A mistress of Louis XIV, who became a Carmelite nun, Mademoiselle de la Vallière has long fascinated historians and novelists by her picaresque life. But only recently has the philosophical dimension of that life received attention. During her years as royal mistress, La Vallière studied the works of Aristotle and Descartes in the literary salons of Paris. After her religious conversion under the direction of Bossuet, she composed a treatise dealing with the mercy of God. In this work and in her correspondence, La Vallière revealed her skill as a moraliste, a critic of the contradictions and subterfuges of the human psyche. Her writings focus in particular on virtue theory. La Vallière privileges the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity; she criticizes the unredeemed cardinal virtues as masks of human pride. As a social critic, La Vallière demonstrates how the culture of the court has produced counterfeits of the theological virtues. Her writings insist on the necessary presence of grace for the emergence of authentic virtue, as well as express skepticism on the capacity of nature alone to cultivate virtue. Rather than being abolished, the human passions undergo their own conversion in the grace-induced dynamic of repentance and reform.
On August 6, 1644, Louise-Françoise de la Baume Le Blanc de laVallière was born into an aristocratic family in Tours. Both parents claimed a distinguished lineage. Her father, Laurent, Seigneur de la Vallière, descended from a family noted for its military service to the French crown. At the time of his daughter’s birth, he held the post of governor of the royal chateau of Amboise. Descended from a noblesse de robe family known for its legal service to the throne, her mother, Françoise Le Prévost, was the widow of a prominent member of the parliament in Paris. After the death of Louise-Françoise’s father in 1651, Jacques de Courtavel, marquis de Saint Rémy, married her newly widowed mother. In the recurrent struggles between the absolutist French monarchy and the restive aristocracy attempting to maintain its ancient privileges, the members of the La Vallière family sided with the royalist cause.
Mademoiselle de la Vallière was raised in a militantly Catholic provincial aristocracy. Ecclesiastical vocations were common in her immediate family. Uncle Gilles was bishop of Nantes; Uncle Jacques was a Jesuit priest; Aunts Élisabeth and Charlotte were Ursuline nuns. La Vallière’s formal education was primarily literary. Under the tutelage of her Urusuline aunts, the young Louis-Françoise studied grammar, reading, composition, and public speaking. In 1655, she moved to the chateau of Blois for her adolescent education. The official residence of Gaston, duc d’Orléans, the brother of Louis XIII, Blois permitted La Vallière to join the Orléans daughters in the courses conducted by the house chaplain, Abbé de Rancé, a cultured theologian who would later emerge as one of France’s leading monastic reformers. In this royal curriculum, La Vallière studied the arts of painting, music, etiquette, and equitation as well as continuing her literary studies. Under the guidance of Rancé, she was introduced to the neo-Aristotelian elements of the catechesis mandated by the Council of Trent.
Closely tied to the royal family, La Vallière made her official debut at court in 1661 when she was appointed a lady-in-waiting to Henriette d’Angleterre, the wife of Louis, duc d’Orléans. At the moment of her arrival, court gossips were criticizing the excessive amount of private time Louis XIV was spending with his beautiful sister-in-law. Royal counselors encouraged the king to deflect the rumors of an incestuous affair by appearing to express romantic interest in the new member of Henriette’s entourage, La Vallière. The royal secretary Dangeau ghostwrote a series of romantic letters allegedly written by Louis XIV and La Vallière; other courtiers arranged late-night meetings between the king and the lady-in-waiting that projected the air of a romantic tryst. The ruse quickly became fact as Louis XIV become infatuated with the cultured new courtier. La Vallière was recognized as the official royal mistress and bore the king four children: Charles (1663-65), Philippe (1665-66), Marie Anne de Bourbon (1666-1739), and Louis de Bourbon (1667-83). The king later legitimized his two surviving children and ennobled them under the respective titles Mademoiselle de Blois and Comte de Vermandois.
During her years as royal mistress, La Vallière continued to pursue her artistic and literary interests. She attended performances of Racine and Molière, read the period’s fashionable novels, and took courses in painting at the Académie Royale. La Vallière showed a predilection for philosophical issues. In salon circles, she was known for her well-informed discussions on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Descartes’s Discourse on Method. Her circle of close intellectual friends was dominated by thinkers of a libertine tendency, notably Benserade and Lauzun.
In 1667, Louis XIV elevated La Vallière’s social status further by granting her the title of Duchesse de Vaujours, accompanied by the substantial estate at Vaujours. But 1667 also marked the end of La Vallière’s ascendancy with the emergence of a rival, Madame de Montespan, who would ultimately displace La Vallière in the affection of the monarch and become the principal royal mistress.
Long troubled by scruples over her adulterous affair, La Vallière underwent a religious crisis in 1670. After recovering from a serious illness, possibly smallpox, she made a confession of her sins and returned to the regular practice of the Catholic faith. Under the direction of the court preacher Bossuet, La Vallière abandoned the social activities of the court and began to lead a penitential life of prayer and mortification. Renouncing her former libertine allies, La Vallière allied herself to the parti dévot, a group of pious lay courtiers who opposed the moral decadence of the court. In her new spiritual reading, La Vallière discovered the works of the Catholic Counter-Reformation, in particular Saint Teresa of Avila’s Path of Perfection, with its ascetical and mystical conception of virtue and beatitude. Under the influence of Bossuet in 1671, La Vallière wrote a theological work, Reflections on the Mercy of God, which paralleled the divine attribute of mercy with the virtues proper to the repentant sinner.
The sudden conversion of a Versailles courtesan turned La Vallière into a religious celebrity but humiliated Louis XIV, whose sexual infidelities and religious hypocrisy had become public knowledge. Only in 1674 did the monarch permit his former mistress to pursue her vocation as a nun. On April 19, 1674, La Vallière entered the Carmelite convent in Paris, where she would henceforth be known as Soeur Louise de la Miséricorde. Preaching to a convent packed by the capital’s religious elite, Bishop Jean-Louis de Fromentière of Aires denounced the immorality of the court at Versailles; according to the bishop, La Vallière’s entry into the austerity of Carmel amounted to a moral miracle. On June 4, 1675, Soeur Louise pronounced her vows as a Carmelite nun. Queen Marie-Thérèse, the wife of Louis XIV, personally headed the congregation and witnessed the apotheosis of the former courtesan who had defied Versailles. Preaching at the ceremony of profession, Bossuet pointedly drew the lesson that even the world’s most powerful persons must repent of their sins and cease their abuses of power.
During her secluded decades in the convent, Soeur Louise de la Miséricorde lived an exemplary life as a Carmelite nun, noted for the rigor of her penitential practices. She did, however, continue the correspondence she had begun during her conversion with the lay leader of the parti dévot, Maréchal de Bellefonds. Her letters show the clear spiritual influence of the école française by their recurrent stress on abandonment to divine providence and on annihilation of the self. They also contain an ongoing critique of the immorality, violent ambition, and practical atheism she had witnessed in her court years. In the convent parlor, Soeur Louise occasionally received acquaintances from her previous life: Rancé, Bossuet, Queen Marie-Thérèse, even her old rival, Madame de Montespan, who had also fallen from her former status as royal mistress.
Mademoiselle de la Vallière died on June 6, 1710.
La Vallière left two principal works to posterity: the treatise Reflections on the Mercy of God and her spiritual correspondence with the Maréchal de Bellefonds. The erratic history of the commentary and publication of these two works indicate how easily the philosophical reflection of women authors has been erased from the canon.
In 1671 in the immediate aftermath of her religious conversion, La Vallière composed Reflections on the Mercy of God. A semi-autobiographical work, this treatise studies the mercy of God for sinners, especially for courtesans who have renounced their sexual sins and sought a new penitential life in exile from the excesses of the court. The author appeals to feminine figures of repentance and sanctity in the New Testament, notably Saint Mary Magdalene, as paradigms of the conversion which La Vallière has undergone. The work studies how faith, hope, charity, and other theological virtues function in the life of those led to authentic moral reformation through the action of grace. Conversely, it dissects the false variants of faith, hope, and charity produced by the court culture of ambition and avarice. The influence of the theology of Bossuet, her spiritual director during the crisis of conversion, is apparent in the text, although the simple, limpid prose style differs markedly from the more rhetorical and periodic style of Bossuet himself.
The first print edition of Reflections on the Mercy of God appeared anonymously in 1680. A popular work of piety, the book had undergone ten editions by the beginning of the eighteenth century. La Vallière was always considered the author of the book, which was clearly written in her style and full of allusions to her life as a courtesan. Many editions published in her lifetime, such as the Frankfurt and Brussels editions in 1683, explicitly named her as the author, with no demurral from Soeur Louise or her associates. In the nineteenth-century, literary critics noted that the later editions of Reflections used a longer and somewhat more elegant version of the text than had the earlier editions. In 1852, Damas-Hinard claimed that the true author of the book was Bossuet, for whom La Vallière had only served as an amanuensis, but other critics dismissed the claim on the grounds of stylistic differences with Bossuet’s others’ works and of the clearly gendered autobiographical experiences the author had incorporated into the work. Although Bossuet had incontestably influenced the theological opinions of La Vallière and a later editor had imposed some stylistic alterations, the text remained substantially La Vallière’s own.
In 1928, the literary critic Marcel Langlois made a more startling claim: that La Vallière had not written the book at all. Langlois based this claim on the argument that the rationalist tone of the work indicated that it was written by a man rather than by a woman. Furthermore, no woman of the period could have possessed the philosophical and theological culture which the author clearly displays. “We observe that the author reads Holy Scripture in Latin and that he makes references to Aristotle and Descartes. A careful look at the text indicates that there is no trace of a feminine style. We know that Mademoiselle de la Vallière was very depressed at this time and that she was a shy person all her life. On the contrary, on every page, we hear the voice of a man, of a director of conscience.” Led by Jean-Baptiste Eriau, other literary critics immediately refuted Langlois’s claim and reattributed the authorship of the work to La Vallière. They pointed out that La Vallière was renowned precisely for her command of Aristotle and Descartes in salon debates and that many cultured laywomen of the period possessed bilingual Latin-French psalters and New Testaments. The recent textual analyses by Petitfils (1990) and Huertas (1998) have reconfirmed the duchess’s authorship of Reflections on the Mercy of God.
La Vallière’s other extant work, her correspondence with the Maréchal de Bellefonds, underwent a similarly tangled publication history. The first edition of her letters (1767) was so full of errors, omissions, and interpellations as to be corrupt. Her alleged memoirs (1829) were a fabrication. Only Pierre Clément’s two-volume edition of her works in 1860 provided the first reliable publication of her letters to Bellefonds. Her correspondence explores the ascetical and mystical sentiments of the soul and continues the critique of the moral corruption to which the courtier is prone.
The primary philosophical interest in the works of La Vallière resides in her treatment of virtue in Reflections on the Mercy of God. She rejects the claims of pagan antiquity to have possessed authentic moral virtues, exalts the theological virtues, and criticizes the moral values of the court as a distortion of the theological virtues, altered to suit ambitious self-interest. Grace, rather than human merit, emerges as the cause of authentic virtue. Instead of minimizing the passions as a hindrance to the cultivation of virtue, La Vallière esteems the human emotions, especially the passion of love, as central to the moral personality of the human agent redeemed by grace.
In Reflections on the Mercy of God, La Vallière develops her theory of the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity. The treatise also diagnoses the opponents and the distortions of the theological virtues in the aristocratic society of the period.
Faith emerges as more than an assent to the truths revealed by God and proposed by the teaching authority of the Catholic Church; it entails a militant opposition to the world. This firmness of faith brooks no compromise with worldly allurements. “O my God, give me…a firm faith that makes me believe in Your words and makes me remember, when the world wants me to follow it, that we cannot serve two masters” (RMD no.4). When authentic, this militant faith comports two other virtues: humility and enlightenment. The humility of faith closely ties the believer to the imitation of Jesus crucified, the opposite of conformity to the world’s concept of glory. A properly enlightened faith continually reminds the believer of the radical superiority of eternal God over the fleeting world in terms of glory.
In her analysis of faith, La Vallière diagnoses the enemies of faith in the cultured society of her age. Three positions in particular earn her rebuke: conventionalism, libertinism, and rationalism. Religious conventionalism has reduced to faith a matter of external ritual, shorn of interior moral conversion. “These are persons who, in the midst of shadows that blind them, refuse to be enlightened by the light of these theological truths. We could say that a soul sunk within the world, without prayer, without reflection, and without consulting God on questions of conduct, is similar to a ship with neither captain nor rudder in the midst of a storm” (RMD no. 22). For the conventional, faith is a simple matter of social conformity.
Libertinism proposes a more explicit rejection of the virtue of faith. Its posture is marked by contempt for the very enterprise of religion. “I will flee with horror all those evil people who parade their libertinism, who brag about their vices, and who, as Scripture says, never consider God in their conduct….These militant libertines can only help to foster irreligion, to destroy the purest reputation, to give us an exaggerated sense of self-worth that merits Your abandonment of us, to honor evil and those who commit it” (RMD no. 15). The libertinism censured in this passage is clearly that of the courtier. The destruction of reputation by malicious gossip and the vanity of proximity to power are the vices of the libertine courtier who holds traditional religion and its allied virtue of humility in contempt.
More subtle than libertinism, rationalism erodes faith by subjecting what lies beyond human reason to the judgment of fallible human reason. La Vallière defends the orthodox faith of those who resist the rationalist attacks on the supernatural. “I speak of those who are astonished to learn that there are some people who believe the histories of Alexander and Caesar but who doubt the history of Jesus Christ…who believe the truth of the gospel preached by a dozen poor preachers and of the establishment of His Church founded on an infinite number of miracles…who believe that so many mysteries incomprehensible to the human mind are pure effects of the omnipotence of Jesus Christ and of His infinite love toward His creatures” (RMD no.22). This critique of rationalism defends the supernatural nature of the object of Christian faith by refusing to remove the miraculous and the mysterious from the content of faith. Tellingly, it attacks historical-critical analysis of the Scriptures, which would undercut the historical veracity of the life of Christ. In this particular line of attack, La Vallière is clearly influenced by her spiritual director Bossuet, who in the 1670s combated the historical-critical exegesis of Richard Simon, an Oratorian scholar who challenged the traditional thesis of the Mosaic authorship of the entire Pentateuch, the five opening books of the Bible.
In her treatment of hope, La Vallière similarly distinguishes between the authentic virtue and its counterfeits in the milieu of the court. True hope emerges as trust in the redemptive power of God. “I implore you, Lord, by the merit of this precious blood that flows from Your sacred wounds that You offer to the eternal Father as the price of my redemption, a true confidence in Your mercies” (RMD no.7). Hope can easily deteriorate into presumption when the sinner forgets divine justice and uses divine mercy as an excuse to delay repentance and moral reform. “If You are a God full of compassion for sinners who return to You with all their hearts with hope in Your mercy, You are a terrifying God toward those who trust in You only to multiply their own offenses and who, having tasted the sweetness of your graces, only mock and hold them in contempt” (RMD no. 7).
In court society, theological hope has been eclipsed by the predominance of a purely secular hope for political and economic advancement. The egocentric hopes of ambition have crowded out the authentic hope of eternal life in Christ. “May this solid hope, showing me the nothingness and fragility of everything we call here below position, fortune, wealth, and grandeur, make me no longer esteem them as most people esteem them. They act as if no other happiness and no other life exist after this one” (RMD no.16). The danger of such a careerist hope is that it ignores rather than explicitly opposes the theological hope of immortality. In such a purely terrestrial version of hope, the promise of eternity simply vanishes from concern.
Like other Christian writers, La Vallière accords primacy to the virtue of charity among the theological virtues. Authentic charity is tempered by courage, the willingness to accept the world’s mockery out of fidelity to God. “Create a new heart in me: a humble, firm, constant, and courageous heart, free from the world and its creatures─a truly Christian heart, whereby I will love You when I must sacrifice my life and fortune in witness to Your name and pay homage to the folly of the cross at the heart of a country and of a nation that consider it a scandal” (RMD no.11). La Vallière’s concept of charity is not one of simple affection toward God and neighbor; it is contextualized as the love of God manifested in a society whose pride and self-esteem hold the cross, the central symbol of God’s love, in contempt.
The opposition to authentic charity is not generic hatred or indifference; it is specifically the contempt of others manifest by an ambitious aristocracy. The malicious gossip of the courtier and of the salonnière is a prominent symptom of the contempt by which the neighbor is humiliated in court society. “We only prize these gross sarcastic remarks and personal attacks, unworthy even for a pagan. We consider as of no consequence words which attack the very soul of our neighbors, which mockingly dissect their faults and which make them appear ridiculous….We dismiss as nothing the destruction of their happiness and reputation as long as we do it with an entertaining laugh” (RMD no.17). In this passage, the aristocratic society of wit is unmasked as the determined enemy of authentic charity, which finds its apotheosis in the humble sacrifice of the cross.
For La Vallière, nature itself cannot cause moral virtue to exist, since nature exists in a state of postlapsarian corruption. All moral virtue, and not only the theological virtues, requires God’s grace to emerge and mature.
Reflections on the Mercy of God argues that traditional moral virtues, even the cardinal virtues, are only masks for various vices. The alleged virtue of prudence, for example, dissembles the human desire for security. “God did not take flesh and die for us in order to grant our salvation through a comfortable life, according to the prudence of the sense and of the flesh….These moral virtues have no merit whatsoever before You if they are not animated by the merits and virtues of Jesus Christ” (RMD no.6). Freed from the ingrained self-centeredness of human nature, authentic moral virtues constitute variations of the theological virtues, which are in turn the unmerited gift of God’s grace rather than products of human initiative.
This disjunction between apparent natural virtue and authentic supernatural virtue extends to the realm of intellectual virtue. La Vallière sharply opposes the natural wisdom of the world, prized by philosophers, to the wisdom of the cross, revealed only by divine grace. “Give me…less human and natural lights, out of fear that by following them rather than the lights of Your grace, I would lose myself. By following them, instead of being a humble Christian, my self-love would turn me into a socialite philosopher, filled more with false maxims than with the science of the cross….This is the wisdom God hides from the haughty and reveals to the humble. This is the wisdom which overturns prudence and which follows the movements of grace from Jesus Christ” (RMD no.5). Rather than building on the wisdom of the world, the grace-inspired wisdom of the cross reveals the falsehood of the world’s account of what is true and valuable. In the exercises of the intellect as in those of the will, only grace can permit the human agent to embrace actual, rather than counterfeit, goods.
Whereas other moral philosophers of the period discounted or dismissed the passions in their account of the moral life, La Vallière places a positive value upon them in her ethical theory. Rather than being suppressed, the human passions should be presented to God for transformation in the itinerary of religious and moral conversion. “Is it right that having found everything possible to satisfy my passions, which only had idols for their object, I find it difficult or impossible when I have to resurrect the passions and love You with all my heart?” (RMD no.12) Just as the intellect and will must be transformed by grace through the acquisition of authentic wisdom and moral virtue, the emotions must be transformed by God into new sentiments of reverence and devotion. It is love above all that must be altered from the self-centered quest for human esteem into the self-sacrificial adoration of God’s very self.
Prayerful meditation constitutes the privileged locus for the human agent to undergo this grace-inspired emotional transformation. Rather than abolishing the human quest for pleasure, contemplation substitutes spiritual pleasure for the physical pleasures once sought by the sinful. “There [in meditation] You make us find a holy and sovereign pleasure to love You above all things and to come often to speak to You, not only as our father and our God, but as the most tender friend we could ever have. We come to lament before You about all of these passions that tyrannize us, about all these worries that upset us, and about all this sadness that exhausts us. In the sweet exchange of prayer, we may show You the bottom of our hearts” (RMD no.19). In this dialogical form of meditation, the meditant may present his or her emotional distresses before God for healing, just as he or she presents sins for forgiveness. The mature fruit of such meditation is an unconditional love for God that slowly integrates once disordered passions into authentic charity for one’s neighbor.
The reception of the writings of Mademoiselle de La Vallière roughly follows three distinct phases: the devotional, the literary, and the philosophical. In the late seventeenth, eighteenth, and early nineteenth centuries, La Vallière’s Reflections on the Mercy of God constituted a staple of French Catholic devotional literature. Many commentators celebrated her as the French Magdalene and compared her to earlier examples of courtesans who had become public penitents, such as Saint Mary of Alexandria. Madame de Genlis’s popular biography of La Vallière (1818) reflects this devotional image of the royal mistress who miraculously became a cloistered nun.
In the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, commentators focused more on the literary dimensions of La Vallière. Illustrated by the works of Cornut (1857), Langlois (1932), and Eriau (1961), the protracted quarrel over the authorship of Reflections on the Mercy of God reflects this literary approach. Petitfils (1990) has continued this scholarly concern for textual questions concerning La Vallière.
Recently, in such commentaries as those of Huertas (1998) and of Conley (2002), a greater emphasis has been given to the intellectual formation and philosophical theories of La Vallière. Recent interest in virtue theory of moral philosophy and the development of a more sectarian ethics in recent Christian moral theology has highlighted the interest of La Vallière’s thesis that authentic moral and intellectual virtue is grounded in grace rather than in nature. The recent feminist expansion of the canon of humanities has also underscored the claims of La Vallière to philosophical status, given her study of canonical philosophers such as Aristotle and Descartes, and also given her contributions to moral psychology through her treatise and correspondence.
All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.
John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.
Last updated: September 12, 2009 | Originally published: