It would be fair to say that there are few twentieth century thinkers who have had such a far-reaching influence on subsequent intellectual life in the humanities as Jacques Lacan. Lacan’s “return to the meaning of Freud” profoundly changed the institutional face of the psychoanalytic movement internationally. His seminars in the 1950s were one of the formative environments of the currency of philosophical ideas that dominated French letters in the 1960s and’70s, and which has come to be known in the Anglophone world as “post-structuralism.”
Both inside and outside of France, Lacan’s work has also been profoundly important in the fields of aesthetics, literary criticism and film theory. Through the work of Louis Pierre Althusser (and more lately Ernesto Laclau, Jannis Stavrokakis and Slavoj Zizek), Lacanian theory has also left its mark on political theory, and particularly the analysis of ideology and institutional reproduction.
This article seeks to outline something of the philosophical heritage and importance of Lacan’s theoretical work. After introducing Lacan, it focuses primarily on Lacan’s philosophical anthropology, philosophy of language, psychoanalysis and philosophy of ethics.
Jacques-Marie-Émile Lacan was born in Paris on April 13 1901 to a family of solid Catholic tradition, and was educated at a Jesuit school. After completing his baccalauréat he commenced studying medicine and later psychiatry. In 1927, Lacan commenced clinical training and began to work at psychiatric institutions, meeting and working with (amongst others) the famous psychiatrist Gaetan Gatian de Clerambault. His doctoral thesis, on paranoid psychosis, was passed in 1932. In 1934, he became a member of La Societe Psychoanalytique de Paris (SPP), and commenced an analysis lasting until the outbreak of the war. During the Nazi occupation of France, Lacan ceased all official professional activity in protest against those he called “the enemies of human kind.” Following the war, he rejoined the SPP, and it was in the post-war period that he rose to become a renowned and controversial figure in the international psychoanalytic community, eventually banned in 1962 from the International Psychoanalytic Association for his unorthodox views on the calling and practice of psychoanalysis. Lacan’s career as both a theoretician and practicioner did not end with this excommunication, however. In 1963, he founded L’Ecole Freudienne de Paris (EFP), a school devoted to the training of analysts and the practicing of psychoanalysis according to Lacanian stipulations. In 1980, having single-handedly dissolved the EFP, he then constituted the Ecole for “La Cause Freudienne,” saying: “It is up to you to be Lacanians if you wish; I am Freudian.” Lacan died in Paris on September 9, 1981.
Lacan’s first major theoretical publication was his piece “On the Mirror Stage as Formative of the I.” This piece originally appeared in 1936. Its publication was followed by an extended period wherein he published little. In 1949, though, it was re-presented to wider recognition. In 1953, on the back of the success of his Rome dissertation to the SPP on “The Function and Field of Speech in Psychoanalysis,” Lacan then inaugurated the seminar series that he was to continue to convene annually (albeit in different institutional guises) until his death. It was in this forum that he developed and ceaselessly revised the ideas with which his name has become associated. Although Lacan was famously ambivalent about publication, the seminars were transcribed by various of his followers, and several have been translated into English. Lacan published a selection of his most important essays in 1966 in the collection Ecrits. An abridged version of this text is available in an English-language edition (see References and Further Reading).
Lacan’s avowed theoretical intention, from at least 1953, was the attempt to reformalize what he termed “the Freudian field.” His substantial corpus of writings, speeches and seminars can be read as an attempt to unify and reground what are the four interlinking aspirations of Freud’s theoretical writings:
Lacan brought to this project, however, a keen knowledge of the latest developments in the human sciences, drawing especially on structuralist linguistics, the structural anthropology of Claude Levi-Strauss, topology, and game theory. Moreover, as Jacques Derrida has remarked, Lacan’s work is characterized by an engagement with modern philosophy (notably Descartes, Kant, Hegel, Heidegger and Sartre) unmatched by other psychoanalytic theorists, especially informed by his attendance at Andre Kojeve’s hugely influential Paris lectures on Hegel from 1933-1939.
Lacan’s article “The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I” (1936, 1949) lays out the parameters of a doctrine that he never foreswore, and which has subsequently become something of a post-structuralist mantra: namely, that human identity is “decentred.” The key observation of Lacan’s essay concerns the behaviour of infants between the ages of 6 and 18 months. At this age, Lacan notes, children become capable of recognizing their mirror image. This is not a dispassionate experience, either. It is a recognition that brings the child great pleasure. For Lacan, we can only explain this “jubilation” as a testimony to how, in the recognition of its mirror-image, the child is having its first anticipation of itself as a unified and separate individual. Before this time, Lacan contends (drawing on contemporary psychoanalytic observation), the child is little more than a “body in bits and pieces,” unable to clearly separate I and Other, and wholly dependant for its survival (for a length of time unique in the animal kingdom) upon its first nurturers.
The implications of this observation on the mirror stage, in Lacan’s reckoning, are far-reaching. They turn around the fact that, if it holds, then the genesis of individuals’ sense of individuation can in no way be held to issue from the “organic” or “natural” development of any inner wealth supposed to be innate within them. The I is an Other from the ground up, for Lacan (echoing and developing a conception of the ego already mapped out in Freud’s Ego and Id). The truth of this dictum, as Lacan comments in “Aggressivity and Psychoanalysis,” is evident in infantile transitivity: that phenomenon wherein one infant hit by another yet proclaims: “I hit him!” and visa-versa. It is more simply registered in the fact that it remains a permanent possibility of adult human experience for us to speak and think of ourselves in the second or third person. What is decisive in these phenomena, according to Lacan, is that the ego is at base an object: an artificial projection of subjective unity modelled on the visual images of objects and others that the individual confronts in the world. Identification with the ego, Lacan accordingly maintains, is what underlies the unavoidable component of aggressivity in human behaviour especially evident amongst infants, and which Freud recognised in his Three Essays on Sexuality when he stressed the primordial ambivalence of children towards their love object(s) (in the oral phase, to love is to devour; in the anal phase, it is to master or destroy…).
It is on the basis of this fundamental understanding of identity that Lacan maintained throughout his career that desire is the desire of the Other. What is meant by him in this formulation is not the triviality that humans desire others, when they sexually desire (an observation which is not universally true). Again developing Freud’s theorization of sexuality, Lacan’s contention is rather that what psychoanalysis reveals is that human-beings need to learn how and what to desire. Lacanian theory does not deny that infants are always born into the world with basic biological needs that need constant or periodic satisfaction. Lacan’s stress, however, is that, from a very early age, the child’s attempts to satisfy these needs become caught up in the dialectics of its exchanges with others. Because its sense of self is only ever garnered from identifying with the images of these others (or itself in the mirror, as a kind of other), Lacan argues that it demonstrably belongs to humans to desire—directly—as or through another or others. We get a sense of his meaning when we consider such social phenomena as fashion. As the squabbling of children more readily testifies, it is fully possible for an object to become desirable for individuals because they perceive that others desire it, such that when these others’ desire is withdrawn, the object also loses its allure.
Lacan articulates this decentring of desire when he contends that what has happened to the biological needs of the individual is that they have become inseparable from, and importantly subordinated to, the vicissitudes of its demand for the recognition and love of other people. Events as apparently “natural” as the passing or holding back of stool, he remarks in Ecrits, become episodes in the chronicle of the child’s relationship with its parents, expressive of its compliance or rebellion. A hungry child may even refuse to eat food if it perceives that this food is offered less as a token of love than one of its parents’ dissatisfaction or impatience.
In this light, Lacan’s important recourse to game theory also becomes explicable. For game theory involves precisely the attempt to formalize the possibilities available to individuals in situations where their decisions concerning their wants can in principle both affect and be affected by the decisions of others. As Lacan’s article in the Ecrits on the “Direction of the Treatment” spells out, he takes it that the analytic situation, as theorized by Freud around the notion of transference (see Part 2), is precisely such a situation. In that essay, Lacan focuses on the dream of the butcher’s wife in Freud’s Interpretation of Dreams. The said “butcher’s wife” thought that she had had a dream which was proof of the invalidity of Freud’s theory that dreams are always encoded wish-fulfillments. As Freud comments, however, this dream becomes explicable when one considers how, after a patient has entered into analysis, her wishes are constructed (at least in part) in relation to the perceived wishes of the analyst. In this case, at least one of the wishes expressed by the dream was the woman’s wish that Freud’s desire (for his theory to be correct) be thwarted. In the same way, Lacan details how the deeper unconscious wish expressed in the manifest content of the dream (which featured the woman attempting to stage a dinner party with only one piece of smoked salmon) can only be comprehended as the coded fulfilment of a desire that her husband would not fulfill her every wish, and leave her with an unsatisfied desire.
The principle that desire is the desire of the Other is also decisive in how Lacan reformulates Freud’s theory of the child’s socialisation through the resolution of its Oedipal complex in its fifth or sixth year. Lacan agrees with Freud that this event is decisive both in the development of the individual, and in the aetiology of any possible subsequent mental illness. However, in trying to understand this stage of subjective development, Lacan distances himself from Freud’s emphasis on the biological organ of the penis. Lacan talks instead of the phallus. What he is primarily referring to is what the child perceives it is that the mother desires. Because the child’s own desire is structured by its relationships with its first nurturer (usually in Western societies the mother), it is thus the desire of the mother, for Lacan, that is the decisive stake in what transpires with the Oedipus complex and its resolution. In its first years, Lacan contends, the child devotes itself to trying to fathom what it is that the mother desires, so that it can try to make itself the phallus for the mother- a fully satisfying love-object. At around the time of its fifth or sixth desire, however, the father will normally intervene in a way that lastingly thwarts this Oedipal aspiration. The ensuing renunciation of the aspiration to be the phallic Thing for the mother, and not any physical event or its threat, is what Lacan calls castration, and it is thus a function to which he thinks both boys and girls are normally submitted.
The child’s acceptance of its castration marks the resolution of its Oedipal complex, Lacan holds, again shadowing Freud. The Oedipal child remains committed to its project of trying to fathom and fulfil this desire. It accordingly (and famously) perceives the father as a rival and threat to its dearest aspirations. Because of this, in a maverick theoretical conjunction, Lacan indeed likens the father-child relation at this point (at least as it is perceived by the child) to the famous “struggle to the death for pure recognition” dramatized in Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit. In this struggle, of course, the child invariably loses. But everything turns, according to Lacanian theory, on whether this loss constitutes a violent humiliation for the child or whether, as in Hegel’s account of “Lordship and Bondage,” its resolution involves the founding of a pact between the parties, bound by the solemnification of mutually recognised Law.
If the castration complex is to normalize the child, Lacan argues, what the child must be made to perceive is that what satisfies or orders the desire of the mother is not any visible (imaginary) feature of the father (his obviously better physical endowments, and so on). The child must come to see that the whims of the mother are themselves ordered by a Law that exceeds and tames them. This law is what Lacan famously dubs the name (nom) of the father, trading on a felicitous homonymy in French between nom (name) and non (the “no!” to incestuous union). When the father intervenes, (at least when he is what Lacan calls the symbolic father) Lacan’s argument is that he does so less as a living enjoying individual than as the delegate and spokesperson of a body of social Law and convention that is also recognised by the mother, as a socialised being, to be decisive. This body of nomoi is what Lacan calls the big Other of the child’s given sociolinguistic community. Insofar as the force of its Law is what the child at castration perceives to be what moves the mother and gives the father’s words their “performative force” (Austin), Lacan also calls it the “phallic order.”
The Law of the father is in this way theorised by Lacan as the necessary mediator between the child and the mother. A castrating acceptance of its sovereignity precipitates the child out of its ambivalent attempts to be the fully satisfying Thing for the mother. As Lacan quips, when the child accedes to castration, it accedes to the impossibility of it directly satisfying its incestous wish. If things go well, however, it will go away with “title deeds in its pocket” that guarantee that, when the time comes (and if it plays by the rules), it can at least have a satisficing substitute for its first lost love-object. What has occurred, in this event, is that the individual’s imaginary identifications (or “ideal egos”) that exclusively characterised its infantile years have been supplemented by an identification of an entirely different order: what Lacan calls a symbolic identification with an “ego ideal.” This is precisely identification with and within something that cannot be seen, touched, devoured, or mastered: namely, the words, norms and directives of its given cultural collective. Symbolic identification is always idenification with a normatively circumscribed way of organising the social-intersubjective space within which the subject can take on its most lasting imaginary identifications: (For example, the hysterical-vulnerable female identifies at the symbolic level with the patriarchal way of structuring social relations between sexes, outside of which her imaginary identification would be meaningless).
So, to repeat and summarise: Lacan’s philosophical anthropology (his answer to the question: what is it to be human?) involves several important reformulations of Freudian tenets. By drawing on Hegel, game theory, and contemporary observations of infant behaviour, he lays greater systematic emphasis than Freud had on the intersubjective constitution of human desire. In this feature at least, his philosophical anthropology is united with that of philosophers such as Levinas, Honneth and Habermas. Equally, since for Lacan human desire is “the desire of the other,” what he contends is at stake in the child’s socialisation is its aspiration to be the fully satisfying object for the mother, a function which is finally (or at least norm-ally) fulfilled by the Law-bearing words of the father. Human-being, for Lacan, is thus (as decentred) vitally a speaking animal (what he calls a parle-etre); one whose desire comes to be “inmixed” with the imperatives of, and stipulated within, the natural language of its society. [see Part 2] Particularly, Lacan picks up on certain cues within Freud’s texts (and those of Saint Paul) to emphasise the dialectical structuration of human desire in relation to the prohibitions of Law. If the Law of the father denies immediate access to what the child takes to be the fully satisfying object (as expounded above), from this point on, Lacan argues, (at least neurotic) desire is necessarily articulated in the interstices of what is permitted by the big Other. And it is characterised by an innate and “fatal” attraction to what it prohibits as such, which is why he placed such central emphasis throughout his career on the enigmatic Freudian notion of a death drive.
Finally, it should be noted that, because of Lacan’s reformulations of several of Freud’s key notions, Lacan’s diagnostic heuristic differs markedly from Freud’s. For Lacan, what is decisive in understanding mental illness is not the conflict between the embattled ego and its two more “irrational” psychic bedfellows, the superego and the id. It is how the subject bears up with respect to the condition of being a castrated animal forced to pursue its desire on “the inverted ladder of the signifier,” within the phallic order of its society’s big Other. The question to be asked, for Lacan, is: how fully has the subject acceded to its symbolic castration?, and- as such- how fully has it overcome the transitivity and aggressivity characteristic of the earlier infantile stages of its development?
As in Freud, Lacan stipulates three major classes of mental illness, all of which are situated by him with respect to the terms of this question, and which (as such) are elevated by him to something like three existential bearings towards the condition of being a decentred socialised animal. According to the Lacanian conceptualization, the neurotic is someone who has submitted to castration, but not without remainder. His/her symptoms stand testimony to a lasting refusal of, and resentment towards, the castrating agency of the big Other. The pervert is someone who has only partially acceded to castration. For him/her, the Law does not function wholly to repress or render inaccessible what s/he deeply desires (the maternal body). Because of this, this Law comes itself (either in its prosecution, or in its sufferance) to function as the object of her/his desire. Finally, the psychotic is someone who has never acceded (or been drawn to accede) to the symbolic order of social interchange bound by the name of the father. For him/her, this order of the big Other, in which people follow the Law “because it is the Law” can thus only ever appear to be a semblance. As is most clear in the delusions of paranoiacs, s/he will thus permanently be prey to the delusion that there must be some “Other of the big Other” (for example: aliens, the CIA, God) behind the scenes, pulling the strings of the social charade.
The component of Lacanian theory for which it is perhaps most famous, and which has most baffled its critics, is the emphasis Lacan laid on language in his attempt to formalize psychoanalysis. From the 1950s, in complete opposition to any Jungian or romantic conceptions, Lacan instead described the unconscious as a kind of discourse: the discourse of the Other.
There are at least three interrelated concerns that inform the construction of what one might call Lacan’s “philosophy of language.” The first is the central argument that the child’s castration is the decisive point in its becoming a speaking subject. The second is his taking very seriously what might be termed the “interpretive paradigm” in Freud’s texts, according to which Freud repeatedly described symptoms, slips and dreams as symbolic phenomena capable of interpretation. -The third is Lacan’s desire to try to understand the efficacy of psychoanalytic interpretation as a curative procedure that relies solely on what Freud called in The Question of Lay Analysis the “magical” power of the word.
In Part 1, in recounting Lacan’s view on the resolution of the Oedipal complex, one reason why Lacan allocated language such importance was touched upon. For Lacan, it is only when the child accedes to castration and the Law of the father, that s/he becomes fully competent as a language-speaker within his/her given social collective. By contrast, individuals suffering from psychosis, Lacan stresses (in line with a vast wealth of psychological research), are prone to characteristic linguistic dysfunctions and inabilities. Already from this, then, we can outline a first crucial feature of Lacan’s “philosophy of language.” Like the later Wittgenstein, Lacan’s position is that to learn a language is to learn a set of rules or laws for the use and combination of words. Accordingly, for him too, “learning is based on believing” (Wittgenstein). Particularly, Lacan asserts a lasting link between the capacity of subjects to perceive the world as a set of discrete identifiable objects, and their acceptance of the unconditional authority of a body of convention. We will return to this below.
Lacan’s contention concerning human-being as a parle-etre, put most broadly, is that when the subject learns its mother tongue, everything from its sense of how the world is, to the way it experiences its biological body, are over-determined by its accession to this order of language. This is the clearest register of the debt that Lacan owes to phenomenology. From Heidegger, he accepts the notion that to be a subject is to experience the world as a meaningful totality, and that language is crucial to this capability. Aligning Freud with the theories of Merleau-Ponty and Sartre, Lacan developed a psychoanalytic conception of how the body is caught in the play of meaning-formation between subjects, and expressive of the subjectivity that “lives” through it, as well as being an objectificable tool for the performance of instrumental activities. For Lacan, that is, “the unconscious” does not name only some other part of the mental apparatus than consciousness. It names all that about a subject, including bodily manifestations and identifications with others and “external” objects that insist beyond his/her conscious control.
Freud had already commented in the Introductory Lectures to Psychoanalysis that the unconscious can be compared to a language without a grammar. Lacan, using structuralist linguistics, attempted to systematize this contention, arguing that the unconscious is structured like a language, and that “it speaks”/ca parle. A symptom, Lacan (for example) claimed, is to be read as a kind of embodied corporeal metaphor. As Freud had argued, he takes it that what is at stake within a symptom is a repressed desire abhorrent to the consciously accepted self-conception and values of the subject. This desire, if it is to gain satisfaction at all, accordingly needs to be expressed indirectly. For example, a residual infantile desire to masturbate may find satisfaction indirectly in a compulsive ritual the subject feels compelled to repeat.
Just as one might metaphorically describe one’s love as a rose, Lacan argues, here we have a repressed desire being metaphorically expressed in some apparently dissimilar bodily activity. Equally, drawing on certain moments within Freud’s papers “On the Psychology of Love,” Lacan argues that desire is structured as a metonymy. In metonymy, one designates a whole object (for example, a car) by naming one part of it (for example: “a set of wheels”). Lacan’s argument is that, equally, since castration denies subjects full access to their first love object (the mother), their choice of subsequent love objects is the choice of a series of objects that each resemble in part the lost object (perhaps they have the same hair, or look at him/her the same way the mother did …). According to Lacan, the unconscious uses the multivalent resources of the natural language into which the subject has been inducted (what he calls “the battery of the signifier”) to give indirect vent to the desires that the subject cannot consciously avow.
Lacan’s Freudian argument is that a directly comparable process occurs in formations of the unconscious as in jokes. As Freud detailed in Jokes and Their Relation to the Unconscious, the “punch line” of jokes pack their punch by condensing in one statement, or even one word, two chains of meaning. The first of these is what the previous words and cues of the joke, and our shared norms for interpretation, lead us to expect. The second is a wholly different chain of associations, whose clash with what we had expected produces our sense of amusement. In the same way, Lacan observed that, for example, when an analysand makes a “slip of the tongue,” what has taken place is that the unconscious has employed such means as homonymy, the merging of two words, the forgetting or mispronunciation of certain words, or a slippage of pronoun or tense, etc., to intimate a whole chain of associations which the subject did not intend, but through which his unconscious desire is given indirect expression.
Lacan argues that what the consideration of jokes, symptoms and slips thus shows are a number of features of how it is that human beings form sense in language. The first thing is that the sentence is the absolutely basal unit of meaning. Before a sentence ends, Lacan notes, the sense of each individual word or signifier is uncertain. It is only when the sentence is completed that their sense is fixed, or—as Lacan variously put it—”quilted.” Before this time, they are what he calls “floating signifiers,” like to the leading premises of a joke.
The sense of this position can be easily demonstrated. One need only begin a sentence by proffering a subject, but then cease speaking before a verb and/or predicate is assigned to this in accordance with linguistic convention. For example, if I say: “when I was young I…” or “it’s not like…,” my interlocutor will be understandably want to know what it is that I mean. At the end of the sentence, by contrast, the sense of the beginning words becomes clear, as when I finish the first of the above utterances by saying “when I was young I ran a lot,” or whatever.
This understanding of sentences as the basic unit of sense, and of how it is that signifiers “float” until any given sentence is finished, is what informs Lacan’s emphasis on the future anterior tense. Sense, he argues, is always something that “will have been.” It is anticipated but not confirmed, when we hear uttered the beginning of a sentence (see transference below). Or else, at sentence’s end, it is something that we now see with the benefit of “twenty twenty hindsight” to have been intended all along. This is why, in Seminar I, Lacan even quips that the meaning of symptoms do not come from the past, but from the future. Before the work of interpretation, a symptom is a floating signifier, whose meaning is unclear to the analysand, and also to the analyst. As the analytic work proceeds, however, an interpretation is achieved at some later time that casts the whole behavior into relief in a wholly different light, and makes its sense clear.
Lacan’s emphasis on language is also over-determined by an elementary recollection that, if Freud’s intervention promised anything, it is that speaking with another person in strictly controlled circumstances can be a curative experience for people suffering from forms of mental illness. The analysand comes to the analyst with his troubling symptoms, and the analyst, at certain decisive points, offers interpretations of these behaviors that retrospectively make their meaning clear. And this is not simply an intellectual exercise. As Freud stressed, there is knowledge of the unconscious, and then there is knowledge that has effects upon it. A successful psychoanalytic interpretation is one that has effects even upon the biological reality of the body, changing the subject’s bearing towards the world, and dissolving his/her symptoms.
The need to explain this power of words and language is a clear and lasting motive behind Lacan’s understanding of language. His central and basal hypothesis concerning it can be stated in the following way. In a symptom, as we saw above, an unconscious desire seeks to make itself manifest. The symptom is recounted to the analyst, or else repeated in the way the subject responds to the analyst in the sessions. Then an interpretation is offered by the analyst, which recognizes or symbolizes the force of the desire at work in the symptom, and the symptom disappears. So here the recognition of a desire at the same time satisfies the desire. What this can accordingly only mean is that the unconscious desire given voice in the symptom is itself, from the start, at least in part a desire for recognition. This is an absolutely central Lacanian insight, wherein he again shows the influence of Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit upon his most central concepts. It synchronizes exactly with the philosophical anthropology recounted above, and Lacan’s stricture concerning how human desire is always caught up in the dialectics of individuals’ exchanges with others.
But, for Lacan, it also shows something vital about the language in or as which the subjects’ repressed desires are trying to find a vent. This is that language is above all a social pact. As Lacan wrote in the Ecrits: “As a rule everyone knows that others will remain, like himself, inaccessible to the constraints of reason, outside an acceptance in principle of a rule of debate that does not come into force without an explicit or implicit agreement as to what is called its basis, which is almost always tantamount to an anticipated agreement to what is at stake… I shall expect nothing therefore of these rules except the good faith of the Other, and, as a last resort, will make use of them, if I think fit or if I am forced to, only to amuse bad faith…” (Lacan, 2001: 154-155). Lacan’s idea is that to speak is to presuppose a body a conventions that ensue that, even if my immediate auditor doesn’t “get it,” the true meaning of what I wish to convey always will emerge, and be registered in some “Other” place. (Note that here is another meaning of the big Other touched upon in Part 1. The big Other is the place, tribunal, collective or single person which we presuppose will register the truth of what we say, whenever we speak.)
This is why Lacan’s philosophy of language is to be read in strong opposition to any philosophical account (whether Lockean, descriptivist or phenomenological) which argues that meaning is formed prior to the communicative act. Lacan defines speech as a process in which the subjects get their meanings back from the Other in an inverted form. Think once more of what is involved in psychoanalytic interpretation. Here the meaning of a symptom is rendered by the analyst. What this means, for Lacan, is that the symptom not only bears upon the subject’s past relations to others. If it can be dissolved by an Other’s interpretation, this is because it is formed with an eye to this interpretation from the start. To quote Slavoj Zizek on this Lacanian notion of how the symptom is from the start addressed to an Other supposed to know its truth: “The symptom arises where the world failed, where the circuit of symbolic communication was broken: it is a kind of “prolongation of communication by other means’”: the failed, repressed word articulates itself in a coded, ciphered form.
The implication of this is that the symptom can not only be interpreted but is, so to speak, formed with an eye to its interpretation … in the psychoanalytic cure the symptom is always addressed to the analyst, it is an appeal to him to deliver its hidden message … This … is the basic point: in its very constitution, the symptom implies the field of the big Other as consistent, complete, because its very formation is an appeal to the Other which contains its meaning …” (Zizek, 1989: 73). Even the key meaning of transference, for Lacan, is this supposition that there is an Other supposed to know the truth of my communicative acts, even down to the most apparently meaningless “slips” and symptomatic behaviours. In terms of the previous section, transference is the condition of possibility for the quilting of the meaning of floating signifiers that occurs even in the most basic sentences, as we saw. What occurs in a psychoanalytic interpretation is simply one more consequential version of this process. The subject, by speaking, addresses himself to some Other supposed to know her/his truth, and at the end of this process, the signifiers he offers to the Other are quilted, and return to him “in an inverted form.”
What has occurred at this point, on Lacan’s reckoning, is that the previously unquilted signifiers finding voice in the manifestations of his unconscious are integrated into the subject’s symbolic universe: the way s/he understands the world, in the terms of his/her community’s natural language. They have been subjectivised; which means that now s/he can recognise them as not wholly alien intrusions into his/her identity, but an integral part of this identity. Lacan’s stress is thus always, when he talks of psychoanalytic interpretation, that this interpretation does not add new content to the subject’s self-understanding, so much as affect the form of this understanding. An interpretation, that is, realigns the way the s/he sees her past, reordering the signifiers in which his/her self-understanding has come to be ordered. A crucial Lacanian category in theorising this process is that of the “master signifier.” Master signifiers are those signifiers to which a subject’s identity are most intimately bound. Standard examples are words like “Australian,” “democrat,” “decency,” “genuineness.” They are words which will typically be proffered by subjects as naming something like what Kant would have called ends in themselves. They designate values and ideals that the subject will be unwilling and unable to question without pulling the semantic carpet from beneath their own feet.
Lacan’s understanding of how these “master signifiers” function is a multi-layered one, as we shall see in more detail in Part 3. It is certainly true to say, though, that the importance of these signifiers comes from how a subject’s identification with them commits them to certain orderings of all the rest of the signifiers. For example, if someone identifies himself as a “communist,” the meanings of a whole array of other signifiers are ordered in quite different ways than for someone who thinks of himself as a “liberal.” “Freedom” for him comes to mean “freedom from the exploitative practices enshrined in capitalism and hidden beneath liberal ideological rhetoric.” “Democracy” comes to mean “the dictatorship of the proletariat.” “Equality” comes to mean something like “what ensues once the sham of the capitalist “equal right to trade” is unmasked.”
What Lacan argues is involved in the psychoanalytic process, then, is the elevation of new “master signifiers” which enable the subject to reorder their sense of themselves and of their relations to others. Previously, for example, a person may have identified with a conception of “decency” that has led him to repress aspects of his own libidinal makeup, which then return in neurotic symptoms. What analysis will properly lead him to do is identify himself with a different set of “master signifiers,” which re-signify the signifiers he had unconsciously been addressing to the Other in his symptoms, reducing their traumatic charge by integrating them into his symbolic (self-)understanding.
Whereas Freud never systematically spoke on the ethics of psychoanalysis, Lacan devoted his pivotal seventh seminar (in 1959-1960) to precisely this topic. Seminar VII: The Ethics of Psychoanalysis goes to some lengths to stress that the position on ethics Lacan is concerned to develop is concerned solely with the clinical practice of psychoanalysis. Its central topic, in line with what we examined in Part 1 concerning the intersubjective structuration of subjective desire and identity, is the desire of the analyst as that Other addressed by the patient and implicated in the way s/he structures his/her desire through the transference. Nevertheless, it remains that Lacan develops his position through explicit engagement with Aristotle‘s Nichomachean Ethics, as well as Kant’s practical writings, and the texts of Marquis de Sade. Moreover, Lacan’s ethics accord with his metapsychological premises, examined in Section 2, and his theorization of language, examined in Section 3.
In this Section 4, accordingly, we will see Lacan’s understanding of ethics as a sophisticated position that, disavowals notwithstanding, can be read as a consistent post-Kantian philosophy of ethics. Section 4 is divided into three sub-sections. The first two develop further Lacan’s metapsychological and philosophical tenets. The first sub-section involves a further elaboration of the Lacanian conception of the “master signifiers.” The second sub-section involves an exposition of Lacan’s notion of the “fundamental fantasy.” The final sub-section then examines Lacan’s later notion of “traversing the fantasy” as the basis of his ethical position.
As I stated at the end of Part 2, Lacan assigns great importance in his theorization of the psychoanalytic process to what he calls “master signifiers.” These are those signifiers that the subject most deeply identifies with, and which accordingly have a key role in the way s/he gives meaning to the world. As was stressed, Lacan’s idea about these signifiers is that their primary importance is less any positive content that they add to the subject’s field of symbolic sense. It is rather the efficacy they have in reorienting the subject with respect to all of the other signifiers which structure his/her sense of herself and the world. It is precisely this primarily structural or formal function that underlies the crucial Lacanian claim that master signifiers are actually “empty signifiers” or “signifiers without a signified.”
As with all of Lacan’s key formulations, the notion that the master signifiers are “signifiers without signified” is a complex one. Even the key idea is the following. The concept or referent (or both) signified by any “master signifier” will always be something impossible for any one individual to fully comprehend. For example, “Australian-ness” would seem to be what is aimed at when someone proffers the self-identification: “I am an Australian.” The Lacanian question here is: what is “Australian” being used by the subject to designate here? Is “Australian-ness” something that inheres in everyone who is born in Australia? Or is it a characteristic that is passed on through the medium of culture primarily? Does it, perhaps, name most deeply some virtues or qualities of character all Australians supposedly have? However, even if we take it that all “Australians” share some basic virtues, which are these? Can a closed list everyone would agree upon be feasibly drawn up? Is it not easy to think of other peoples who share in valuing each individual trait we standardly call “Australian” (for example: courage, disrespect for pomposity)? And, since “Australian” would seem to have to aim at a singular entity, not a collection, or else some grounding quality of character that could perhaps unite all of the others, which is this? And is this “essential” quality- again- simply biological, perhaps genetic, or is it metaphysical, or what?
What Lacan’s account of “master signifiers” thus emphasizes is the gap between two things. The first is our initial certainty about the nature of such an apparently obvious thing as “Australian-ness.” (We may even get vexed when asked by someone). The second thing is the difficulty that we have of putting this certainty into words, or naming something that would correspond to the “essence” of “Australian-ness,” beneath all the different appearances.
What Lacan indeed argues, in line with his emphasis on the decentred self, is that our ongoing and usually unquestioning use of these words represents another clear case of how the construction of sense depends on the transferential supposition of “Others supposed to know.” Though we ourselves can never simply state what “Australian-ness,” etc. is, that is, Lacan argues that what is nevertheless efficient in generating our belief in (and identification with) this elusive “thing” is a conviction that nevertheless other people certainly know its nature, or seem to. Just as we desire through the Other, for this reason Lacanian theory also maintains that belief is always belief through an Other. (For example, in the Christian religion, priests would be the designated Others supposed to know the meaning of the Christian mystery vouchsafing believers’ faith.)
At this point, it is appropriate to recall from Part 1 Lacan’s thesis that castration marks the point wherein the child is made to renounce its aspiration to be the phallic Thing for the mother. A subject’s castration amounts at base, for Lacan, to the acceptance that it is the injunctions of the father- and through his name the conventions of the big Other of society- that govern the desire of the mother. The “master signifiers” are also what Lacan calls phallic signifiers. The reason is exactly that- despite the difficulty of locating any simple referent for them- they nevertheless are the words that seem to intimate to subjects what “really matters” about human existence. While no Christian believer may know what “God” is, nevertheless s/he will be in no doubt of the transcendent importance of whatever It is that this word names.
Lacan thus is drawing together his philosophical anthropology and his theorization of language when he defends the position that it is the consequence of “castration” that subjects are debarred from immediate knowledge of what it is that the “phallic signifiers” signify. He is also arguing, in the psychoanalytic field, a position profoundly akin to the Kantian postulation that finite human subjects are debarred from immediate access to things in themselves. Lacan’s argument is that it is this lost “signified,” which would as it were be “more real” than the other things that the subject can readily signify, that is what is primordially repressed when the subject accedes to becoming a speaking subject at castration. When the subject accedes to the symbolic, he repeats, the Real of aspired-to incestuous union, and the sexualized transgressive enjoyment or jouissance it would afford, is necessarily debarred.
If the neurotic subject does not to forego the Oedipal supposition that there is some Thing that would fully satisfy the desire of the mother, it is because s/he constructs fantasies about the nature of this lost Thing, and how s/he stands towards it. The primary means s/he deploys in this process is what we recounted above, when we noted how the difficulty in knowing the referent of the phallic master signifiers obliges subjects to construct their beliefs concerning it in a “decentred” manner, through the Others. While the subject accepts that the Real phallic Thing is lost to him/her, that is, in his/her fantasmatic life s/he yet supposes that there are Others who do know what it is that phallic signifiers refer to, and have more direct access to the Real of jousissance. In line with this, Lacan’s further argument is indeed that the deepest fantasmatic postulation of subjects is always that the Real Phallic Thing that s/he has been debarred from must be held in reserve by the “big Other” whose law it is that discernibly structures the mother’s desire.
What follows from this is the position that the manifestations of the unconscious represent small unconscious rebellions of subjects against the losses that they take themselves to have endured when they acceded to socialization. They are all under-girded by the more basic fantasmatic structuration of identity as constituted by the loss endured at castration. This is why Lacan talks of a fundamental fantasy, and argues that it is above all this fundamental fantasy that is at stake in psychoanalysis.
Lacan strived to formalize the invariant structure of this “fundamental fantasy” in the matheme: $ a. This matheme indicates that: “$,” the “barred” subject which is divided by castration between attraction to and repulsion from the Object of its unconscious desire, is correlative to (”) the fantasised lost object. This object, designated in the matheme as “a,” is called by Lacan the “object petit a,” or else the object cause of desire. Lacan holds that the subject always stabilizes its position with respect to the Real Thing by constructing a fantasy about how the debarred Thing is held in the big Other, manifesting only in a series of metonymic or partial objects (the gaze or voice of his/her love objects, a hair style, or some other “little piece of the Real”) that can be enjoyed as compensation for its primordial loss of the maternal Thing.
Lacan’s argument is that the fundamental psychological “gain” from the fundamental fantasy is the following. The fundamental fantasy represents what occurred at castration in the terms of a narrative of possession and loss. This fantasm thus consoles the subject by positing that s/he at one point did have the phallic Thing, but that then, at castration, it was taken away from him/her by the Other. What this of course means is that, since the Thing was taken away from the subject, perhaps also It can be regained by him/her. It is this promise, Lacan maintains, that usually structures neurotic human desire. What the fantasy serves to hide from the subject, then, is the possibility that a fully satisfying sexual relationship with the mother, or any metonymic substitute for her, is not only prohibited, but was never possible anyway. As I recounted in Part 1, the Lacanian view, which is informed by observation of infantile behavior, is that the mother-child relationship before castration is not Edenic, but characterized by imaginary transitivity and aggressivity.
This is why Lacan quips in Seminar XX that “there is no such thing as a sexual relationship” and elsewhere that the “Woman,” with a capital “W,” “does not exist.” Note then that the deepest logic of castration, according to Lacan, is a profoundly paradoxical one. The “no!” of the father prohibits something that is impossible. Its very prohibition, however, gives rise in the subject to the fantasmatic supposition that the Thing in question is one that is attainable but only being debarred. Lacan thus asserts that the fundamental fantasy is there to veil from the subject the terminal nature of its loss at castration. This is not simply a speculation, however. It is supported by telling evidences that he adduces.
The key point that supports Lacan’s position is the stipulation the objet petit is an anamorphotic object. What this means can be seen by looking at even the most well-known exemplar of the Lacanian objet petit a: the “object gaze.” Contrary to how it is sometimes read, the Lacanian “gaze” is anything but the intrusive and masterful male gaze on the world. For Lacan, gaze is indeed a “blind spot” in the subject’s perception of visible reality, “disturbing its transparent visibility” (Zizek, 1999a: 79). What it bears witness to is the subject’s inability to fully frame the objects that appear within his/her field of vision. The classic example of the object-gaze from Lacan’s Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis is the floating skull at the feet of Holbein’s Ambassadors. What is singular about this “thing” is that it can literally only be seen from “awry,” and at the cost that the rest of the picture appears at that moment out of focus. From this point on the canvas, Lacan comments, it is as if the painting regards us. What he means is that the skull reminds us that we, and with us our desires and fantasies, are implicated in how the scene appears.
Here then is another meaning to $ a: the objet petit a, for Lacan, as something that can only operate its fascination upon individuals who bear a partial perspective upon it, is that object that “re-presents” the subject within the world of objects that it takes itself to be a wholly “external” perspective upon. If a subject thus happens upon it too directly, it disappears, or else—as in psychosis and the well-known filmic motif of what happens when one encounter one’s double—the cost is that one’s usual sense of how the rest of the world is must dissipate. What this indicates is that the object petit a, or at least the fascinating effect the object which bears it has upon the subject who is under its thrall, has no “objective” reality independently of this subject. The logical consequence of this, though, as Lacan stipulates, is that this supposedly “lost” object can never really have been lost by the subject, since s/he can never have possessed it in the first place. This is why Lacan argues the apparently chimerical position that the objet petit a is by definition an object that has come into being in being lost.
Lacan argues that the subject is “the subject of the signifier.” One meaning of this claim at least is that there is no subject proper that is not a speaking subject, who has been subject to castration and the law of the father. I shall return to this formulation below, though, for its full meaning only becomes evident when another crucial claim that Lacan makes concerning the subject is properly examined. This is the apparently contradictory claim that the subject as such, at the same time as being a linguistic subject, lacks a signifier. There is no subject without language, Lacan wants to say, and yet the subject constitutively lacks a place in language.
At the broadest level, in this claim Lacan is simply restating in the language of structuralist linguistics a claim already made by Sartre, and before him Kojeve and Hegel (and arguably Kant). This is the claim that the subject is not an object capable of being adequately named within a natural language, like other objects can be (“table,” “chair,” or so on). It is no-thing. One of the clearest points of influence of Kojeve’s Heideggerian Hegelianism on Lacan is the emphasis he places on the subject as correlative to a lack of being (manqué-a-etre/want-to-be), especially in the 1950′s. Lacan articulates his position concerning the subject by way of a fundamental distinction between the ego or “moi“/”me” and the subject intimated by the shifter “je“/”I.” The subject is a split subject, Lacan claims, not only insofar as—Freud dixit—it has consciousness and an unconscious.
When Lacan says the subject is split, he means also that, as a subject of language, it will always evince the following two levels. The first is the ego, or subject of the enunciated. This is the self wherein the subject perceives/anticipates its imaginary unity. Since the ego is an object, according to Lacan, it is capable of being predicated about like any other object. I can say of myself more or less truthfully that “I am fat,” or “honest,” or anything else. What my enunciated sentence will speak about in these cases, for Lacan, is my ego.
But this is to be distinguished from a second “level” of subjectivity: the subject of the enunciation. Here as elsewhere, Lacan’s position turns around his philosophy of language examined in detail in Part 2. The distinction between the subject of the enunciation and the subject of the enunciated follows from Lacan’s understanding of what “speech-act” theorists like Austin or John Searle would call the “performative dimension” to language. Speech-act theorists emphasise that the words of given speech-acts are never enunciated in a vacuum. They are always uttered in a certain context, between language speakers. And through the utterances, subjects effectively do things (hence Austin’s title How to Do Things With Words). This is particularly evident in cases like commands or promises. When I make a promise (say: I promise I’ll meet you at 5:15) I do not primarily make a claim about an existing state of affairs. It is what I have done that matters. What I have done is make a pledge to meet you at some future time.
Lacan’s key argument, alongside that of Austin here, is that all linguistic acts have two important dimensions. The first is what Austin would call the constative dimension. Lacan calls this the level of what is enunciated. Words aim to express or represent factual states of affairs in the world. The second is the performative dimension, that Lacan calls the “level of the enunciation.” The subject of the unconscious is the subject of the enunciation, Lacan insists. This is one way he expresses the elementary Freudian hypothesis that, in symptoms and parapraxes, the subject says more than s/he intended to say. What s/he intended will usually be captured in the explicit content of what s/he has enunciated. Nevertheless, in his/her body language, or in a second chain of signification indicated by her/his mispronunciation (etc.), something other than what s/he intended will be conveyed to the analyst. This second chain of signification as it were “happens”- it is performed for the “Other supposed to know” before it can be explicitly and consciously enunciated by the speaking individual.
Lacan’s distinction between the subject of the enunciated and the subject of the enunciated can be exposed further through examining his treatment of the liar paradox. This is the paradox of someone saying: “I am a liar.” The paradox is that, if we suppose the proposition true (“person x is a liar”), we at the same time then have no reason to believe he is telling the truth when he says: “I am a liar.” As a liar, he can only be lying when he says this. But what this means is that we must suppose that he is a sincere truth-telling person. Lacan argues that this is a paradox only insofar as we have wrongly collapsed the distinction between the subject enunciated in the sentence, and the subject of the enunciation. A better understanding of the meaning of this utterance can be garnered by presenting the speech-act in both its two dimensions, as a case wherein (to formalize): person x says: “I am a liar.” The point is that the “I” in the spoken sentence here is what Lacan calls “the subject of the enunciated.” Of this ego, it may (or may not) be true that s/he is a liar. Yet, this ego is in no way to be identified with what we have called “person x” in the above formalization. “Person x” here is not the subject spoken about. S/he is the person speaking. And Lacan’s point is that it this subject of the enunciation that addresses itself to the Other supposed to know in analysis, despite whatever egoic plays and ploys the analysand might masquerade before his/her analyst in what s/he enunciates. The hysteric, Lacan thus says, is someone who tells the truth about his/her desire (at the level of enunciation) in the guise of lying or at least being indifferent to the factual truths of which she speaks (at the level of the enunciated). The obsessional, by contrast, lies or dissembles the truth of his/her involvement in what s/he speaks about (at the level of enunciation) in the guise of always telling the truth (at the level of what s/he enunciates).
Lacan’s position is that, when subjects wish to speak about themselves, the subject of enunciation is always either anticipated- at the beginning of the speech-act; or else missed- at the end of the speech-act, whence it has come to be falsely identified with the ego. In line with his prioritization of the future anterior, he comments that the subject always “will have been.” In philosophical terms, we can say that the Lacanian subject is a presupposition of any speech-act (someone will always be speaking), yet impossible to fill out with any substantial content.
It is for this reason that Slavoj Zizek has recently drawn a parallel between it and Kant’s unity of apperception in The Critique of Pure Reason. Lacan himself, in his seminar on the logic of fantasy, strove to articulate his meaning by a revision of Descartes’ famous cogito ergo sum: “I am not where I think.” The key to this formulation is the opposition between thinking and being. Lacan is saying that, at the point of my thought and speech (the subject of enunciation), there I have no substantial being that could be known. Equally, “I am not where I think” draws out the necessary misapprehension of the nature of the subject in what s/he enunciates. If Lacan’s subject thus seems a direct psychoanalytic restatement of Sartre/Kojeve’s position, however, it needs to be read in conjunction with his doctrines concerning the “master signifier” and the “fundamental fantasy.” Lacan says that master signifiers “represent the subject for other signifiers.”
Given his identification of the subject with a lack of being, a first register of this remark becomes clear. The master signifiers, as examined above, have no particular enunciated content or signified, according to Lacan. But the Lacanian position is precisely that this lack of enunciated content is correlative to the subject. In this way, his theorisation of the subject depends not only on a phenomenological analysis, as (for example) Sartre’s does in Being and Nothingness. If the subject is the subject “of the lack of the signifier,” Lacan means not only that it cannot be objectified at the point of its thinking, as I examined above. The subject is—directly—something that emerges at the point of- and because of- a lack in the field of signification, on his reckoning. This was already intimated above, in the section on the “logics of the fantasy,” which recounted Lacan’s position concerning how it is that subjects develop regimes of fantasy concerning what Others are supposed to know in order to ground their own belief in, and identification with, the master signifiers. The point to be emphasised now is that these master signifiers, if they are to function, cannot do without this subjective investment of fantasy. Lacan’s famous claim there is no metalanguage is meant to imply only this: that there is no field of sense that can be “quilted,” and attain to a semblance of consistency, unless subjects have invested their partial, biased perspective upon that field.
This is even the final and most difficult register to what Lacan aimed to express in the matheme: $ a. As we saw in Part 3, ii., the subject is correlative to the fantasmatically posed lost object/referent of the master signifiers. We can now state a further level of what Lacan implied in this matheme, though. This is that in fantasy what subjects misrecognize is not simply the non-existence of the incestuous-maternal Thing. What subjects primordially repress is the necessity of subjects’ implication in the play of signification that has over-determined the symbolic coordinates of their lives. The archetypal neurotic subject-position, Lacan notes, is one of victimization. It is the Others who have sinned, and not the subject. S/he has only suffered.
What is of course occluded by these considerations (which may be right or wrong from a moral or legal perspective) is how the subject has invested him/herself in the events of his/her life. Firstly, there is the fantasmatic investment of the subject in the “Others supposed to enjoy,” who are supposed not to have been made to undergo the castrating losses that s/he has undergone. As Lacan reads Freud’s later postulation of the superego, this psychical agency is constructed around residual fantasies of the Oedipal father supposed to have access to the sovereign jouissance of the mother’s body denied to the child. Secondly, what is occluded is what Freud already theorised when he spoke of subjects’ adaption to and “gain” from their illness, as a way of organising their access to jouissance in defiance of the demands of the big Other. Even if the subject has undergone the most frightful trauma, Lacan argues, what matters is how this trauma has come to be signified subsequently and retrospectively by the subject around the fundamental fantasy. S/he must be made to avow that the subject-position they have taken up towards their life is something that they have subjectified, and have an ongoing stake in.
This is why, in Seminar II, Lacan quips that the injunction of psychoanalysis is mange ton dasein!- eat your existence! He means that at the close of the analysis, the subject should come to internalise and so surpass the way that it has so far organised your life and relations to Others. It is this point, accordingly, that the ethics of Lacanian psychoanalysis is announced. Lacan’s name for what occurs at the end of the cure is traversing the fantasy. But since what the fantasy does, for Lacan, is veil from the subject his/her own implication in and responsibility for how s/he experiences the world, to traverse the fantasy is to reavow subjective responsibility. To traverse the fantasy, Lacan theorizes, is to cease positing that the Other has taken the “lost” object of desire. It is to accept that this object is something posited by oneself as a means to compensate for the experienced trauma of castration. One comes to accept that castration is not an event with a winner (the father) and a loser (the subject), but a structurally necessary factum for human-beings as such, to which all speaking subjects have been subjected. What equally follows is the giving up of the resentful and acquisitive project of trying to reclaim the objet petit a from the Other, and “settling the scores.”
This gives way to an identification with the place of this object that is at once within the fabric of the world, and yet which stands out from it. (Note that this is one Lacanian reading of “where It was, there I shall be”). The subject who has traversed the fantasy, for Lacan, is the subject who has not ceded on its desire. This desire is no longer fixed by the coordinates of the fundamental fantasy. S/he is able to accept that the fully satisfying sexual object, that which would fulfil the sovereign desire of the mother, does not exist. S/he is thus equally open to accepting that the big Other, and/or any concrete Other supposed by the subject to be its authoritive representative(s), does not have what s/he has “lost.” Lacan puts this by saying that what the subject can now avow is that the Other does not Exist: that it, too, lacks, and what it does and wants depends upon the interventions of the subject. The subject is, finally, able to thereby accept that what it took to be its place in the order of the Other is not a finally fixed thing. It can now avow without reserve that it is a lacking subject, or, as Lacan will also say, a subject of desire, but that the metonymic sliding of this desire has no final term. Rather than being ceaselessly caught in the lure of the object-cause of desire, this desire is now free to circle around on itself, as it were, and desire only itself, in what is a point of strange final proximity between Lacan and the Nietzcheanism he scarcely ever mentioned in his works.
University of Melbourne
Last updated: June 27, 2005 | Originally published: