A prominent salonnière in the France of Louis XIV and the Regency, Madame de Lambert authored numerous essays dealing with philosophical issues. Her most famous works, twin sets of instructions to her son and daughter, analyze the virtues to be cultivated by each gender in the aristocracy. Men pursue glory while women focus on humility. During the literary querelle de la femme, Lambert defends the dignity of women against misogynist stereotypes advanced by opponents of gender equality. In her political writings, she criticizes the vices typical of the hierarchical society of the period, especially the unequal distribution of material goods. The era’s distortion of friendship and mistreatment of the elderly also receive critical scrutiny. Her religious philosophy leans toward the God of deism: a Supreme Being who should be honored for the works of creation but whose attributes do not transcend the categories of human reason. Several works in aesthetics treat the subjective problem of taste and sensibility. Throughout her writings, Lambert manifests her allegiance to a Cartesian understanding of the nature of philosophical analysis. The French Enlightenment recognized the philosophical value of her works, most of which were published posthumously. Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire are the most prominent of the Enlightenment thinkers who lauded the philosophical acumen of Lambert.
On September 25, 1647, Anne-Thérèse Marguenat de Courcelles was born in Paris to a provincial aristocratic family from the region of Troyes. Both the paternal and maternal sides of the family had acquired substantial wealth from commercial transactions. An administrator in the Chambre des Comptes, her father Étienne died on May 22, 1650. Her mother Monique Passart then secretly married François Le Coigneux, seigneur de la Roche Turpin et de Bachaumont. Anne-Thérèse received formal instruction at the convent of the Annonciades in Meulan, but it was her stepfather who cultivated the young Ann-Thérèse’s philosophical opinions. A respected poet and memorialist, Bachamount introduced his stepdaughter to the neo-Epicurean philosophy he espoused in his writings. He guided her study of the classics and helped to shape her limpid writing style in French.
On February 22, 1666, Anne-Thérèse married Henri de Lambert, marquis de Saint-Bris en Auxerrois, baron de Chitry et Augy. Henceforth, she will be addressed as Marquise de Lambert or simply Madame de Lambert. Descended from a provincial aristocratic family in Perigord, Henri de Lambert was a military officer who at the time of the marriage served as the captain of the First Company of the Royal Regiment of the Cavalry. The marriage produced four children, one of whom died shortly after birth.
On June 12, 1684, Henri de Lambert reached the pinnacle of his political career when he was named governor of the duchy of Luxembourg. He died suddenly on August 1, 1686. His death was quickly followed by the death of their eleven-year old daughter, Monique. The bereaved Madame de Lambert faced imminent impoverishment since she was locked in a lawsuit with her mother over the estate of her deceased father. Estimated at over five-hundred thousand pounds in worth, the estate had been left entirely to Madame de Lambert’s mother by virtue of a will signed by her father. The bitter adjudication of the will and the conflicting claims of mother and daughter did not end even with the mother’s death in 1692. A royal pension permitted Madame de Lambert to survive and her two remaining children to pursue their education until the juridical controversy was settled largely in Lambert’s favor in the late 1690s.
In 1698 an economically secure Madame de Lambert opened her new residence in the Hôtel de Nevers in Paris. Starting in 1710, she conducted a salon in the drawing room of her residence; it soon became the most intellectually distinguished salon in the capital. She became noted for her contrasting “Tuesday” and “Wednesday” salons. Tuesdays were devoted to men and women of letters. Participants were expected to read aloud their works in progress and to debate the literary issues of the moment. Wednesdays were devoted to more social receptions for the aristocracy living in the capital.
Prominent salon members included the philosophers Fontenelle and Montesquieu, the dramatist Marivaux, the classicist Anne Dacier, the poet Catherine Bernard, the theologian Fénelon, the tale-writer Marie-Catherine d’Aulnoy, and the mathematician Dortous de Mairan. The intellectual distinction of Lambert’s salon earned it the sobriquet of bureau d’esprit (the business office of wit.) The salon also earned a reputation as a place of literary intrigue, especially for lobbying for positions in the prestigious Académie française. Lambert herself was credited with successfully lobbying for the appointment of Montesquieu from her “antechamber to the Académie.” Although Lambert banned political and religious discussions from the salon sessions, her salon enjoyed a mildly libertine reputation. She defended Montesquieu’s controversial Persian Letters, censured for its alleged religious skepticism, and supported Antoine Houdar de la Motte’s attacks on the neoclassical veneration of Homer and of the three unities in drama.
In the salon Madame Lambert shared her own writings with her guests. Her early works were moral exhortations to her son and daughter respectively as they entered adulthood. Later writings dealt with friendship, old age, and aesthetics. Her writings were usually written in the form of a brief essay, modeled after her beloved Montaigne, and often incorporated the miniature literary genres then popular in the salons: maxim, literary portrait, literary dialogue, edifying tale. Madame Lambert’s writings were written uniquely for diffusion in manuscript copies to members of her salon. When a pirated edition of her Counsels of a Mother to her Son appeared in print in 1726, she vehemently protested and bought out what remained of the edition. Publication of a book for public sale in the bookstalls of France was considered inappropriate for an aristocratic woman of the period; furthermore, the intimate details of family life revealed in these essays addressed to her children were not meant to be shared with the general public. Despite Lambert’s protests, pirated print editions of her essays continued to sell briskly and quickly led to unauthorized translations into English.
Although her salon continued to flourish, the last years of Lambert’s life were darkened by the death of her daughter Monique-Thérèse in 1731 and by recurrent bouts of illness. Madame de Lambert died on July 12, 1733.
The works of Madame de Lambert attracted a broad European public from the time of the first pirated editions published during her lifetime: Counsels of a Mother to her Son (1726), New Reflections on Women (1727), and Counsels of a Mother to Her Editor (1728). Her collected works enjoyed numerous editions throughout the eighteenth century (1747, 1748, 1750, 1751, 1758, 1761, 1766, 1774, 1785). The English translation of her collected works enjoyed similar popularity in multiple editions (1749, 1756, 1769, 1770, 1781). A German translation of the works appeared in 1750, a Spanish edition in 1781.
Most of Lambert’s extant works are written in the form of a brief essay, with occasional exercises in literary dialogue and literary portraiture. The following works treat philosophical issues. Counsels of a Mother to her Son analyzes the moral virtues an aristocratic man must develop; Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter examines the moral virtues essential for the aristocratic woman. Treatise on Friendship studies the power and difficulty of ethical friendship. Treatise on Old Age laments the neglect of the elderly in contemporary society. Reflections on Wealth decries materialism. Reflections on Taste and Discourse on the Delicacy of Mind and of Sentiment examine aesthetic judgment. Psyche analyzes the nature of the human soul. Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes criticizes the false glory represented by warriors such as Alexander the Great.
The philosophical influences on Lambert are not difficult to identify. Since her childhood, Lambert carefully noted striking phrases from her reading. In many of her writings, she uses quotations to justify her argument. Two groups of thinkers predominate. The first are classical authors with a marked Stoic orientation: Plutarch, Seneca, Marcus Aurelius, and Cicero. The second are contemporary French authors often considered moralistes, because of their exploration of moral psychology, especially the deceptions of the human mind. Prominent in this second group are Montaigne, La Rochefoucauld, La Bruyère, Pascal, Fénelon and Saint-Evremond. So frequent is Lambert’s use of quotation that some critics have dismissed her writings as a tissue of paraphrases. But Lambert transforms her sources to accommodate her own concerns, notably her concern about the status of women. Lambert cites Cicero’s dissertation on old age but her own essay contains considerations on the impoverishment of aging women that are absent in Cicero. Similarly, the marquise admits the debt of her Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter to Fénelon’s Education of Girls but nowhere does Fénelon develop the argument for the philosophical education of women which Lambert pursues in her own text.
Madame Lambert’s writings focus on philosophical themes that preoccupied the more intellectual Parisian salons of the period. In her discussion of the virtues, she makes careful distinctions on the various types of moral virtue, with particular interest in the aristocratic virtue of glory. Like other salonnières, she analyzes the gradations of love and constructs an apology for chaste, intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex. Lambert’s interest in pedagogy springs from the conviction that formation in virtue constitutes the chief purpose of education. Despite her loyalty to the French throne, she criticizes the social injustices of French society, especially its unequal distribution of material wealth, and condemns what she considers the major vices of her own social class. Her philosophical reflections on art focus primarily on the subjective issue of aesthetic appreciation, notably taste and delicacy. A practicing Catholic, she develops a religious philosophy more attuned to the emerging deism of the period. God is the Supreme Being affirmed by rational reflection on the cosmos rather than the personal redeemer known through revelation and grace. Relatively secondary, the virtues of religion are assimilated to the more generic moral virtues of moderation, prudence, and integrity. Lambert’s works develop a gendered philosophy not only because they defend the dignity of women against the misogyny of the period, but because they treat such issues as friendship, education, and old age through the lens of gender differentiation.
Lambert’s intertwined theories of virtue and education emerge in her two most popular works, Counsels of a Mother to her Son and Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter. In both works, Lambert exhorts her children to grow in virtue as they leave adolescence and begin the commitments of adulthood. She praises the moral habits they have already acquired through their earlier formal education and advises them on the moral dispositions they must obtain in the future. But the virtues central for men are not the same as those vital for women. Like other men, especially those of the nobility destined for military service, her son must pursue glory and its associated public virtues. Like other women, destined primarily for household duties, her daughter should cultivate the more hidden virtues clustered around humility.
For men, the acquisition of the virtue of glory constitutes their highest aspiration. According to Lambert, society has rightly named military valor as the chief title to this virtue. “The glory of heroes is the most brilliant. True marks of honor and acclaim are attached to it. Renown seems personally designed for these men.” In pursuing such glory, men must refuse to limit their ambition through a constraining personal modesty. In fact, such ambition is necessary for gentlemen pursuing glory as long as they refrain from unfair attacks on their enemies or rivals. Lambert conceives the virtue of glory as central to political as well as personal masculine development. Political order is founded on a social contract using the aspiration to glory as a guarantor of civic cohesion. “Men found that it was necessary and useful for them to unite together for the sake of the common good. They made laws to punish the evil. They agreed among themselves what constituted the basic duties of society and attached the idea of glory to the proper practice of these duties.”
The pursuit of grandeur in the military and broader civic forum requires men to develop other social virtues. Like other salonnières of the period, Lambert emphasizes the virtue of honesty (honnêteté), a personal integrity that permits the gentleman to witness the needs of others and to serve them without excessive preoccupation. “If you want to be a perfectly honest man, consider disciplining your self-love and give it a good object. Honesty consists in emptying oneself of focusing on one’s own rights and in respecting the rights of others.” Unlike true glory, with its attendant concern for others, false glory encourages self-gratification and ignores the misery of the other. “Why is it that in this infinite number of desires fabricated by voluptuousness and indulgence one never finds the desire to provide relief for the unfortunate? Doesn’t simple humanity make one feel the need to aid one’s fellow humans? Moral hearts feel more greatly the obligation to do good than they do the other necessities of life.” For Lambert, the cultivation of this altruistic honesty naturally entails the pursuit of other similarly discreet social virtues: politeness, tact, delicacy, and wisdom. Such honesty preserves the gentleman from the typical moral vices of the courtier: envy and avarice.
Unlike men, women are not called to cultivate the social virtues proper to the political sphere; they should develop virtues more appropriate to the domestic sphere of the household. “Women are not called to partake in visible and brilliant virtues; rather, they pursue simple and quiet virtues.” Glory, the central virtue of men, has no role in the retired life of women. “The virtues of women are difficult because glory does not help to practice them. These virtues are hidden: living with oneself; limiting one’s government to one’s family; being simple, just, and modest.” Among other virtues of self-effacement, women are called to pursue humility and temperance. Like the opposite sex, women must cultivate the virtues of honesty and politeness, but their participation in the civic sphere remains more circumscribed than that assigned by Lambert to men.
Despite this limitation of female moral culture to the province of the household, Lambert argues that women must develop a substantial set of intellectual virtues. She insists that women should maintain an intellectual curiosity that leads to a lifetime of learning. “Curiosity is knowledge that has already begun; it will make one go faster and further in the path of truth. It is a natural inclination which goes beyond formal instruction. It must not be stopped by sloth or soft living.” The educational program commended by Lambert for her daughter indicates the substantial intellectual culture Lambert considers desirable for aristocratic women. The program includes the study of Greek, Roman, and French history; the study of ethics through the writings of Cicero and Pliny; the study of literature, especially the tragedies of Corneille; and the study of Latin. Lambert adds a Cartesian note to this ambitious neoclassical curriculum by her approval of the study of philosophy. “[I commend] especially the new sort [of philosophy], if one is capable of it; it will cultivate precision in one’s mind, clarify one’s thoughts, and teach one to think correctly.” This apology for serious intellectual, specifically philosophical, formation for women is allied to the critique of the neglect of women’s education with which she opens Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter. “Throughout time we have neglected the education of women; we only paid attention to that of men. We acted as if women were a different kind of species. We abandoned them to themselves without any assistance and without the slightest consideration that they constitute half of the world.”
Despite this gendered differentiation in the treatment of the moral virtues, men and women are summoned to develop one virtue in common: the capacity to live by oneself and to rely on one’s own rational judgment. This neo-Stoic ability to find interior rational peace is the key to mature happiness for both sexes. Counsels of a Mother to her Son describes this virtue as “the happiness of knowing how to live with oneself, to find oneself with pleasure, to leave oneself with regret.” In Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter, Lambert exhorts her daughter to “learn that the greatest science is to know how to be alone with yourself….Provide yourself with an interior place of retreat or asylum. There you can always return to yourself and find yourself.” In this contemplative self-possession, wherein the passions are subordinated to reason, both men and women discover the interior resources to combat the vicissitudes of existence, especially of reversal of fortune.
In New Reflections On Women, Lambert provides an apology for the dignity and rights of women. The essay criticizes the misogyny which has denied women a proper education. “Can’t women say to men, ‘What right do you have to forbid us to study the sciences and fine arts? Haven’t women who have devoted themselves to these disciplines produced both sublime and useful objects?’” As contemporary examples of such success, the essay cites Madame de la Sablière, an astronomer, and the many recent women novelists. Lambert laments the decline of the salons which had earlier contributed to the artistic and philosophical formation of women. “In other times there were houses where it was permitted to speak and to think, where the Muses held company with the Graces….These houses were like the Banquet of Plato.” The social constitution which reduces women to inferiors and denies them the possibility of scientific culture does not reflect nature or rights; it is simply a corporate act of violence by men to retain their supremacy and to maintain the domestic services of women without appropriate compensation. “By force rather than by natural right, men have usurped authority over women.” The period’s art, notably Molière’s parody of the précieuses in Women Scholars, conspires to persuade women that their legal subjection and exclusion from serious education is a product of nature rather than of culpable oppression.
Despite her critique of the period’s subjection of women, Lambert accepts the common argument that the difference between the genders is psychological and not only biological. In particular, she accepts the argument advanced by Malebranche that women have a more active faculty of imagination than do men. But whereas Malebranche and others had drawn the conclusion that this hyperactive imagination prevents women from exercising reason (and concomitantly from governing others), Lambert draws the opposite conclusion. The essay claims that women’s natural vivacity of imagination and sentiment actually perfects the operations of reason. Rather than being the antagonist of reason, imagination incites reason to undertake great projects and makes the fruits of reasoning more persuasive to the public. “I do not think that sentiment weakens the mind; on the contrary, it provides new spiritual powers which illuminate the mind. It makes the ideas present in the mind livelier, clearer, and more distinct….Persuasion of the heart is higher than that of the mind alone because our conduct often depends on the former. It is to our imagination and to our heart that nature has committed the conduct of our actions and of its motives.” Rather than being inferior to men, women appear to possess a certain mental superiority. The success of ancient and contemporary women in the arts and sciences indicates that they are as capable as are men in pursuing intellectual activities. Only social prejudice, expressed through the denial of appropriate education, explains the comparative paucity of women who have distinguished themselves in these fields. The alleged greater attachment of women to the exercise of the imagination and of the sentiments in their decision-making only indicates that in an atmosphere free of gender prejudice women will exercise reason with a greater complement of imagery and of passion than do most men.
In several works, Lambert focuses on the central issue of salon debate: the nature of love. She insists on the moral qualities necessary for authentic love and decries the descent into sexual debauchery that has characterized several prominent salons of the Regency. The chaste love of mature friendship is both more desirable and more difficult to attain than is the passion-based love of romance. Intellectual love between adults of the opposite sex constitutes the apex of this ideal moral friendship.
New Reflections on Women defines love as the central sentiment of human life. Due to its interiority and its power, love enjoys a primacy among human sentiments. “The difference between love and other pleasures is easy to detect for those who have been touched by it. In order to be felt, most pleasures require the presence of the proper external object. Music, cuisine, and theater are examples of pleasures that must have their immediate object in order to make their impressions, to call the soul to them and to hold the soul attentive….It is not the same with love. It is within us, it is a part of ourselves. It does not only exist in tandem with its corresponding object; we can experience love without the presence of the object.” The superiority of love over other desires springs from the capacity of its sentiments to dominate the moral agent even in the absence of the beloved other person. Memory and imagination deepen the force of a sentimental state that can captivate the human subject on the basis of fantasy alone.
Despite Lambert’s correlation of love with pleasure, Treatise on Friendship underscores that the highest form of love is disinterested friendship among peers rather than romantic affection. Such mature friendship is based on virtue rather than passion. “The first merit we must seek in our friends is virtue. This is what assures us that they are capable and worthy of friendship. We should expect nothing from our relationships which lack this foundation.” Focused on the needs of the other, authentic friendship frees one from self-preoccupation and encourages altruistic service of the beloved. “Friendship is a relationship, a contract, or a type of reciprocal commitment where one demands nothing, where the most worthy person gives more than is expected and is happy to do so in advance. One shares one’s fortune with one’s friend: wealth, credit, concern, services, everything except one’s honor.” Only in this virtuous friendship is the human person freed from the calculation of conquest and approval which characterizes most interpersonal affection.
Departing from its classical precedents, Treatise on Friendship argues that such a virtuous, altruistic friendship is not limited to peers of the same sex. Chaste, intellectual friendship between members of the opposite sex constitutes the highest embodiment of such a meritorious relationship since it demands strict discipline of one’s personal passions. “They ask if friendship can endure among members of different sex. Although it is rare and difficult, this is the most delightful of friendships. It is the most difficult because it requires more virtue and more restraint.” At its apogee in altruistic friendship, the sentiment of love is so thoroughly refined by the rational will that the passions can no longer distort it.
Like other moralistes of the period, Lambert criticizes the injustices of French society. Economic inequality constitutes one of the principal injustices of this highly stratified society. Avarice constitutes the major vice of an aristocracy transformed into avid courtiers.
Reflections on Wealth describes the rapacious efforts to acquire material wealth as a distortion of the human quest for happiness. Whereas human beings can only find authentic happiness in the intellectual and moral goods of the soul, the social elite seeks an illusory happiness in the amassment of ever-increasing fortunes. Such wealth may procure social approval and temporary pleasure, but the illusory nature of this unstable pleasure inevitably manifests itself. “Riches are vain in their use and insatiable in their possession of us. They are vain because of the false idea they give of themselves. This idea is founded not on our real being but on our imaginary being. Everything surrounding those favored with wealth serves their illusions.” This illusion magnifies the egocentrism of a humanity marked by the fall. Other people, even the earth itself (with its deposits of precious metals), become objects which exist to be exploited by and to adorn an aristocracy poisoned by avarice.
Despite its moral tares, this human avidity possesses a certain public utility. The desire to be admired for one’s wealth-related grandeur drives many of the wealthy to provide a material assistance toward the poor which they would not otherwise give. “Nothing is so great and nothing gives us such an illustrious position in the imagination of others as does the contribution of our wealth to the public weal. Making one’s wealth flow to so many unfortunates is to give them a new type of existence which pulls them out of their desperate state.” Like many social thinkers of the eighteenth-century, Lambert identifies material self-interest as the motor of public philanthropy.
Lambert’s critique of the intolerable lot of the poor in contemporary French society becomes explicitly gendered in her Treatise of Old Age. It is women who bear the brunt of the material impoverishment and psychological isolation of old age. “Throughout their lives, we have given men all the assistance necessary to perfect their reason and to teach them the great science of happiness. Cicero composed a treatise on old age to help them draw benefits from an age where everything seems to leave us. We do this work only for men. For women in all ages, on the contrary, we simply abandon them to themselves. We neglect their education in their youth. During the rest of their lives, we deprive them of the support they need for their old age. As a result, the majority of women live without care and without the ability to reflect on their state. In their youth they are vain and dissipated; in their old age, frail and disheveled.” It is the deprivation of education, especially of the methodical formation of reason and of the capacity for personal reflection, which provokes the material and psychological impoverishment of women, once their romantic and maternal utility has vanished. The result of neither nature nor accident, this impoverishment of aging women reflects the gender imbalance of a society centered around the needs of men.
Lambert’s writings exhibit the nascent deism of the period. Although she repeatedly praises the virtue of piety, Lambert accords religious virtues a palpably secondary role in the constellation of moral virtues she commends to her readers. Religion provides a cornerstone for the moral virtues the human person must cultivate, but the deity presiding over this religious theology is the deist Supreme Being rather than the biblical God of redemption and grace.
The deistic character of Lambert’s religious philosophy appears clearly in her Counsels of a Mother to her Son. Although she insists that the greatest duty of the son is to “render worship to the Supreme Being,” this religious sentiment is markedly constricted. The purpose of religion is to inspire the moral agent to fulfill his or her duties. Prayer is an occasion to compare oneself with the moral order God has manifested in the cosmos. “Moral virtues are in danger without the Christian ones. I do not ask from you a piety full of weaknesses and superstition; I only ask that a love of moral order would submit to God your inclinations and your sentiments and that the same love of order would spill over on your conduct. That will give you justice and the presence of justice will guarantee the existence of all the virtues.” Religion is instrumentalized as an efficacious tool of moral formation and motivation. Communion with God is based not on grace but on rational scrutiny of one’s conformity to the moral order detectable in nature. It is the natural virtue of justice, and not the supernatural virtues of faith, hope, and charity, which constitutes the apex of the moral virtues fostered by an enlightened religiosity shorn of irrationality and superstition.
The religious virtue praised by Lambert is generic in nature. Respect for religion entails respect for the particular religion established by the sovereign of the state. “One does not attack religion when one has no interest in attacking it. Nothing makes one happier than having the mind convinced and the heart touched by religion. That is a good in all times. Even those who are not fortunate enough to believe as they choose should submit to the established religion. They know that what is called ‘prejudice’ has great standing in society and that it must be respected.” The treatment of religious truth in this passage is markedly skeptical. The assimilation of religion to a popular ‘prejudice’ is not refuted; it is simply useful to respect such a widespread belief, even if it is tainted by custom and bias. The particular religion to be respected and embraced varies from one society to another, since it is the religious confession established by the state. In France, this is Catholicism defended by the monarchy, but in other cultures this can easily be another religious confession whose tenets are enforced by a different type of political sovereignty.
Other writings, notably Counsels of a Mother to Daughter and Treatise on Old Age, commend the virtue of piety to women. But despite the occasional Christian references, the religious sentiment lauded by Lambert remains closer to rationalist deism than to the Catholic sentiment of adoration and submission rooted in grace.
In several works, Lambert studies the subjective dimension of aesthetics. She explores how the taste for beauty develops in the human mind. She also studies the related mental qualities of delicacy and refinement, which permit the human person to recognize beauty in nature or in artifacts.
Reflections on Taste concedes an irreducible subjectivity to the phenomenon of taste. Whereas discursive reasoning inevitably leads to certain conclusions according to the rules of logic and of evidence, judgments of taste often evince irresolvable contradictions. “Taste is the first movement and a type of instinct which draws us and guides us more surely than all the work of reason. There is no necessary agreement among tastes. This is not the same thing as among truths. It is obvious that whoever concedes my premises will also agree with the consequences I draw. In this way one may lead an intelligent person to accept one’s opinion, but one is never sure that one can lead a sensitive person to one’s judgment of taste. There are no links or enticements to make someone else agree with this judgment. Nothing is certain in the domain of taste; everything springs from the disposition of one’s interior organs and the relationship established between them and external objects.” Despite its power over the human person’s judgment, taste delivers subjective judgments inasmuch as it depends on the physiology and the psychology unique to each person in the exercise of aesthetic perception.
Despite this subjective dimension, the essay insists that some judgments of taste are more justified than are others. Although taste eludes analytic definition, it can be evoked intuitively for those who have experienced the difference in quality of aesthetic judgments. “Right taste delivers a proper judgment on everything we call pleasing, satisfying, fitting, fine, or, so to speak, the flora of the soul. It is this je ne sais quoi of wisdom and of skillfulness, which knows what is appropriate and which senses in each object the correct proportion it must possess.” Although judgments of taste do not follow the strict logic of discursive reason, they are not arbitrary. Irreducible to a formula, experience indicates that certain minds excel in the recognition of the obscure formal qualities that constitute the beauty of an external object.
Against emotivism and relativism, Lambert argues that the faculty of taste possesses a partial intellectual dimension. “Up to the present, good taste has been defined as ‘a custom established for the members of high society who are sophisticated and discriminating.’ I think that good taste depends on two things: a sentiment of great delicacy in the heart and a great correctness in the mind.” If Lambertian taste begins as a subjective movement of instinct and feeling, it only reaches its mature term when the intellect has refined this initial impression through a scrutiny of the formal qualities, especially the harmony and balance, of the external object under consideration.
Lambert’s writings make few explicit references to Descartes, but her writings are suffused with Cartesian philosophy. Although the degree of her personal knowledge of the texts of Descartes remains unclear, Lambert clearly imbibed the pervasive Cartesianism of the salons, militantly diffused in her own salon by Fontenelle.
The literary portrait Monsieur de la Motte provides a Cartesian definition of philosophy. “To philosophize is to render to reason all its dignity and to make it enter into its rights. It is to relate each object to its proper principles. It is to shake off the yoke of opinion and of authority.” In its attack on public opinion and appeals to authority as the antonym of right reason, this rationalist concept of philosophy clearly follows the path of Cartesianism.
In several works, this Cartesian apology for reason warns the reader of the dangers of reliance on public opinion. Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter emphasizes the necessity to abandon prejudice, custom, and public opinion if one seeks to reason properly. “Give yourself a true idea of things. Don’t judge like the common people do. Don’t yield your judgment to that of public opinion. Throw off the prejudices of childhood.” Similarly, the Dialogue between Alexander and Diogenes on the Equality of Goods condemns Alexander the Great’s reliance on the esteem of the public. “I know very well that you [Alexander] have the masses for you. The number of the wise is very small. As much as you are a prince, you are still a man of the common people in your way of thinking. Always dependant on the opinion of other people, you place your happiness in the judgments of others.” It is Diogenes, the representative of the intellectual elite which relies on reason rather than on fluctuating public opinion, who has access to the truth.
Lambert’s Cartesian orientation often emerges in her treatment of specific areas of human endeavor. Counsels of a Mother to Her Son considers history, focused on human passions and chance events, as inferior to the study of metaphysics, where the student can discover universal, immutable principles. “Your ordinary reading must be history, but you must join reflection to it. Don’t think of filling your memory with facts, of decorating your mind with the thoughts and opinions of authors. This would only turn your mind into a store filled with the ideas of other people. A quarter of an hour of reflection does more to deepen and form the mind than do hours of reading. You should not fear a lack of knowledge; rather, you should fear error and false judgments. Reflection is the guide leading to truth.” Counsels of a Mother to her Daughter closely follows Descartes’s Discourse on Method in its exemption of religion from the rationalist censure of appeals to authority. “In the area of religion, one must yield to authorities, but on every other subject, one must only accept the authority of reason and of evidence.” As a result of this split in warrants between religious and non-religious knowledge, theological belief becomes a matter of arational assent. “As a great man [Malebranche] said, ‘To be a Christian, one must believe blindly; to be wise, one must see the evidence.” In this Cartesian framework, reason is not only to be exercised in metaphysics and science to discover indubitable, immutable principles; it is be used in other areas of human life to eliminate or at least to temper the weight of authority and custom on human judgment.
The reception of Madame de Lambert’s writings and philosophy has been checkered. In the eighteenth century a large, cultivated European public purchased numerous editions of her works in French, English, German, and Spanish. French Enlightenment philosophers, notably Bayle, Fontenelle, Montesquieu, and Voltaire, praised her contribution to moral philosophy. By the late nineteenth century, however, Lambert was little read. It is significant that the first twentieth-century edition of Lambert’s works occurred only at the very end of the century (1990) with Granderoute’s critical edition.
Several factors explain the eclipse of Lambert’s philosophy. First, the marquise wrote in the style of literary miniatures that were popular in the salons of the period. She often expressed her philosophy in the genre of the essay, the literary dialogue, the maxim, or the literary portrait. Genres that appeared charming in the boudoirs of the Regency often appeared precious to a later literary public. Written outside the framework of the systematic treatise, the essays’ arguments on virtue or politics or aesthetics often seemed unphilosophical to a later philosophical public accustomed to university norms of academic argument.
Second, Madame de Lambert wrote from and for a philosophical culture which has vanished. She could presume that her listeners had studied the Stoicism of Plutarch and Cicero in their schooldays as she had. Even indirect references to the classical authors would be immediately grasped. Paraphrases of Montaigne or Pascal required no further explanation. Any educated Frenchman or Frenchwoman in the early eighteenth century would possess at least a hazy outline of the skepticism represented by each of these masters of modern French prose.
The recent renaissance of philosophical interest in Lambert is tied to the neo-feminist expansion of the cannon of the humanities in early modernity. Several recent studies focus on the question of gender and the status of women in Lambert. The interpretations offered by Fassiotto (1984) and Beasely (1992) illustrate this tendency. Other contributions by Lambert to moral philosophy, such as her virtue theory and her critique of the influence of popular opinion on moral judgment, await further research.
All translations from French to English above are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: September 12, 2009 | Originally published: