Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Laozi (Lao-tzu, fl. 6th c. B.C.E.)

laoziLaozi is the name of a legendary Daoist philosopher, the alternate title of the early Chinese text better known in the West as the Daodejing, and the moniker of a deity in the pantheon of organized “religious Daoism” that arose during the later Han dynasty (25-220 CE). Laozi is the pinyin Romanization for the Chinese characters which mean “Old Master.” Laozi is also known as Lao Tan (“Old Tan”) in early Chinese sources (see Romanization systems for Chinese terms). The Zhuangzi is the first text to use Laozi as a personal name and to identify Laozi and Lao Tan. The earliest materials associated with Laozi are in the Zhuangzi’s Inner Chapters. The Outer Chapters of that work have ten logia in which Laozi is the main figure, four of which contain direct attacks on the Confucian virtues of ren, yi, and li that are reminiscent of passages from the Daodejing and probably date from the period in which that collection was reaching some near final form. The earliest ascription of authorship of the Daodejing to Laozi is in Han Feizi and the Huainanzi, but several themes from the Laozi logia of the Zhuangzi are traceable into the Daodejing and on at least two occasions in that text Laozi counsels following dao (the Way) to possess de (virtue). Laozi became a principal figure in institutionalized religious forms of Daoism. He was often associated with many transformations and incarnations of the dao itself.

Table of Contents

1. Laozi and Lao Tan in Early Sources
2. Laozi and the Daodejing
3. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing
4. The First Biography and the Establishment of Laozi as the Founder of Daoism
5. The Laozi Myth
6. Select Bibliography

1. Laozi and Lao Tan in Early Sources

Zhuangzi gives the following, probably fictional, account of Confucius‘s impression of Laozi:

“Master, you’ve seen Lao Tan—what estimation would you make of him?” Confucius said, “At last I may say that I have seen a dragon—a dragon that coils to show his body at its best, that sprawls out to display his patterns at their best, riding on the breath of the clouds, feeding on the yin and yang. My mouth feel open and I couldn’t close it; my tongue flew up and I couldn’t even stammer. How could I possibly make any estimation of Lao Tan!” Zhuangzi, Ch. 14

According to The Book of Rites (Li ji), a master known as Lao Tan was an expert on mourning rituals. On four occasions, Confucius (kongzi, Master Kong) is reported to have responded to questions by appealing to answers given by Lao Tan. The records say that Confucius once assisted him in a burial service.

In the Zhuangzi (late 4th century BCE), Lao Tan is usually a critic of Confucius. This is the first text to use Laozi as a personal name and to identify Laozi and Lao tan. The Zhuangzi contains materials from a teacher known as Zhuang Zhou who lived between 370-300 BCE, according to Sima Qian. Chapters 1-7 of the present 33 are those most often ascribed to Zhuangzi (meaning Master Zhuang). Guo Xiang edited the text in the first half of the 3rd Cent. CE. He had 52 sections handed down to him. He rejected the material he thought was inferior and spurious, keeping 33 chapters which he divided into the “inner chapters” (chs. 1-7), “outer chapters” (chs. 8-22) and “mixed chapters,” (chs. 23-33). Aside from chs. 1-7, the remaining 26 had origins other than Zhuang Zhou and they sometimes take different points of view. In the citations below, I have followed the practice of prefacing the chapter with its literary critical designation (that is, inner, outer, mixed). These designations are oversimplified textually and arguable, but at least some acknowledgment of where they are located in this textual system may help one understand that some of the passages come from different time periods and have specific polemical agendas.

Assuming that Lao Tan and Laozi are the same figure and counting the one dialogue in Mixed Ch. 27 attributed to Lao Laizi as Laozi, then there are eighteen (18) passages in which Laozi plays a role in the Zhuangzi. It is on the basis on Inner Chapter 3, The Secret of Caring for Life that we identify Lao Tan and Laozi. The passage begins “When Lao Tan died” but then when his disciple Ch’in Shih is attacked by his fellow students for only making three cries and then leaving the funeral hall, the text calls them “Laozi’s disciples.” Ch’in Shih’s defense is “Your master happened to come because it was his time, and he happened to leave because things follow along. If you are content with the time and willing to follow along, then grief and joy have no way to enter.” His association of the dead master with the students who are Laozi’s disciples, and the opening of the chapter makes the identification of Lao Tan and Laozi pretty clear. Then, there are dialogues in which Lao Tan and Laozi are used interchangeably (see Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven and Mixed Ch. 27, Imputed Words). Other biographically significant material includes a reference to Laozi’s being the keeper of the Royal Archives of the house of Zhou in Outer Ch. 13, The Way of Heaven.

Laozi’s relationship to Confucius is also a major part of the Zhuangzi‘s picture of the philosopher. Of the eighteen passages mentioning Laozi, Confucius figures as a dialogical partner or subject in nine (9). While it is clear that Confucius is thought to have a long way to go to become a zhen ren (the Zhuangzi‘s way of speaking about the true man), Lao Tan seems to feel sorry for Confucius in his reply to “No-Toes” in Inner Chapter 5, The Sign of Virtue Complete. He recommends seeking to release Confucius from the fetters of his tendency to make rules and human discriminations (e.g., right/wrong; beautiful/ugly).

Lao Tan addresses Confucius by his personal name “Ch’iu” in three passages. Since such a liberty is one that only a person with seniority and authority would take, this style invites us to believe that Confucius was a student of Lao Tan’s and acknowledged him as an authority. However, continuing the theme that Laozi taught Confucius, who was confused and having no success, we should note that the point of the story that mentions Laozi’s occupation as an archivist is that Confucius’ writings, offered to Laozi by Confucius himself, are simply not worthy to be put into the library. And on another occasion, Confucius claims that he knows the “six classics” thoroughly and that he has tried to persuade 72 kings to their truth, but they have been unmoved. Laozi’s reply is, “Good!” He tells Confucius not to occupy himself with such worn out ways, and to live the dao himself (Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven).

Another important set of exchanges occurs between Laozi and Confucius over the latter’s principal ideas of benevolence (ren) and righteousness (yi). Laozi tells Confucius to forget this teaching and be natural: “Why these flags of benevolence and righteousness so bravely upraised, as though you were beating a drum and searching for a lost child? Ah, you will bring confusion to the nature of man!” (Outer Ch. 13, The Way of Heaven)

Finally, in Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven, Lao Tan makes a direct attack not only on the rules and regulations of Confucius, but also the teachings of the Mohists, and the veneration of the ancient emperors and legendary sages of the past.

2. Laozi and the Daodejing

The Daodejing (hereafter, DDJ) has 81 chapters and over 5,000 Chinese characters, depending on which text is used. Its two major divisions are the dao jing (chs. 1-37) and the de jing (chs. 38-81). Actually, this division probably rests on nothing other than the fact that the principal concept opening Chapter 1 is dao (way) and that of Chapter 38 is de (virtue). Nonetheless, the text has been studied by literary critics for centuries. In spite of the long standing tradition that the text had a single author named Laozi, it is clear that the work is a collection of short aphorisms. Most of these probably circulated orally perhaps even singly or in small collections.

For almost 2,000 years, the Chinese text used by commentators in China and upon which all except the most recent Western language translations were based has been called the Wang Bi, after the commentator who used a complete edition of the DDJ sometime between 226-249 CE. Although Wang Bi was not a Daoist, his commentary became a standard interpretive guide, and generally speaking even today scholars depart from it only when they can make a compelling argument for doing so. Based on recent archaeological finds at Guodian in 1993 and Mawangdui in the 1970s we are certain that there were several simultaneously circulating versions of the Daodejing text.

Mawangdui is the name for a site of tombs discovered near Changsha in Hunan province. The Mawangdui discoveries consist of two incomplete editions of the DDJ on silk scrolls (boshu) now simply called “A” and “B.” These versions have two principal differences from the Wang Bi. Some word choice divergencies are present. The order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the Mawangdui versions. More precisely, the order of the Mawangdui texts takes the traditional 81 chapters and sets them out like this: 38, 39, 40, 42-66, 80, 81, 67-79, 1-21, 24, 22, 23, 25-37. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu, Te-tao Ching. Contemporary scholarship associates the Mawangdui versions with a type of Daoism known as the Way of the Yellow Emperor and the Old Master (Huanglao Dao), since the Yellow Emperor was venerated alongside of Laozi as a patron of the teachings of Daoism. The prevailing view is that the present version of the DDJ probably reached its final form at the Qixia Academy of the Ji kingdom associated with Huanglao Daoism around the beginning of the 3rd century BCE.

The Guodian find consists of 730 inscribed bamboo slips found near the village of Guodian in Hubei province in 1993. There are 71 slips with material that is also found in 31 of the 81 chapters of the DDJ and corresponding to Chapters 1-66. It may date as early as c. 300 BCE. If this is a correct date, then the Daodejing was already extant in a written form when the “inner chapters” (see below) of the Zhuangzi were composed. These slips contain more significant variants from the Wang Bi than the Mawangdui versions.

Thus, there is really no scholarly support for the idea that the text was written by a single author, and certainly not by a person named Laozi. Having said this, it is true that twice in the Outer Chapters there are extensive passages in which Lao Tan makes remarks that are very close parallels to the Daodejing. The most prominent of these is Outer Ch. 33, The World. “Lao Tan said, ‘Know the male but cling to the female; become the ravine of the world. Know the pure but cling to the dishonor; become the valley of the world.’ He said, ‘What is brittle will be broken, what is sharp will be blunted.’”

Perhaps these allusions lie behind the fact that both the Han Feizi and Huainanzi (180-122 BCE) attribute the authorship of the Daodejing to Laozi. Then, in Sima Qian’s biography of Laozi, he not only says that Laozi was the author of the Daodejng, but he explains that it was a written text of his teachings given when he departed China to go to the West. So, by the 1st Cent. BCE, this was accepted. Any discussion of Laozi’s philosophy, is inseparable from a discussion of the Daodejing.

3. Fundamental Concepts in the Daodejing

The term Dao means a road, and is often translated as “the Way”. This is because sometimes dao is used as a nominative (that is, “the dao”) and other times as a verb (i.e. daoing). Dao is the process of reality itself, the way things come together, while still transforming. All this reflects the deep seated Chinese belief that change is the most basic character of things. In the Yi jing (Classic of Change) the patterns of this change are symbolized by figures standing for 64 relations of correlative forces and known as the hexagrams. Dao is the alteration of these forces, most often simply stated as yin and yang. The Xici is a commentary on the Yi jing formed in about the same period as the DDJ. It takes the taiji (Great Ultimate) as the source of correlative change and associates it with the dao. The contrast is not between what things are or that something is or is not, but between chaos (hundun) and the way reality is ordering (de). Yet, reality is not ordering into one unified whole. It is the 10,000 things (wanwu). There is the dao but not “the World” or “the cosmos” in a Western sense.

The Daodejing teaches that humans cannot fathom the Dao, because any name we give to it cannot capture it. It is beyond what we can conceive (ch.1). Those who wu wei may become one with it and thus obtain the dao. Wu wei is a difficult notion to translate. Yet, it is generally agreed that the traditional rendering of it as “nonaction” or “no action” is incorrect. Those who wu wei do act. Daoism is not a philosophy of “doing nothing.” Wu wei means something like “act naturally,” “effortless action,” or “nonwillful action.” The point is that there is no need for human tampering with the flow of reality. Wu wei should be our way of life, because the dao always benefits, it does not harm (ch. 81) The way of heaven (dao of tian) is always on the side of good (ch. 79) and virtue (de) comes forth from the dao alone (ch. 21). What causes this natural embedding of good and benefit in the dao is vague and elusive (ch. 35), not even the sages understand it (ch. 76). But the world is a reality that is filled with spiritual force, just as a sacred image used in religious ritual might be (ch. 29). The dao occupies the place in reality that is analogous to the part of a family’s house set aside for the altar for venerating the ancestors and gods (the ao of the house, ch. 62). When we think that life’s occurrences seem unfair (a human discrimination), we should remember that heaven’s (tian) net misses nothing, it leaves nothing undone (ch. 37)

A central theme of the Daodejing is that correlatives are the expressions of the movement of dao. Correlatives in Chinese philosophy are not opposites, mutually excluding each other. They represent the ebb and flow of the forces of reality: yin/yang, male/female; excess/defect; leading/following; active/passive. As one approaches the fullness of yin, yang begins to horizon and emerge. Its teachings on correlation often suggest to interpreters that the DDJ is filled with paradoxes. For example, ch. 22 says, “Those who are crooked will be perfected. Those who are bent will be straight. Those who are empty will be full.” While these appear paradoxical, they are probably better understood as correlational in meaning. The DDJ says, “straightforward words seem paradoxical,” implying, however, that they are not (ch. 78).

What is the image of the ideal person, the sage (sheng ren), the real person (zhen ren) in the DDJ? Well, sages wu wei (chs. 2, 63). In this respect, they are like newborn infants, who move naturally, without planning and reliance on the structures given to them by others (ch. 15). The DDJ tells us that sages empty themselves, becoming void of pretense. Sages concentrate their internal energies (qi). They clean their vision (ch. 10). They manifest plainness and become like uncarved wood (pu) (ch. 19). They live naturally and free from desires given by men (ch. 37) They settle themselves and know how to be content (ch. 46). The DDJ makes use of some very famous analogies to drive home its point. Sages know the value of emptiness as illustrated by how emptiness is used in a bowl, door, window, valley or canyon (ch. 11). They preserve the female (yin), meaning that they know how to be receptive and are not unbalanced favoring assertion and action (yang) (ch. 28). They shoulder yin and embrace yang, blend internal energies (qi) and thereby attain harmony (he) (ch. 42). Those following the dao do not strive, tamper, or seek control (ch. 64). They do not endeavor to help life along (ch. 55), or use their heart-mind (xin) to “solve” or “figure out” life’s apparent knots and entanglements (ch. 55). Indeed, the DDJ cautions that those who would try to do something with the world will fail, they will actually ruin it (ch. 29). Sages do not engage in disputes and arguing, or try to prove their point (chs. 22, 81). They are pliable and supple, not rigid and resistive (chs. 76, 78). They are like water (ch. 8), finding their own place, overcoming the hard and strong by suppleness (ch. 36). Sages act with no expectation of reward (chs. 2, 51). They put themselves last and yet come first (ch. 7). They never make a display of themselves, (chs. 72, 22). They do not brag or boast, (chs. 22, 24) and they do not linger after their work is done (ch. 77). They leave no trace (ch. 27). Because they embody dao in practice, they have longevity (ch. 16). They create peace (ch. 32). Creatures do not harm them (chs. 50, 55). Soldiers do not kill them (ch. 50). Heaven (tian) protects the sage and the sage becomes invincible (ch. 67).

Among the most controversial of the teachings in the DDJ are those directly associated with rulers. Recent scholarship is moving toward a consensus that the persons who developed and collected the teachings of the DDJ played some role in civil administration, but they may also have been practitioners of ritual arts and what we would call religious rites. Be that as it may, many of the aphorisms directed toward rulers seem puzzling at first sight. According to the DDJ, the proper ruler keeps the people without knowledge, (ch. 65), fills their bellies, opens their hearts and empties them of desires (ch. 3). A sagely ruler reduces the size of the state and keeps the population small. Even though the ruler possesses weapons, they are not used (ch. 80). The ruler does not seek prominence. The ruler is a shadowy presence (chs. 17, 66). When the ruler’s work is done, the people say they are content (ch. 17). This is all the more interesting when we remember that the philosopher and legalist political theorist named Han Feizi used the DDJ as a guide for the unification of China. Han Feizi was the foremost counselor of the first emperor of China, Qin Shihuangdi (r. 221-206 BCE). It is a pity that the emperor used the DDJ’s admonitions to “fill the bellies and empty the minds” to justify his program of destroying all books not related to medicine, astronomy or agriculture.

4. The First Biography and the Establishment of Laozi as the Founder of Daoism

We have now arrived at the stage where studies of Lao Tan usually begin. The first known attempt to write a biography of Laozi is in the Shi ji (Records of the Historian, c. 90-104 BCE) by Sima Qian (145-89 BCE). According to this text, Laozi’s surname was Li, and his personal name was Er. The narrative does not use the name Lao Tan, only Laozi. However, Qian reports that a historiographer named Tan did advise one of the Dukes of Qin, and that he indeed predicted the Zhou and Qin would split and a new empire would emerge. Then he says, “Some say Tan was Laozi, some say not. No one in our time knows whether or not it is so.” (translations from Sima Qian done by A.C. Graham) In yet a further effort to narrow down the identification of Laozi, Qian mentions the Lao Laizi of the Zhuangzi and acknowledges that he came from the same state as Laozi, and that he authored a work of 15 sections on Daoist practice. Qian says Lao Laizi was a contemporary of Confucius, but clearly he seems to make a distinction between Lao Laizi and Laozi. Finally, there is the end of the biography in which Qian talks about Laozi’s son’s fortunes and ties them to the area from which the Han ruling family came.

Qian’s biographical account follows the Zhuangzi in stating Laozi’s occupation as an archivist for the state of Zhou. Like the Zhuangzi it also reports exchanges between Laozi and Confucius. Two dialogues are briefly reported. In one, Laozi tells Confucius to give up his stiff deportment and prideful airs. It is very similar to Zhuangzi Mixed Chapter 26. In the other passage, Confucius is reported to have praised Laozi’s wisdom and to have compared him to a dragon in a way virtually identical to Zhuangzi Outer Chapter 14.

Sima Qian says, “Laozi cultivated the dao and its virtue.” We recognize of course that “dao and its virtue” is Dao de, and that this is a reference to Laozi’s association with the Daodejing. What the Zhuangzi only alluded to by putting near quotes from the DDJ in the mouth of Laozi, Sima Qian makes explicit. He tells us that when the Zhou kingdom began to decline, Laozi decided to leave China and head into the West. When he reached the mountain pass, the keeper of the pass (Yin Xi, also called Kuan-yin) insisted that he write down his teachings, so that the people would have them after he left. So, “Laozi wrote a book in two parts, discussing the ideas of the Way and of Virtue in some 5,000 words, and departed. No one knows where he ended his life.”

A.C. Graham has made a study of Sima Qian’s account and the other origins of the Lao Tan (Laozi) legend. Graham believes that the oldest stratum of the stories about Lao Tan is actually a Confucian tale relating how Confucius sought instruction in the rites from Lao Tan, who was known as an archivist of Zhou. Graham dates this part of the legend as far back as the 4th Cent. BCE. What we do not know is whether this account actually preserves some factual historical reminiscence, or simply an exemplary story designed to show that Confucius sought learning anywhere and was humbly willing to be taught by anyone. But then what happened was that Lao Tan was adopted in the “Inner Chapters” of the Zhuangzi (before 300 BCE) as a spokesmen for Zhuang Zhou’s views and an instructor of Confucius.

The next stage in the development of Laozi’s biography was the appearance of Laozi under the name Lao Tan, thereby appropriating the place Tan had occupied as a teacher of Confucius. We cannot be certain whether this identification of the two figures was actually done by Zhuang Zhou or was a later redaction of Inner Ch. 3. But certainly Lao Tan and Laozi are used interchangeably in Outer Ch.14, Turning of Heaven and Mixed Ch. 27, Imputed Words. From this point on, Laozi is offered as a figure representing a definite philosophical trend.

Another movement in the evolution of the Laozi story was completed by about 240 BCE. This was necessitated by Lao Tan’s association with the grand historiographer Tan during the Zhou, who predicted the rise of the Qin state. This information, along with that of Laozi’s journey to the West, and of the writing of the book for Yin Xi (Kuan-yin) won the favor for Laozi from the Qin. And the association of Laozi with a text (the DDJ) that was becoming increasingly significant was important. However, with the demise of the Qin state, some realignment of Laozi’s connection with them was needed. So, Qian’s final remarks about Laozi’s son helped to associate the philosopher’s lineage with the new Han ruling family. The journey to the West component now also had a new force. It explained why Laozi was not presently advising the Han rulers.

Sima Qian classified the Six Schools as Yin-Yang, Confucian, Mohist, Legalists, School of Names, and Daoists. Since his biography located Laozi earlier than Zhuangzi, and the passages in the Zhuangzi seemed to be about a person who lived before the text (and not to be simply a literary or traditional invention), then Laozi became established as the founder of the Daoist school.

5. The Laozi Myth

Livia Kohn has written a historical account of the development of the Laozi myth from the Han through the Six Dynasties period (200 BCE to 600 CE). In The Lives of the Immortals by Liu Xiang (Lie xuan zhuan, 77-6 BCE) there are separate entries for Laozi and Yin Xi (Kuan-yin). According to the story, Yin became a disciple and begged Laozi to allow him to go to the West as well. Laozi told him that he could come along, but only after he cultivated the dao. Laozi instructed Yin to study hard and await a summons which would be delivered to him in the marketplace in Chengdu. There is now a shrine at the putative location of this site dedicated to “ideal discipleship.” More importantly, in this text it is clear that practitioners of immortality regarded Laozi as a superior daoshi (fangshi) who had achieved immortality through wisdom and the practice of techniques for longevity.

Emperor Huan (r. 147-167 CE) built a palace on the traditional site of Laozi’s birthplace and authorized veneration and sacrifice to Laozi. The Laozi ming (Inscription on Laozi) written by Pien Shao in c. 166 CE as a commemorative marker for the site goes well beyond Sima Qian’s biography. It makes the first apotheosis of Laozi into a deity. The text makes reference to the many cosmic metamorphoses of Laozi, allowing him portraying him as having been counselor to the great sage kings of China. The elite at the imperial court divinized Laozi and regarded him as an embodiment of the dao, a kind of cosmic emperor who knew how to rule things in perfect harmony and bring peace.

During the reign of Emperor Huidi of the Western Jin dynasty (290-306 CE), Wang Fu, a libationer of the Celestial Masters Tradition often debated with the Buddhist monk Bo Yuan about philosophical beliefs. The result was that Fu wrote a one volume work entitled Book of Laozi’s Conversion of the Barbarians (laozi huahu jing) designed to put forward the view that Laozi went to India, changed into Buddha, and converted the barbarians. The basic thrust of the book was that Buddhism was a form of Daoism. Later, the work was gradually enlarged and adapted into ten volumes and it became a repository for Daoist polemic against Buddhism. Both Emperor Gaozong and Emperor Zhongzong of the Tang dynasty gave orders to prohibit its distribution. In the Yuan dynasty (1285 CE), Emperor Shizu ordered the burning of the Daoist canon of texts, and the first one destroyed was the Book of the Conversion of Barbarians.

The Daoist cosmological belief in the transformation of beings was greatly strengthened by the text Scripture on the Transformations of Laozi (The Laozi Bianhua Wuji Jing, late 100s CE). This work reflects some of the ideas in Pien Shao’s inscription, but takes them much further. It tells how Laozi transformed into his own mother and gave birth to himself, taking quite literally comments in the DDJ where the dao is portrayed as the mother of all things. The work associates Laozi with the manifestations or incarnations of the dao itself. The final passage is an address given by Laozi predicting his reappearance and promising liberation from trouble and the overthrow of the Han dynasty! The millennial cults of the second century believed Laozi was a messianic figure who appeared to their leaders and gave them instructions and revelations.

The period of the Celestial Masters (c. 142-260 CE) produced documents enhancing the myth of Laozi. Laozi was now called Lao jun (Lord Lao) or Tai Shang Lao Jun (Lord Lao Most High). Lao jun could manifest himself in any time of unrest and bring great peace (tai ping). Yet, the Celestial Masters never claimed that Lao jun had done so in their day. Instead of such a direct manifestation, the Celestial Masters practitioners taught that Lao jun transmitted to them talismans, registers, and new scriptures in the form of texts.

Most later writings about Laozi continued to base their appeals to Laozi’s authority on his ongoing transmigrations, but they give evidence of the growing tension between Daoism and Buddhism. The first mythological account of Laozi’s birth is in the Scripture of the Inner Explanation of the Three Heavens, a Celestial Master work dated about 420 CE. In this text, Laozi has three births: as the manifestation of the dao from pure energy to become a deity in heaven; in human form as the ancient philosopher of the Daodejing; and as the Buddha after his journey to the West. In the first birth, his mother is known as The Jade Maiden of Mystery and Wonder. In his second, he is born to a human woman known as Mother Li. This was an eighty-one year pregnancy, after which he was born from her left armpit (there is a tradition that Buddha had been born from his mother’s right arm pit). At birth he had white hair and so he was called laozi (Old Child). This birth is set in the time of the Shang dynasty, several centuries before the date Sima Qian reports. But the purpose of such a move is to allow him time to travel to the West and then become the Buddha. The third birth takes place in India as the Buddha. For details of this birth we turn to Esoteric Record of Mystery and Wonder, another fifth century document of the Celestial Masters. According to this text, Laozi entered into the body of the wife of the king of India through her mouth. Later he was born through her left arm pit. He walked immediately after his birth, and “from then on Buddhist teaching came to flourish.” (quoted in Kohn)

Ge Hong‘s (283-343 CE) The Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity (Baopuzi neipian) is the most important Daoist philosophical work of that period. Ge Hong said that in a state of visualization he saw Laozi, seven feet tall, with cloudlike garments of five colors, wearing a multi-tiered cap and carrying a sharp sword. According to Ge, Laozi had a prominent nose, long eyebrows, and an elongated head. This physiological type was template for portraying immortals in Daoist art.

Authority for Celestial Masters practices and beliefs was usually backed up by some new account of Laozi. In the 500s CE the Scripture on Opening the Cosmos had Laozi teach the sage-king who developed agriculture about the grains, so that the people would not have to kill birds and beasts for food. And he taught another sage-king how to make fire.

The hagiography of Laozi has continued to develop, down to the present day. There are even traditions that various natural geographic landmarks and features are the enduring imprint of Lord Lao on China and his face can be seen in them. It is more likely, of course, that Laozi’s immortality is in the mark made by the philosophical movement he has come to represent and the culture it created..

6. Select Bibliography

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Bokenkamp, Stephen R. (1997). Early Daoist Scriptures. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Csikszentmihalyi, Mark and Ivanhoe, Philip J., eds. (1999). Religious and Philosophical Aspects of the Laozi. Albany: State University of New York.

Giles, Lionel. (1948). A Gallery of Chinese Immortals. London: John Murray.

Graham, Angus. (1981). Chuang tzu: The Inner Chapters. London: Allen & Unwin.

Graham, Angus. (1989). Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle, IL: Open Court.

Graham, Angus. [1998 (1986)], “The Origins of the Legend of Lao Tan.” In Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching, ed. Kohn, Livia Kohn and Michael LaFargue, 23-41. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Hansen, Chad. (1992). A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.

Henricks, Robert. (1989). Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine.

Ivanhoe, Philip J. (2002). The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges Press.

Kohn, Livia, (1998). “The Lao-Tzu Myth.” In Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching, ed. Kohn, Livia Kohn and Michael LaFargue, 41-63. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Kohn, Livia, (1996). “Laozi: Ancient Philosopher, Master of Longevity, and Taoist God.” In Religions of China in Practice, ed. Donald S. Lopez, 52-63. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Kohn, Livia and LaFargue, Michael. (1998). Lao-tzu and the Tao-te-ching. Albany: State University of New York Press.

Kohn, Livia and Roth, Harold (2002) Daoist Identity: History, Lineage, and Ritual. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.

Watson, Burton. (1968). The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu. New York: Columbia University Press.

Welch, Holmes. (1966). Taoism: The Parting of the Way. Boston: Beacon Press.

Welch, Holmes and Seidel, Anna, eds. (1979). Facets of Taoism. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Email: ronnie.littlejohn@belmont.edu
Belmont University
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 27, 2005 | Originally published: