed.), Vertreibung, Transformation und Rückkehr der Wissenschaftstheorie. Vienna /Berlin / Münster: Lit, 169-189.
  • Topitsch, Ernst (1981), “Introduction” In Victor Kraft, Foundations for a Scientific Analysis of Value, ed. by Henk Mulder. Dordrecht / Boston / London: Reidel [Vienna Circle Collection 15], xi-xvii.
  • Uebel, Thomas (2007), Empiricism at the Crossroads. The Vienna Circle’s Protocol-Sentence Debate. Chicago / La Salle, Ill.: Open Court.
  • Vollbrecht, Oliver (2004), Victor Kraft: rationale Normenbegründung und logischer Empirismus: eine philosophische Studie. Munich: Utz.

Author Information

Jan Radler
European University Viadrina Frankfurt (Oder)

Categories: Philosophers