Madame de la Sablière made distinctive contributions to moral and religious philosophy in 17th century France. Her ethical theory implies that the natural moral virtues are disguised vices and that only the theological virtues can sustain an authentic moral life. Her moral rigorism appears in the severity with which she treats questions of moral agency and responsibility. In her treatment of religious knowledge, she focuses on the spiritual conditions necessary for a proper grasp of the attributes of God. Self-abandonment, marked by detachment from the faculties of imagination and intellect, is the necessary condition for an apophatic (or negative theological) recognition of God’s essence.
Madame de la Sablière has long occupied a modest niche in literary, religious, and scientific history. French literature textbooks cite her as the hostess of a prominent literary salon and as the patron of La Fontaine. French Catholic devotional tracts celebrate her as the model convert, the savante who abandoned the skepticism and sexual license of the salon to become a pious servant of the incurably ill. Several histories of science present her as one of the first woman astronomers, due to her research undertaken at the Observatory of Paris. Only in the late 20th century has La Sablière the philosopher emerged into view.
In 1640 Marguerite Hessein was born into the Huguenot elite of Paris. Like other members of the Protestant high bourgeoisie, Hessein belonged to a family prominent in the field of finance. Her father Gilbert Hessein acquired a substantial fortune through the bank he had founded. Her mother Marguerite Menjot Hessein was the daughter of a high-ranking official in the treasury. The spiritual and social life of the family focused on the Huguenot church at Charenton, a Paris suburb where public Protestant worship was permitted. Marguerite was baptized at the church on March 18, 1640.
After the death of her mother in 1649, Marguerite Hessein’s education was placed under the care of her maternal uncle Antoine Menjot and her cousin Madeleine Gaudon de la Raillière. A medical doctor and Protestant apologist, Menjot devised a sophisticated curriculum to be taught by a series of specialized tutors. The study of the classics was so successful that the pupil would later be renowned for her mastery of both Latin and Greek, an unusual accomplishment for a woman of the period. The rigorous instruction in mathematics initiated her lifelong love for science and her avid participation, also unusual for a woman of the period, in the scientific circles of Paris. Menjot personally instructed his niece in the theological principles of Calvinism and introduced her to philosophy. This early formation in philosophy stressed contemporary philosophy, with particular emphasis on the schools of René Descartes and Pierre Gassendi.
An arranged marriage between Marguerite Hessein and Antonie de Rambouillet de la Sablière was held on March 15, 1654. Like his wife, Monsieur de la Sablière descended from an affluent Huguenot family prominent in finance. In addition to wealth, he brought artistic distinction to the marriage. Fluent in Italian, he had already established himself as a leading poet through the publication of his madrigals. Despite the economic, religious, and cultural affinities of the spouses, the marriage unraveled in its second decade. The infidelities of the husband and the physical and emotional violence he directed toward his wife became increasingly more pronounced. After failed efforts at reconciliation, Madame de la Sablière obtained a legal separation of goods and persons in 1668. Recognizing the wife as the innocent partner in the failed marriage, the court required the delinquent husband to return her dowry to her and to pay her substantial alimony. It was Monsieur de la Sablière, however, who maintained custody of the three children from their marriage.
In 1669 a newly independent Madame de la Sablière started a literary salon in her home on the Rue Neuve-des-Petits-Champs in Paris. The salon quickly established itself as one of the capital’s cultural centers. Prominent writers habituating the salon included Molière, Racine, and Madame de Sévigné. Several salon members were prominent in the philosophical debates of the era: Fontenelle, Huet, and Queen Christina of Sweden. During this period, La Sablière also deepened her knowledge of scientific and philosophical culture. A series of tutors instructed her on the latest scientific developments: Roberval on calculus, Sauveur on geometry, and Barthélemy d’Herbelot on anatomy. She attended the public lectures of D’Alencé on physics, Verney on anatomy, and Cassini on astronomy. Actively involved in the practical experiments at Cassini’s observatory, La Sablière distinguished herself by her astronomical research.
Her principal tutor François Bernier focused on philosophy. An opponent of Descartes, he explained to her the contemporary controversies concerning Cartesian physics and metaphysics. He composed his Summary of the Philosophy of Gassendi for her use and dedicated his Pyrrhonic treatise Doubts to her. The personal philosophical opinions of La Sablière during her career as a salonnière remain uncertain. Although some chroniclers classify her as a salon Cartesian, her old mentor Antoine Menjot describes her mature philosophical position as a synthesis between Pyrrhonic skepticism and Epicureanism.
One salon member quickly became an intimate friend and protégé of La Sablière; Jean de la Fontaine. The celebrated author of Fables, La Fontaine joined La Sablière’s circle in 1670 and became her permanent houseguest in 1673. The impoverished poet frequently praised his benefactress in public. His Discourse for Madame de la Sablière attacked the philosophy of Descartes, in particular the Cartesian mechanistic theory of animal nature. During his inaugural speech as a newly elected member of the Académie française in 1684, La Fontaine praised his patron under the pseudonymn of Iris.
At the end of the 1670s La Sablière underwent a personal crisis. An affair with a military officer, Charles de la Fare, turned sour when the multiple affairs of La Fare become public knowledge in salon gossip. The death of her estranged husband in 1679 left her without the financial resources he had provided through alimony support. Finances forced her in 1680 to abandon her home for a more modest apartment on the Rue Saint-Honoré. The psychological crisis became a spiritual one, culminating in her conversion to Catholicism.
In the early 1680s La Sablière began a new life as a penitent and contemplative. La Sablière devoted herself to meditation and theological study under the spiritual direction of the Jesuit priest Rapin until 1687, and then under the Trappist abbot Rancé until her death. She also began to work as a volunteer at the Hospice des Incurables, a dangerous and unfashionable apostolate since it involved ministry to patients suffering from contagious diseases, including venereal diseases. Devoted to this new life of prayer and charity, La Sablière rented a small apartment on the grounds of the hospital and spent an increasing amount of time in this secluded cell rather than in her official residence. Old salon acquaintances, notably La Fontaine, lamented her reclusiveness and her growing attraction to monastic life.
During these years she maintained an extensive correspondence on theological matters with Rancé and composed the reflections on the moral virtues and passions that constitute her extant philosophical works. The austere life of prayer and service at the Incurables did not end La Sablière’s philosophical and scientific interests. Her well-thumbed personal library, inventoried at the time of her death, contained volumes by Descartes, Malebranche, Marcus Aurelius, Epictetus, and Saint Augustine. Despite the entreaties of her spiritual directors, La Sablière refused to abandon her beloved telescope. Until the last weeks of her life, she continued to observe the movements of the stars and the planets from her apartment and to confide her observations in a notebook.
Madame de la Sablière died on January 6, 1693.
The three surviving works of Madame de la Sablière date from the last decade of her life, when she led a contemplative existence as a lay volunteer at the Hospice des Incurables. Christian Maxims is a collection of observations on the moral life, focused on the virtues, the vices, and the passions. A popular literary genre in the salons of the period, the maxime was an epigram that dissected the contradictory currents of the human heart. Sablière transformed the genre by giving it a theological armature. Her maxims repeatedly use Scripture, the sacraments, and church tradition to demonstrate her theses on the illusions of natural moral virtue. A brief spiritual treatise, Christian Thoughts explores the spirituality of total abandonment of the human soul to the will of a hidden God. This collection of spiritual counsels argues that authentic knowledge of God requires the quieting of human intellectual, volitional, and imaginative powers. Her surviving correspondence, addressed primarily to her spiritual director Jean-Armand le Bouthillier de Rancé, abbot of La Trappe, concerns the spiritual difficulties encountered by La Sablière in her effort to renounce the worldliness of her earlier life as a salonnière and to lead an ascetical life of contemplation, penance, and service amid the terminally ill. It also reflects her substantial theological culture as she comments on the works of patristic authors who analyzed the virtue of humility. Saint Gregory the Great, Saint Dorotheus, and Saint Bernard of Clairvaux are the most frequently cited.
The history of the survival of the works of La Sablière indicates how easily the work of women philosophers in the early modern period can be lost and forgotten.
Christian Maxims was first published anonymously in 1705 in an edition of the maxims of La Rochefoucauld. The title was simply Les Maximes Chrétiennes de M*****. A subsequent edition of La Rochefoucauld in 1736 reprinted La Sablière’s work anonymously. Only in 1743 did a new edition of La Rochefoucald attribute the Maximes Chrétiennes to Madame de la Sablière. The attribution cited a 1736 royal permission to publish the work granted to the publisher Étienne Ganeau as the authority for the attribution. A subsequent 1777 edition reaffirmed La Sablière as the rightful author of the work. The close match between the style and concerns of the work to her correspondence with Rancé confirmed the attribution of authorship to La Sablière. The convoluted itinerary of Christian Maxims as an anonymous work, occasionally misconstrued as the work of La Rochefoucauld, demonstrates how anonymous and pseudonymous authorship, often employed by women of aristocratic rank during this period, could lead to the loss of the works by women authors.
La Sablière’s correspondence and Christian Thoughts followed a more tortuous itinerary. In the late nineteenth century Menjot d’Elbenne, the erudite biographer of La Sablière, investigated a manuscript collection of letters housed at the Chateau of Chantilly. Labeled Letters of Madame de Sablé, the letters were addressed to Abbé de Rancé and discussed spiritual concerns related to service at the Hospice des Incurables and to the three adult children of La Sablière. Menjot d’Elbenne immediately recognized that it was La Sablière, not Sablé, who had composed the letters. An ambiguous reference to “M.D.L.S.” as the author of the collection had apparently misled an earlier manuscript editor. Fragmentary transcriptions of La Sablière’s letters by Mademoiselle de la Jonchapt, the secretary to Madame de Maintenon, provided external confirmation of the attribution to La Sablière. Pensées Chrétiennes de D.M.D.L.S., a small spiritual treatise contained in the Chantilly manuscript collection, was also clearly identified as the work of La Sablière due to external and internal evidence.
Only in Menjot d’Elbenne’s critical edition of her writings (1923) were the three extant works of La Sablière finally available to the public. Her skill as a moraliste in Christian Maxims, Christian Thoughts, and in her correspondence with Rancé was now apparent.
The philosophical reflection of La Sablière focuses primarily on moral and religious questions. In the field of ethics, she dwells on the question of virtue. She critiques natural moral virtues as masks of vice, in particular as outcroppings of pride. Conversely, she exalts the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity as the necessary foundation for the conduct of a moral life. Like the moral virtues, the passions are treated with skepticism. It is the will, and not the emotions, that must ground the moral agent in the practice of authentic virtue. In her religious philosophy, she stresses the ascetical and mystical conditions necessary for a proper knowledge of the godhead shrouded in obscurity.
In Christian Maxims, La Sablière analyzes the moral life in terms of its characteristics of virtue and vice. On the surface, the moral life is a civil war between the paramount virtue of humility and the cardinal vice of pride. Beneath the surface, however, the moral virtues are often nothing more than disguised expressions of vice. Without the redemptive power of grace, the moral virtues are only frail counterfeits of authentic virtue and incapable of sustaining an ethical life.
On a superficial level, the moral life is a transparent struggle between the opposed forces of virtue and vice. For La Sablière, this struggle is ultimately a conflict between the virtue of humility and the vice of pride. Humility is the central moral virtue for the upright moral agent. “The true glory of a Christian does not consist in elevating oneself above others but in humbling oneself [CM no.59].” Pride is the vice corrupting much of human moral conduct. “Pride is the source of all our commotions and all our disturbances [CM no.75].” External moral conflict is the expression of this often hidden psychological conflict between pride and humility in the soul of the moral agent.
At a deeper level, the moral constitution of vice and virtue is more ambiguous. La Sablière argues that virtue is often scarcely masked vice. Many public displays of rigorous virtuous action are secretly fueled by the vice of pride. “We often lay down severe principles of conduct out of arrogance. We like to decorate ourselves with the appearance of virtue and it costs us nothing to give others an unsupportable yoke we would never give ourselves [CM no.23].” Even apparently humble actions are often vitiated by vice. “The sentiments of humility apparent in our words are insincere if at the same time we are angrily trying to convince others to accept what we say about ourselves [CM no.24].” Like the other virtues, humility in word and action often serves strategies of conquest rooted in self-interest.
La Sablière’s deflation of natural moral virtue does not spare the cardinal virtues. Prudence, a central cardinal virtue in the neo-Aristotelian ethics of the period, is dismissed as a species of self-interested risk management. “Prudence is cowardly and timid if it is not animated by the virtue of charity [CM no.72].” This hallowed virtue is only the disguised vice of cowardice. Similarly, La Sablière contests the humanist esteem of the alleged virtues of the pagan heroes of classical antiquity. Their vaunted courage has nothing to do with authentic virtue. “The virtue of the pagans occasionally induced them to scorn the world but only Christian virtue can make being scorned by the world something desirable [CM no.48].” The pagan contempt of the world, motivated by pride and the desire to manifest one’s superiority, has nothing in common with the saint’s contempt of the world, motivated by the love of God.
The enlightened moral agent should shun the cultivation of the natural moral virtues, given his fragility and proneness to hide substantial destructive vices. “If one recognized that virtues acquired with so much effort can quickly disappear in the commotion of the world, one would not seek his or her happiness in them. On the contrary, one would flee them as an enemy who only thinks about stealing our most precious treasures [CM no.51].” From La Sablière’s perspective, efforts to cultivate the moral virtues independently of the treasures of faith and grace can only produce disguised vices that will provide the moral agent with neither temporal nor eternal happiness. The good pagan, made virtuous through the self-disciplined exercise of freedom, is illusory in a human race ravaged by sin and concupiscence.
Christian Maxims argues that the possession of theological virtues is necessary for a proper perception of the moral order and for a personal capacity to adhere to the goods of that order. As gifts of God’s grace, these infused habits of the soul free their moral agent to abandon moral illusions (which are fabricated by a darkened intellect) and overcome the inconstancy of a will corrupted by sin. In her exaltation of the theological virtues as the foundations of an authentic moral life, La Sablière focuses on the principal theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.
Faith gives its believers a veridical vision of the moral order, she says, for it is an assent of the mind to truths revealed by God. It is only through faith, and not through the work of an intellect weakened by sin, that the moral agent can properly perceive the moral order and its demands. “Faith makes us regard as goods what the world regards as evils and as evils what the world regards as goods. And it is from the difference between these ideas that is born the different conduct of the just and of the sinful [CM no.11].” Rather than deepening the moral vision of the human intellect operating in the state of concupiscent weakness, faith initiates a perception of the moral order that contradicts the moral vision of fallen humanity. Rather than complementing it, faith squarely opposes the interpretation of morality proposed by the world in its confusion. Only in the light of faith, can the contours of the authentic moral order appear.
The theological virtue of hope is essential for endurance by the moral agent in the combat to be faithful to the demands of the moral order. Only hope for eternal union with God can sustain the moral agent in a spiritual warfare that contains many opportunities for despair. “If the hopes that we develop for our salvation are not rounded in God’s Word, they are false and misleading. In vain do we promise ourselves what God does not promise [CM no.80].” The hope here is none other than the hope of eternal life with God, rooted in the resurrection of Christ proclaimed by the Scriptures. The earthly hopes of self-improvement or social success are only counterfeits of authentic hope and incapable of sustaining the moral agent in the combat to adhere to the moral order.
The theological virtue of charity enjoys the primacy of the virtues grounding a proper moral life. La Sablière insists that charity is a matter of the will and not of the emotions. “The love that God demands of us is not a sensate love, but a preferential love, which commits us to sacrifice everything rather than displease Him [CM no.11].” The moral life is ultimately theocentric. For the mature moral agent, the deepest motivation for moral conduct is a love and fear of God that issues in sacrificial service.
For La Sablière, the theological virtues do not crown the natural moral virtues already operating in the moral agent. Without the theological virtues, the alleged moral virtues of the unredeemed moral agent are only the expressions of masked vice. Without faith, the perception of the moral order is illusory. Without hope, the moral combat against the world’s allures cannot be maintained. Without charity as the motive of ethical conduct, self-interest inevitably corrupts the will of the moral agent.
Like the moral virtues, the moral passions receive a critical assessment in Christian Maxims. For La Sablière, the emotions accompanying the moral and religious activity of the upright moral agent can easily mislead. It is the posture of the will, and not the vacillating passions accompanying the will, that determines the moral constitution of the agent. The confusion between the order of the will and the order of the passions often permits the moral and religious life to deteriorate into sentimentality.
Passions constitute a major obstacle to the work of moral reformation inspired by grace. Resolutions to pursue moral conduct requiring self-change are easily countered by the emotions of the moral agent. “Generally, we easily embrace the resolution to reform ourselves. We gladly toy with the idea of virtue. But as soon as we might fight some passion, the resolution weakens. We no longer feel capable of executing an intention we had formed without difficulty but that we cannot execute without doing violence to ourselves [CM no.254].” For La Sablière, the passions are simply the enemy of the will, especially in the painful work of moral reformation. Whereas other moralists of the period distinguished between beneficent and malevolent passions, La Sablière condemns the ensemble of emotions as a lethal threat to the moral life. “The desires inspired by the passions are the wishes of the sick. We cannot satisfy them without destroying ourselves and making ourselves miserable [CM no.84.].” La Sablière’s thoroughgoing critique of the passions reflects the voluntarism of her ethical theory. It is the will alone that is central in determining the character of the moral life. It also expresses her radical Augustinian view of concupiscent humanity, however. Even the emotions of the redeemed bear the distortions of sin; reliance on the emotions for moral guidance easily leads to error and moral decline.
In her critique of the passions, La Sablière devotes particular attention to the emotions surrounding the virtue of repentance. Authentic repentance resides in sorrow for past transgressions, restitution for the damage caused by the transgressions, and a firm resolution to avoid committing similar transgressions in the future. Sorrowful feelings that appear penitential, such as remorse and regret, are not necessarily the expression of virtue. “Only the sadness of penance is a reasonable sadness. All the others are marks of weakness or of the corruption of nature [CM no.54].” It is the will’s decisions, not vague feelings of sorrow, that indicate whether the moral agent has truly embraced the path of repentance central to authentic moral reformation.
Only in prayer can the soul successfully resist the empire of the passions. This combative prayer requires a certain amount of solitude. “We must separate ourselves from the world and in a certain way from ourselves in order to hear God in retreat. The tumult of the world and of the passions often prevents us from hearing Him [CM no.76].” For La Sablière, ethics is ultimately a question of ascetical and mystical theology. The resources to sustain a moral life grounded in the theological virtues and undimmed by the sentimentality of the passions can only emerge in a life of disciplined religious meditation. Contemplative attentiveness to God’s spirit is the pathway to the union with God’s will that is the wellspring of authentic moral conduct.
The faith-centered struggle to live a moral life free of illusory virtues and distorting passions reaches its culmination in the union of the human will with the divine will. Christian Thoughts [CT] describes the abandonment of the soul to God that seals the efforts of the upright moral agent to conduct a life grounded on the theological virtues. This account of mystical union as a species of psychological abandonment is also an exercise in religious epistemology. The fullest knowledge of God possible for the human person is a negative one: a grasp of God’s essence through the immediate presence of God and not through the path of images or concepts referring to God. This apophatic knowledge of God requires an abolition of the work of the imagination and of the intellect.
The essential spiritual condition for this union with and knowledge of God is complete detachment. Renunciation of the world is psychic as well as moral. “Consider everything created as if it did not exist and as if it had already returned to the nothingness toward which it runs [CT no.6].” Detachment from self is even more demanding than detachment from the world. The memory requires purification. “Forget everything that the memory has retained. Use it only for God and for our state in life [CT no.4].” Similarly, the intellect must be freed from worldly concerns. “Empty our understanding. Use its operations only for God and for the state where he has placed us [CT no.3].” The will should avoid dissipation and should focus its affections on God alone. “We must keep our mind for considering God alone and our heart for loving God alone [CT no.15].” This insistence on a severe asceticism of the human faculties of memory, intellect, and will reflects the radical theocentrism of La Sablière’s ethics. Only a complete absorption within God can permit the moral agent to conduct an authentic moral life. But it also reflects the apophatic cast of La Sablière’s theory of religious knowledge. The quieting of the faculties of memory, intellect, and will is essential for the immediate recognition of God’s being that emerges in mystical union.
Christian Thoughts evokes the union with God that is the ultimate goal of the ascetical and mystical itinerary of the moral agent. The immediate grasp of God abolishes the need for discursive reflection. “Only consider God working in our soul. We should not add any of our own reflections [CT no.10].” Using the rhetoric of the via negativa (or negative way), La Sablière describes this mature knowledge of God as a species of forgetting. “We should hold our state of being lost in God, considering only Him as our only principle [CT no.11].” Repeated references to the void, nothingness, and sense of loss typifying this state of union reinforce the apophatic nature of mature religious knowledge according to Christian Thoughts.
This account of the knowledge of and union with God affected through self-abandonment reflects the austerity of the spirituality defended by La Sablière’s spiritual director Rancé and the longstanding tradition of apophatic mysticism within Catholicism. It also echoes the spirituality of Quietism, the dissident movement in early modern Catholicism that reached its apogee of influence in the 1690s. For the Quietists, authentic union with God required the abandonment of meditation, which they based on imaginative projection and discursive reflection in favor of meditation conceived as simple self-abandonment to the will of God. For La Sablière, the most mature knowledge of God emerges in the immediate recognition of Him by a human will abandoned to Him. It is this mystical union, veiled in obscurity, that points to God more accurately than can discursive reflection on the divine attributes. Like ethics, religious epistemology ultimately flowers in mystical theology.
Until recently, the canon of La Sablière has received only cursory philosophical attention. Several facts explain this eclipse of an author celebrated as a savante and as a moraliste during her lifetime. The misattribution of the works of La Sablière during the two centuries following her death primarily contributed to her name becoming obscured. Only the scholarly work of Menjot d’Elbenne in the early twentieth century permitted the reconstitution of the canon of her works. Her presence in intellectual history as the patron of La Fontaine also obscured her own philosophical contributions. Philosophical chronicles occasionally characterized her as a salon Cartesian (though there are few traces of Descartes in her actual writings) and as the protector of the anti-Cartesian La Fontaine, but her own philosophical and theological views disappeared from view. Like other salonnières of the period, La Sablière suffered from the ridicule with which the culture of the salon was treated by leading male authors of the era. In Book X of his influential Satires, the literary critic Boileau mocked La Sablière as an amateurish pedant who possessed only the veneer of literary and scientific culture. Her telescope (compared to inverted drinking glasses) and her Latin phrases (allegedly full of grammatical errors) are dismissed as a caricature of true intellectual distinction. Unsurprisingly, such misogynist stereotypes of the salonnière stamped La Sablière’s work as devoid of philosophical interest.
Recent commentaries on La Sablière’s writings have restored her status as a moraliste. Her contributions to virtue theory and to moral psychology are more evident. The theological framework in which she develops her ethical arguments, however, is still obscured. Part of the contemporary interest in the moral philosophy of La Sablière is her construction of a distinctively theological, indeed mystical, account of the mature moral life. The theological virtues emerge as the source of, and not the complement to, a life of authentic moral virtue. Sacramental practice and personal meditation are the necessary conditions for the creation and maintenance of a human will truly devoted to the moral good. Like certain contemporary Christian ethicists, La Sablière contests the value of a natural-law ethics because the “nature” on which such an ethics is based is a nature corrupted by sin and indentured to the vices of the world. Her neo-Augustinian moral philosophy is a defense of an ethical code explicitly rooted in grace, the theological virtues, and divine illumination.
All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola College in Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 14, 2008 | Originally published: