The law and economics movement applies economic theory and method to the practice of law. It asserts that the tools of economic reasoning offer the best possibility for justified and consistent legal practice. It is arguably one of the dominant theories of jurisprudence. The law and economics movement offers a general theory of law as well as conceptual tools for the clarification and improvement of its practices. The general theory is that law is best viewed as a social tool that promotes economic efficiency, that economic analysis and efficiency as an ideal can guide legal practice. It also considers how legislation should be used to improve market conditions in return. Law and economics offers a framework with which to model legal outcomes, and common objectives with which to unify disparate areas of legal activity. The bringing together of legal theory and economic reasoning has also created new research agendas in the fields of behavioral economics: how rationality affects people’s behavior within legal scenarios; public choice theory and how collective behavior should have an effect on legislation; and game theory: understanding strategic action in a legal context.
Most traditional theories of jurisprudence look to uncover the essential or definitive aspects of the institution of law. Two of the most influential are Legal Positivism and Dworkin’s Law as Integrity. While these two differ as to their definition of law and legal reasoning, they agree upon some basic central assumptions, determining the conclusions that two philosophical investigations with largely the same aims, can reach. Because of this it is important to acknowledge some of the assumptions that are held in common by these jurisprudential stances.
First, both theories agree upon the conceptual nature of jurisprudence. Both agree that it is important for a philosophical theory of law to define the core aspects of proper legal practice in order to fulfill the function of philosophical jurisprudence. In fact, much philosophical discussion of law assumes that such a characterization is the essential aim of jurisprudence. Second in order to arrive at a properly analyzed concept of law, both legal positivism and law as integrity are best constructed from specific techniques of analytic and linguistic philosophy. These techniques include the investigation and clarification of the way people commonly speak about law and careful parsing of social practice that separate the legal from the non-legal. The third common assumption is that the best way to understand legal practice is to understand the necessary and sufficient qualities that make some rule or statement into a law. Once such a set of necessary and sufficient conditions is identified (or approximated) it is thought that the essential aspects of particularly legal practices have been understood.
Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best understood through its function as a social tool promoting economic efficiency, in common with other social practices.
Instead of following this path, theorists within the law and economics movement have attacked the study of law from another angle. Rather than trying to identify unique conceptual aspects of law, what is advocated is an investigation of legal practices through the means of economic analysis. The conclusion offered is that legal practice is best described by its purported function as a social tool aiming at the promotion of economic efficiency – something it has in common with other social practices.
So, instead of looking for the unique and defining features of law, the practitioner of law and economics looks at law as a social tool and tries to evaluate it functionally. What is emphasized is not its uniqueness as an institution, but its place within the general and common economic structure of society. The descriptive claim most often associated with law and economics is that legal practices are best characterized as tools for encouraging economically efficient social relations. To understand this claim it is important to examine some of the basic concepts used in models of economic reasoning.
Essential to an understanding of the law and economics movement is a set of fundamental concepts. The most central assumption in economics is that human beings are rational maximizers of their individual satisfactions, and, in turn, respond to incentives. A rational maximizer of personal satisfaction adjusts means to ends in the most efficient way possible. It is important to realize that economics, as understood here, is not restricted to analysis of monetary issues; there are nonmonetary as well as monetary satisfactions. Every potential satisfaction is implicated in the calculus of economic satisfactions and therefore can be investigated according to economic or means-end rationality and the trade-off of costs and benefits. Normally what is aimed at through economic reasoning is the improvement of efficiency.
A more efficient allocation is one that increases the net value of resources. Efficiency in the allocation of resources is distinguished from equity, which is concerned with justice in the distribution of wealth. Because some people value specific goods higher or lower than others, economic efficiency can often be raised through voluntary transfers of goods. The most common example of a transfer promoting efficiency is that of a freely entered into contractual relationship. Because one party to the transaction values money more than the item owned, and the other values the item owned more than the asking price, the exchange produces a net gain in economic goods. Each person ends up better off than before. Some economists have gone so far as to argue that such a contractual exchange is morally optimal because it works within both Kantian and utilitarian theories of morality. They argue that it works with Kantian theories because a contract is thought to represent a good example of interaction between free and rational agents. It works with utilitarianism because the idea of wealth maximization intuitively translates into more utility.
Economists have a variety of terms to describe possible outcomes of economic exchanges. For instance Pareto optimality is defined as a point where resources are allocated such that no one is willing to trade further. Pareto optimality is the eventual endpoint of a series of Pareto superior moves. A Pareto superior change makes at least one person better of without making anyone worse off. Because no one is worse off after the trade there are no losers in Pareto improvements, although there may be many different Pareto optimal endpoints. Furthermore, economists have developed the concept of Kaldor-Hicks efficiency to compensate for obstacles to freely contracted exchanges. Kaldor-Hicks efficiency, or potential Pareto superiority, results when the overall economic gains outweigh the losses. In other words, the gains in economic efficiency are large enough that the winners could, if they had to, compensate the losers in the new allocation of goods and still remain better off.
The law and economics movement claims that law is best understood as a tool to promote economic efficiency. But how can the institution of law help encourage efficient transactions? One way is to help avoid situations that lead to market failure. One example of market failure is the existence of monopolies: a situation where one party is able to extract more profit from a good than a healthy market would allow. Law can be used as a tool to ensure that monopoly situations are hard to bring about and maintain. Another way legal systems can be used to ensure economically efficient transactions is through the enforcement of valid contracts. By ensuring compliance with contractual terms courts can give parties to a contract confidence that the other party will fulfill the agreed-to obligations. This becomes especially important in situations where the parties must complete their obligations at different times.
But some types of market failure are less obvious, and the legal means toward remedying them subtler. One problem in market transactions is that of externalities. An externality is a cost not reflected in the market price of a good. For instance, a factory may not have to internalize the costs it imposes upon the environment into the selling price of its goods. In this case the market price of the good will not reflect its real cost – and therefore some of the costs are imposed upon parties in an involuntary manner. Pigou argues in regard to this that legal means should be used to impose a marginal tax upon the offending party, to internalize any externalities. The economist Coase argued that this conclusion, while warranted in specific cases, was too global. Coase argued that in a market where transactions are costless and people do not act strategically, rights assignments are irrelevant because from any starting point the results will be economically efficient. In other words, the Coase Theorem states that if there are no transaction costs the assignment of entitlements will be irrelevant to the goal of allocative efficiency. In such a situation there will be no need for law to internalize costs because people will bargain to the most efficient possible allocation of goods. But outside of conceptually ideal markets there are always transaction costs such as information costs, opportunity costs and administrative costs. If transaction costs are somewhat high, then it does matter how property rights are assigned. Therefore the enforcement and allocation of legal entitlements will be an important factor in ensuring economically efficient exchanges. So law can be used to encourage economic efficiency. But is all law best described in economic terms?
It may be no real surprise that law often is used to encourage efficient exchanges. But it seems a stretch to claim that law as an institution is best completely described in economic terms. It seems counterintuitive to view all law as based upon market principles. What the economic analysis of law manages, though , is to see such disparate areas as contract, tort and criminal law as all based upon economic aims, therefore giving law a more coherent basis than other theories can offer. Richard Posner argues that tort cases – those involving private harm – can be seen as contractual by looking for the hypothetical terms that the parties to an accident would have agreed to in advance in order to bring about the accident voluntarily. Also that criminals are deterred by the threat of punishment only if the likelihood of punishment multiplied by the quantity of punishment exceeds the gain offered by the criminal act. Scholars have been quite effective in extending the tools of economic analysis into areas that seem to be anything but economic in nature. Even rules of evidence and legal ethics have proved amenable to economic analysis. However, it may be argued that an economic explanation of law fails on two counts. Firstly as a descriptive analysis it doesn’t do justice to everyday legal conceptions. Secondly as an analytical analysis of the necessary conditions for the practice of law it may not be able to account for the internal point of view which Hart thought so central to a proper understanding of law. More analytical approaches to economic explanation of law have considered this a fatal flaw in the project (see Coleman 2001). This may be mistakenly importing traditional philosophical aims into a drastically different project, but the truth is that it is often hard to tell what types of theoretical claims are being made within law and economics. If the claims are of exhaustive descriptive accuracy or of the necessary and sufficient conceptual foundations of law then it is more than likely a failure. But whether or not law and economics is an accurate or even conceptually necessary description of law as a social institution, and whether or not it suffices as a complete analysis of law, it could be argued that law should in any case adopt economic efficiency as the central aim guiding judicial decision-making.
Though analytically incomplete, economic analysis models the actual results of legal institutions better than any other theory. This does not entail, however, that law ought to be consciously used for such an aim. Might not law be better used to consider issues related to justice, duty and the like? Advocates of law and economics have argued against such a conclusion. The arguments usually are of two types. First, it is claimed that meanings of words such as justice or duty are so vague and in dispute that the use of such concepts for a basis of judicial decisions offers no guidance whatsoever. It is argued that while such concepts are unhelpfully complex, the tools of economic analysis and the concept of economic efficiency are sufficiently clear to provide the judge a solid and predictable basis of decision. Law is better able to decide according to efficiency rather than justice or duty due to limitations of institutional competence. This might be so if issues of justice are so complex as to involve information that courts are structurally unable to process. Second, it has been argued that because the paradigm case of justice is the freely entered in to contract, law is best seen as a tool to optimize contractual arrangements. If this is so, then where law can help is in situations where transaction costs are so high as to prohibit efficient contractual relationships. Here Posner argues that law can encourage economic efficiency by assigning property rights to those parties who would have secured them through market exchange if transaction costs were lower. In other words law should bring about allocations that mimic the results of a properly functioning market. In addition, advocates of economic analysis of law make a claim that other jurisprudential traditions seem to be unable to: that the analytic tools offered by law and economics has encouraged the further creation of other productive areas for analyzing law (see Posner 1998).
Another argument for the fertility of the economic analysis of law is that it has spawned a number of further tools that seem helpful in understanding legal institutions. Three of the most important of these are the results of behavioral economics, game theory and public choice theory.
Practitioners of behavioral law and economics examine human limits to means-end rationality. One of the outcomes of behavioral economics is the concept of bounded rationality. Bounded rationality means that information is not processed according to a model of perfect means-end rationality but, to the contrary, is distorted due to limits of our cognitive abilities. For instance the endowment effect is thought to be a behavioral limit that distorts the proper valuation of property, an important aspect of bargaining to efficient outcomes. According to the effect, the ownership of objects creates an irrational cognitive overvaluation of them. Another claim is that our cognitive abilities are distorted by the availability heuristic. According to this the availability of strong imagery may induce us to over or underestimate the actual probability of events associated with the image. For instance, graphic representations of highly improbable harms might be more influential on behavior and demand unjustified use of resources than statistical analysis showing another equally undesirable harm to be more common and easier to avoid. Jurisprudential practices could be significantly influenced by such results. For instance, judges might be as irrationally influenced by the availability heuristic as other human beings. Therefore victim impact statements might be important correctives to proceedings if a well-presented defendant’s presence in the court skews judge or jury’s decisions. An awareness of such a cognitive failure could help adjust legal reasoning and its conclusions accordingly. Finally, an awareness and exploitation of universal cognitive limits might help legislators to design more effective laws (see Sunstein 2000).
Game theory adds to economic modeling the phenomenon of strategic action. Strategic actions are those adopted because of the competitive nature of many social transactions. They are adopted due to how one individual expects another to act in response. For example, a person who wishes to buy an item cheap would act disinterested so as not to signal his or her actual desires to the seller. Addition of analytic tools dealing with strategic action greatly strengthens the economic analysis of law. For instance, the Coase theorem, to function properly, necessarily excludes strategic action; cooperation is just assumed. But it seems apparent that legal actions often are deeply implicated in and animated by strategic motives. Common sense tells us that full open cooperation is not always the best path to bringing about one’s desired results. In fact much of the bargaining invested in designing an effective contract seems to be done in the shadow of potential strategic action on the part of the contracting parties. Designing legal rules with an eye to the possibility of strategic action helps ensure that the rules will not create perverse outcomes. For instance, if a defendant’s privilege against self-incrimination could also encourage an inference of guilt from the silence the privilege would be all but useless. Therefore, courts have not only barred comment on the refusal to testify but also have required that juries, on defendant’s request, make no inference from such a choice (see Baird et al 1994). Further, the understanding that legislators might have adopted specific wording for a law based upon strategic motives may help direct the proper aims of judicial interpretation. This type of claim, though, is often better analyzed by the tools offered in public choice theory.
Public choice theory is centered upon how the nature of the legislative process and collective decision making influence the nature of law. It is the application of economic models of decision-making and their results to the issues that traditionally occupy political science, for example Arrow’s Theorem. One claim made within public choice theory is that a proper understanding of collective decision processes will help judges understand their position within the system. If all collective decisions are unavoidably influenced by those who get to frame the questions debated and the order of voting – the agenda-setters – public legislation will need to be interpreted differently than if it were a more neutral recording of collective wishes. Such a theoretical result makes problematic a court’s reference to the intent of the legislature.
Brian Edgar Butler
University of North Carolina at Asheville
U. S. A.
Last updated: January 9, 2011 | Originally published: