Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Philosophy of Law

law_scalesPhilosophy of law (or legal philosophy) is concerned with providing a general philosophical analysis of law and legal institutions. Issues in the field range from abstract conceptual questions about the nature of law and legal systems to normative questions about the relationship between law and morality and the justification for various legal institutions.

Topics in legal philosophy tend to be more abstract than related topics in political philosophy and applied ethics. For example, whereas the question of how properly to interpret the U.S. Constitution belongs to democratic theory (and hence falls under the heading of political philosophy), the analysis of legal interpretation falls under the heading of legal philosophy. Likewise, whereas the question of whether capital punishment is morally permissible falls under the heading of applied ethics, the question of whether the institution of punishment can be justified falls under the heading of legal philosophy.

There are roughly three categories into which the topics of legal philosophy fall: analytic jurisprudence, normative jurisprudence, and critical theories of law. Analytic jurisprudence involves providing an analysis of the essence of law so as to understand what differentiates it from other systems of norms, such as ethics. Normative jurisprudence involves the examination of normative, evaluative, and otherwise prescriptive issues about the law, such as restrictions on freedom, obligations to obey the law, and the grounds for punishment. Finally, critical theories of law, such as critical legal studies and feminist jurisprudence, challenge more traditional forms of legal philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Analytic Jurisprudence
    1. Natural Law Theory
    2. Legal Positivism
      1. The Conventionality Thesis
      2. The Social Fact Thesis
      3. The Separability Thesis
    3. Ronald Dworkin’s Third Theory
  2. Normative Jurisprudence
    1. Freedom and the Limits of Legitimate Law
      1. Legal Moralism
      2. Legal Paternalism
      3. The Offense Principle
    2. The Obligation to Obey Law
    3. The Justification of Punishment
  3. Critical Theories of Law
    1. Legal Realism
    2. Critical Legal Studies
    3. Law and Economics
    4. Outsider Jurisprudence
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Analytic Jurisprudence

The principal objective of analytic jurisprudence has traditionally been to provide an account of what distinguishes law as a system of norms from other systems of norms, such as ethical norms. As John Austin describes the project, analytic jurisprudence seeks “the essence or nature which is common to all laws that are properly so called” (Austin 1995, p. 11). Accordingly, analytic jurisprudence is concerned with providing necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguish law from non-law.

While this task is usually interpreted as an attempt to analyze the concepts of law and legal system, there is some confusion as to both the value and character of conceptual analysis in philosophy of law. As Brian Leiter (1998) points out, philosophy of law is one of the few philosophical disciplines that takes conceptual analysis as its principal concern; most other areas in philosophy have taken a naturalistic turn, incorporating the tools and methods of the sciences. To clarify the role of conceptual analysis in law, Brian Bix (1995) distinguishes a number of different purposes that can be served by conceptual claims:

  1. to track linguistic usage;
  2. to stipulate meanings;
  3. to explain what is important or essential about a class of objects; and
  4. to establish an evaluative test for the concept-word.

Bix takes conceptual analysis in law to be primarily concerned with (3) and (4).

In any event, conceptual analysis of law remains an important, if controversial, project in contemporary legal theory. Conceptual theories of law can be divided into two main headings: (a) those that affirm there is a conceptual relation between law and morality and (b) those that deny that there is such a relation. Nevertheless, Ronald Dworkin’s view is often characterized as a third theory partly because it is not clear where he stands on the question of whether there is a conceptual relation between law and morality.

a. Natural Law Theory

All forms of natural law theory subscribe to the Overlap Thesis, which is that there is a necessary relation between the concepts of law and morality. According to this view, then, the concept of law cannot be fully articulated without some reference to moral notions. Though the Overlap Thesis may seem unambiguous, there are a number of different ways in which it can be interpreted.

The strongest form of the Overlap Thesis underlies the classical naturalism of St. Thomas Aquinas and William Blackstone. As Blackstone describes the thesis:

This law of nature, being co-eval with mankind and dictated by God himself, is of course superior in obligation to any other. It is binding over all the globe, in all countries, and at all times: no human laws are of any validity, if contrary to this; and such of them as are valid derive all their force, and all their authority, mediately or immediately, from this original (1979, p. 41).

In this passage, Blackstone articulates the two claims that constitute the theoretical core of classical naturalism: 1) there can be no legally valid standards that conflict with the natural law; and 2) all valid laws derive what force and authority they have from the natural law. On this view, to paraphrase Augustine, an unjust law is no law at all.

Related to Blackstone’s classical naturalism is the neo-naturalism of John Finnis (1980). Finnis believes that the naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone should not be construed as a conceptual account of the existence conditions for law. According to Finnis (see also Bix, 1996), the classical naturalists were not concerned with giving a conceptual account of legal validity; rather they were concerned with explaining the moral force of law: “the principles of natural law explain the obligatory force (in the fullest sense of “obligation”) of positive laws, even when those laws cannot be deduced from those principles” (Finnis 1980, pp. 23-24). On Finnis’s view of the Overlap Thesis, the essential function of law is to provide a justification for state coercion. Accordingly, an unjust law can be legally valid, but cannot provide an adequate justification for use of the state coercive power and is hence not obligatory in the fullest sense; thus, an unjust law fails to realize the moral ideals implicit in the concept of law. An unjust law, on this view, is legally binding, but is not fully law.

Lon Fuller (1964) rejects the idea that there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law. On Fuller’s view, law is necessarily subject to a procedural morality consisting of eight principles:

P1: the rules must be expressed in general terms;
P2: the rules must be publicly promulgated;
P3: the rules must be prospective in effect;
P4: the rules must be expressed in understandable terms;
P5: the rules must be consistent with one another;
P6: the rules must not require conduct beyond the powers of the affected parties;
P7: the rules must not be changed so frequently that the subject cannot rely on them; and
P8: the rules must be administered in a manner consistent with their wording.

On Fuller’s view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law’s essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are “internal” to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law: “A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all” (1964, p. 39).

b. Legal Positivism

Opposed to all forms of naturalism is legal positivism, which is roughly constituted by three theoretical commitments: (i) the Social Fact Thesis, (ii) the Conventionality Thesis, and (iii) the Separability Thesis. The Social Fact Thesis (which is also known as the Pedigree Thesis) asserts that it is a necessary truth that legal validity is ultimately a function of certain kinds of social facts. The Conventionality Thesis emphasizes law’s conventional nature, claiming that the social facts giving rise to legal validity are authoritative in virtue of some kind of social convention. The Separability Thesis, at the most general level, simply denies naturalism’s Overlap Thesis; according to the Separability Thesis, there is no conceptual overlap between the notions of law and morality.

i. The Conventionality Thesis

According to the Conventionality Thesis, it is a conceptual truth about law that legal validity can ultimately be explained in terms of criteria that are authoritative in virtue of some kind of social convention. Thus, for example, H.L.A. Hart (1996) believes the criteria of legal validity are contained in a rule of recognition that sets forth rules for creating, changing, and adjudicating law. On Hart’s view, the rule of recognition is authoritative in virtue of a convention among officials to regard its criteria as standards that govern their behavior as officials. While Joseph Raz does not appear to endorse Hart’s view about a master rule of recognition containing the criteria of validity, he also believes the validity criteria are authoritative only in virtue of a convention among officials.

ii. The Social Fact Thesis

The Social Fact Thesis asserts that legal validity is a function of certain social facts. Borrowing heavily from Jeremy Bentham, John Austin (1995) argues that the principal distinguishing feature of a legal system is the presence of a sovereign who is habitually obeyed by most people in the society, but not in the habit of obeying any determinate human superior. On Austin’s view, a rule R is legally valid (that is, is a law) in a society S if and only if R is commanded by the sovereign in S and is backed up with the threat of a sanction. The relevant social fact that confers validity, on Austin’s view, is promulgation by a sovereign willing to impose a sanction for noncompliance.

Hart takes a different view of the Social Fact Thesis. Hart believes that Austin’s theory accounts, at most, for one kind of rule: primary rules that require or prohibit certain kinds of behavior. On Hart’s view, Austin overlooked the presence of other primary rules that confer upon citizens the power to create, modify, and extinguish rights and obligations in other persons. As Hart points out, the rules governing the creation of contracts and wills cannot plausibly be characterized as restrictions on freedom that are backed by the threat of a sanction.

Most importantly, however, Hart argues Austin overlooks the existence of secondary meta-rules that have as their subject matter the primary rules themselves and distinguish full-blown legal systems from primitive systems of law:

[Secondary rules] may all be said to be on a different level from the primary rules, for they are all about such rules; in the sense that while primary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do, these secondary rules are all concerned with the primary rules themselves. They specify the way in which the primary rules may be conclusively ascertained, introduced, eliminated, varied, and the fact of their violation conclusively determined (Hart 1994, p. 92).

Hart distinguishes three types of secondary rules that mark the transition from primitive forms of law to full-blown legal systems: (1) the rule of recognition, which “specif[ies] some feature or features possession of which by a suggested rule is taken as a conclusive affirmative indication that it is a rule of the group to be supported by the social pressure it exerts” (Hart 1994, p. 92); (2) the rule of change, which enables a society to add, remove, and modify valid rules; and (3) the rule of adjudication, which provides a mechanism for determining whether a valid rule has been violated. On Hart’s view, then, every society with a full-blown legal system necessarily has a rule of recognition that articulates criteria for legal validity that include provisions for making, changing and adjudicating law. Law is, to use Hart’s famous phrase, “the union of primary and secondary rules” (Hart 1994, p. 107).

According to Hart’s view of the Social Fact Thesis, then, a proposition P is legally valid in a society S if and only if it satisfies the criteria of validity contained in a rule of recognition that is binding in S. As we have seen, the Conventionality Thesis implies that a rule of recognition is binding in S only if there is a social convention among officials to treat it as defining standards of official behavior. Thus, on Hart’s view, “[the] rules of recognition specifying the criteria of legal validity and its rules of change and adjudication must be effectively accepted as common public standards of official behaviour by its officials” (Hart 1994, p. 113).

iii. The Separability Thesis

The final thesis comprising the foundation of legal positivism is the Separability Thesis. In its most general form, the Separability Thesis asserts that law and morality are conceptually distinct. This abstract formulation can be interpreted in a number of ways. For example, Klaus F¸þer (1996) interprets it as making a meta-level claim that the definition of law must be entirely free of moral notions. This interpretation implies that any reference to moral considerations in defining the related notions of law, legal validity, and legal system is inconsistent with the Separability Thesis.

More commonly, the Separability Thesis is interpreted as making only an object-level claim about the existence conditions for legal validity. As Hart describes it, the Separability Thesis is no more than the “simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so” (Hart 1994, pp. 181-82). Insofar as the object-level interpretation of the Separability Thesis denies it is a necessary truth that there are moral constraints on legal validity, it implies the existence of a possible legal system in which there are no moral constraints on legal validity.

Though all positivists agree there are possible legal systems without moral constraints on legal validity, there are conflicting views on whether there are possible legal systems with such constraints. According to inclusive positivism (also known as incorporationism and soft positivism), it is possible for a society’s rule of recognition to incorporate moral constraints on the content of law. Prominent inclusive positivists include Jules Coleman and Hart, who maintains that “the rule of recognition may incorporate as criteria of legal validity conformity with moral principles or substantive values … such as the Sixteenth or Nineteenth Amendments to the United States Constitution respecting the establishment of religion or abridgements of the right to vote” (Hart 1994, p. 250).

In contrast, exclusive positivism (also called hard positivism) denies that a legal system can incorporate moral constraints on legal validity. Exclusive positivists like Raz (1979) subscribe to the Source Thesis, according to which the existence and content of law can always be determined by reference to its sources without recourse to moral argument. On this view, the sources of law include both the circumstances of its promulgation and relevant interpretative materials, such as court cases involving its application.

c. Ronald Dworkin’s Third Theory

Ronald Dworkin rejects positivism’s Social Fact Thesis on the ground that there are some legal standards the authority of which cannot be explained in terms of social facts. In deciding hard cases, for example, judges often invoke moral principles that Dworkin believes do not derive their legal authority from the social criteria of legality contained in a rule of recognition (Dworkin 1977, p. 40). Nevertheless, since judges are bound to consider such principles when relevant, they must be characterized as law. Thus, Dworkin concludes, “if we treat principles as law we must reject the positivists’ first tenet, that the law of a community is distinguished from other social standards by some test in the form of a master rule” (Dworkin 1977, p. 44).

Dworkin believes adjudication is and should be interpretive: “judges should decide hard cases by interpreting the political structure of their community in the following, perhaps special way: by trying to find the best justification they can find, in principles of political morality, for the structure as a whole, from the most profound constitutional rules and arrangements to the details of, for example, the private law of tort or contract” (Dworkin 1982, p. 165). There are, then, two elements of a successful interpretation. First, since an interpretation is successful insofar as it justifies the particular practices of a particular society, the interpretation must fit with those practices in the sense that it coheres with existing legal materials defining the practices. Second, since an interpretation provides a moral justification for those practices, it must present them in the best possible moral light. Thus, Dworkin argues, a judge should strive to interpret a case in roughly the following way:

A thoughtful judge might establish for himself, for example, a rough “threshold” of fit which any interpretation of data must meet in order to be “acceptable” on the dimension of fit, and then suppose that if more than one interpretation of some part of the law meets this threshold, the choice among these should be made, not through further and more precise comparisons between the two along that dimension, but by choosing the interpretation which is “substantively” better, that is, which better promotes the political ideals he thinks correct (Dworkin 1982, p. 171).

Accordingly, on Dworkin’s view, the legal authority of a binding principle derives from the contribution it makes to the best moral justification for a society’s legal practices considered as a whole. Thus, a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions:

  1. the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and
  2. the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1).

The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be.

In later writings, Dworkin expands the scope of his “constructivist” view beyond adjudication to encompass the realm of legal theory. Dworkin distinguishes conversational interpretation from artistic/creative interpretation and argues that the task of interpreting a social practice is more like artistic interpretation:

The most familiar occasion of interpretation is conversation. We interpret the sounds or marks another person makes in order to decide what he has said. Artistic interpretation is yet another: critics interpret poems and plays and paintings in order to defend some view of their meaning or theme or point. The form of interpretation we are studying-the interpretation of a social practice-is like artistic interpretation in this way: both aim to interpret something created by people as an entity distinct from them, rather than what people say, as in conversational interpretation” (Dworkin 1986, p. 50).

Artistic interpretation, like judicial interpretation, is constrained by the dimensions of fit and justification: “constructive interpretation is a matter of imposing purpose on an object or practice in order to make of it the best possible example of the form or genre to which it is taken to belong” (Dworkin 1986, p. 52).

On Dworkin’s view, the point of any general theory of law is to interpret a very complex set of related social practices that are “created by people as an entity distinct from them”; for this reason, Dworkin believes the project of putting together a general theory of law is inherently constructivist:

General theories of law must be abstract because they aim to interpret the main point and structure of legal practice, not some particular part or department of it. But for all their abstraction, they are constructive interpretations: they try to show legal practice as a whole in its best light, to achieve equilibrium between legal practice as they find it and the best justification of that practice. So no firm line divides jurisprudence from adjudication or any other aspect of legal practice (Dworkin 1986, p. 90).

Indeed, so tight is the relation between jurisprudence and adjudication, according to Dworkin, that jurisprudence is no more than the most general part of adjudication; thus, Dworkin concludes, “any judge’s opinion is itself a piece of legal philosophy” (Dworkin 1986, p. 90).

Accordingly, Dworkin rejects not only positivism’s Social Fact Thesis, but also what he takes to be its underlying presuppositions about legal theory. Hart distinguishes two perspectives from which a set of legal practices can be understood. A legal practice can be understood from the “internal” point of view of the person who accepts that practice as providing legitimate guides to conduct, as well as from the “external” point of view of the observer who wishes to understand the practice but does not accept it as being authoritative or legitimate.

Hart understands his theory of law to be both descriptive and general in the sense that it provides an account of fundamental features common to all legal systems-which presupposes a point of view that is external to all legal systems. For this reason, he regards his project as “a radically different enterprise from Dworkin’s conception of legal theory (or ‘jurisprudence’ as he often terms it) as in part evaluative and justificatory and as ‘addressed to a particular legal culture’, which is usually the theorist’s own and in Dworkin’s case is that of Anglo-American law” (Hart 1994, p. 240).

These remarks show Hart believes Dworkin’s theoretical objectives are fundamentally different from those of positivism, which, as a theory of analytic jurisprudence, is largely concerned with conceptual analysis. For his part, Dworkin conceives his work as conceptual but not in the same sense that Hart regards his work:

We all-at least all lawyers-share a concept of law and of legal right, and we contest different conceptions of that concept. Positivism defends a particular conception, and I have tried to defend a competing conception. We disagree about what legal rights are in much the same way as we philosophers who argue about justice disagree about what justice is. I concentrate on the details of a particular legal system with which I am especially familiar, not simply to show that positivism provides a poor account of that system, but to show that positivism provides a poor conception of the concept of a legal right (Dworkin 1977, 351-52).

These differences between Hart and Dworkin have led many legal philosophers, most recently Bix (1996), to suspect that they are not really taking inconsistent positions at all. Accordingly, there remains an issue as to whether Dworkin’s work should be construed as falling under the rubric of analytic jurisprudence.

2. Normative Jurisprudence

Normative jurisprudence involves normative, evaluative, and otherwise prescriptive questions about the law. Here we will examine three key issues: (a) when and to what extent laws can restrict the freedom of citizens, (b) the nature of one’s obligation to obey the law, and (c) the justification of punishment by law.

a. Freedom and the Limits of Legitimate Law

Laws limit human autonomy by restricting freedom. Criminal laws, for example, remove certain behaviors from the range of behavioral options by penalizing them with imprisonment and, in some cases, death. Likewise, civil laws require people to take certain precautions not to injure others and to honor their contracts. Given that human autonomy deserves prima facie moral respect, the question arises as to what are the limits of the state’s legitimate authority to restrict the freedom of its citizens.

John Stuart Mill provides the classic liberal answer in the form of the harm principle:

[T]he sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number is self-protection. The only purpose for which power can rightfully be exercised over any member of a civilised community against his will is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign (Mill 1906, pp. 12-13).

While Mill left the notion of harm underdeveloped, he is most frequently taken to mean only physical harms and more extreme forms of psychological harm.

Though Mill’s view—or something like it—enjoys currency among the public, it has generated considerable controversy among philosophers of law and political philosophers. Many philosophers believe that Mill understates the limits of legitimate state authority over the individual, claiming that law may be used to enforce morality, to protect the individual from herself, and in some cases to protect individuals from offensive behavior.

i. Legal Moralism

Legal moralism is the view that the law can legitimately be used to prohibit behaviors that conflict with society’s collective moral judgments even when those behaviors do not result in physical or psychological harm to others. According to this view, a person’s freedom can legitimately be restricted simply because it conflicts with society’s collective morality; thus, legal moralism implies that it is permissible for the state to use its coercive power to enforce society’s collective morality.

The most famous legal moralist is Patrick Devlin, who argues that a shared morality is essential to the existence of a society:

[I]f men and women try to create a society in which there is no fundamental agreement about good and evil they will fail; if, having based it on common agreement, the agreement goes, the society will disintegrate. For society is not something that is kept together physically; it is held by the invisible bonds of common thought. If the bonds were too far relaxed the members would drift apart. A common morality is part of the bondage. The bondage is part of the price of society; and mankind, which needs society, must pay its price. (Devlin 1965, p. 10).

Insofar as human beings cannot lead a meaningful existence outside of society, it follows, on Devlin’s view, that the law can be used to preserve the shared morality as a means of preserving society itself.

H.L.A. Hart (1963) points out that Devlin overstates the extent to which preservation of a shared morality is necessary to the continuing existence of a society. Devlin attempts to conclude from the necessity of a shared social morality that it is permissible for the state to legislate sexual morality (in particular, to legislate against same-sex sexual relations), but Hart argues it is implausible to think that “deviation from accepted sexual morality, even by adults in private, is something which, like treason, threatens the existence of society” (Hart 1963, p. 50). While enforcement of certain social norms protecting life, safety, and property are likely essential to the existence of a society, a society can survive a diversity of behavior in many other areas of moral concern-as is evidenced by the controversies in the U.S. surrounding abortion and homosexuality.

ii. Legal Paternalism

Legal paternalism is the view that it is permissible for the state to legislate against what Mill calls “self-regarding actions” when necessary to prevent individuals from inflicting physical or severe emotional harm on themselves. As Gerald Dworkin describes it, a paternalist interference is an “interference with a person’s liberty of action justified by reasons referring exclusively to the welfare, good, happiness, needs, interests or values of the person being coerced” (G. Dworkin 1972, p. 65). Thus, for example, a law requiring use of a helmet when riding a motorcycle is a paternalistic interference insofar as it is justified by concerns for the safety of the rider.

Dworkin argues that Mill’s view that a person “cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him” (Mill 1906, p. 13) precludes paternalistic legislation to which fully rational individuals would agree. According to Dworkin, there are goods, such as health and education, that any rational person needs to pursue her own good-no matter how that good is conceived. Thus, Dworkin concludes, the attainment of these basic goods can legitimately be promoted in certain circumstances by using the state’s coercive force.

Dworkin offers a hypothetical consent justification for his limited legal paternalism. On his view, there are a number of different situations in which fully rational adults would consent to paternalistic restrictions on freedom. For example, Dworkin believes a fully rational adult would consent to paternalistic restrictions to protect her from making decisions that are “far-reaching, potentially dangerous and irreversible” (G. Dworkin 1972, p. 80). Nevertheless, he argues that there are limits to legitimate paternalism: (1) the state must show that the behavior governed by the proposed restriction involves the sort of harm that a rational person would want to avoid; (2) on the calculations of a fully rational person, the potential harm outweighs the benefits of the relevant behavior; and (3) the proposed restriction is the least restrictive alternative for protecting against the harm.

iii. The Offense Principle

Joel Feinberg believes the harm principle does not provide sufficient protection against the wrongful behaviors of others, as it is inconsistent with many criminal prohibitions we take for granted as being justified. If the only legitimate use of the state coercive force is to protect people from harm caused by others, then statutes prohibiting public sex are impermissible because public sex might be offensive but it does not cause harm (in the Millian sense) to others.

Accordingly, Feinberg argues the harm principle must be augmented by the offense principle, which he defines as follows: “It is always a good reason in support of a proposed criminal prohibition that it would probably be an effective way of preventing serious offense (as opposed to injury or harm) to persons other than the actor, and that it is probably a necessary means to that end” (Feinberg 1985). By “offense,” Feinberg intends a subjective and objective element: the subjective element consists in the experience of an unpleasant mental state (for example, shame, disgust, anxiety, embarrassment); the objective element consists in the existence of a wrongful cause of such a mental state.

b. The Obligation to Obey Law

Natural law critics of positivism (for example, Fuller 1958) frequently complain that if positivism is correct, there cannot be a moral obligation to obey the law qua law (that is, to obey the law as such, no matter what the laws are, simply because it is the law). As Feinberg (1979) puts the point:

The positivist account of legal validity is hard to reconcile with the [claim] that valid law as such, no matter what its content, deserves our respect and general fidelity. Even if valid law is bad law, we have some obligation to obey it simply because it is law. But how can this be so if a law’s validity has nothing to do with its content?

The idea is this: if what is essential to law is just that there exist specified recipes for making law, then there cannot be a moral obligation to obey a rule simply because it is the law.

Contemporary positivists, for the most part, accept the idea that positivism is inconsistent with an obligation to obey law qua law (compare Himma 1998), but argue that the mere status of a norm as law cannot give rise to any moral obligation to obey that norm. While there might be a moral obligation to obey a particular law because of its moral content (for example, laws prohibiting murder) or because it solves a coordination problem (for example, laws requiring people to drive on the right side of the road), the mere fact that a rule is law does not provide a moral reason for doing what the law requires.

Indeed, arguments for the existence of even a prima facie obligation to obey law (that is, an obligation that can be outweighed by competing obligations) have largely been unsuccessful. Arguments in favor of an obligation to obey the law roughly fall into four categories: (1) arguments from gratitude; (2) arguments from fair play; (3) arguments from implied consent; and (4) arguments from general utility.

The argument from gratitude begins with the observation that all persons, even those who are worst off, derive some benefit from the state’s enforcement of the law. On this view, a person who accepts benefits from another person thereby incurs a duty of gratitude towards the benefactor. And the only plausible way to discharge this duty towards the government is to obey its laws. Nevertheless, as M.B.E. Smith points out (1973, p. 953), “if someone confers benefits on me without any consideration of whether I want them, and if he does this in order to advance some purpose other than promotion of my particular welfare, I have no obligation to be grateful towards him.” Since the state does not give citizens a choice with respect to such benefits, the mere enjoyment of them cannot give rise to a duty of gratitude.

John Rawls (1964) argues that there is a moral obligation to obey law qua law in societies in which there is a mutually beneficial and just scheme of social cooperation. What gives rise to a moral obligation to obey law qua law in such societies is a duty of fair play: fairness requires obedience of persons who intentionally accept the benefits made available in a society organized around a just scheme of mutually beneficial cooperation. There are a couple of problems here. First, Rawls’s argument does not establish the existence of a content-independent obligation to obey law; the obligation arises only in those societies that institutionalize a just scheme of social cooperation. Second, even in such societies, citizens are not presented with a genuine option to refuse those benefits. For example, I cannot avoid the benefits of laws ensuring clean air. But accepting benefits one is not in a position to refuse cannot give rise to an obligation of fair play.

The argument from consent grounds an obligation to obey law on some sort of implied promise. As is readily evident, we can voluntarily assume obligations by consenting to them or making a promise. Of course, most citizens never explicitly promise or consent to obey the laws; for this reason, proponents of this argument attempt to infer consent from such considerations as continued residence and acceptance of benefits from the state. Nevertheless, acceptance of benefits one cannot decline no more implies consent to obey law than it does duties of fair play or gratitude. Moreover, the prohibitive difficulties associated with emigration preclude an inference of consent from continued residence.

Finally, the argument from general utility grounds the duty to obey the law in the consequences of universal disobedience. Since, according to this argument, the consequences of general disobedience would be catastrophic, it is wrong for any individual to disobey the law; for no person may disobey the law unless everyone may do so. In response, Smith points out that this strategy of argument leads to absurdities: “We will have to maintain, for example, that there is a prima facie obligation not to eat dinner at five o’clock, for if everyone did so, certain essential services could not be maintained” (Smith 1973, p. 966).

c. The Justification of Punishment

Punishment is unique among putatively legitimate acts in that its point is to inflict discomfort on the recipient; an act that is incapable of causing a person minimal discomfort cannot be characterized as a punishment. In most contexts, the commission of an act for the purpose of inflicting discomfort is morally problematic because of its resemblance to torture. For this reason, institutional punishment requires a moral justification sufficient to distinguish it from other practices of purposely inflicting discomfort on other people.

Justifications for punishment typically take five forms: (1) retributive; (2) deterrence; (3) preventive; (4) rehabilitative; and (5) restitutionary. According to the retributive justification, what justifies punishing a person is that she committed an offense that deserves the punishment. On this view, it is morally appropriate that a person who has committed a wrongful act should suffer in proportion to the magnitude of her wrongdoing. The problem, however, is that the mere fact that someone is deserving of punishment does not imply it is morally permissible for the state to administer punishment; it would be wrong for me, for example, to punish someone else’s child even though her behavior might deserve it.

In contrast to the retributivist theories that look back to a person’s prior wrongful act as justification for punishment, utilitarian theories look forward to the beneficial consequences of punishing a person. There are three main lines of utilitarian reasoning. According to the deterrence justification, punishment of a wrongdoer is justified by the socially beneficial effects that it has on other persons. On this view, punishment deters wrongdoing by persons who would otherwise commit wrongful acts. The problem with the deterrence theory is that it justifies punishment of one person on the strength of the effects that it has on other persons. The idea that it is permissible to deliberately inflict discomfort on one person because doing so may have beneficial effects on the behavior of other persons appears inconsistent with the Kantian principle that it is wrong to use people as mere means.

The preventive justification argues that incarcerating a person for wrongful acts is justified insofar as it prevents that person from committing wrongful acts against society during the period of incarceration. The rehabilitative justification argues that punishment is justified in virtue of the effect that it has on the moral character of the offender. Each of these justifications suffers from the same flaw: prevention of crime and rehabilitation of the offender can be achieved without the deliberate infliction of discomfort that constitutes punishment. For example, prevention of crime might require detaining the offender, but it does not require detention in an environment that is as unpleasant as those typically found in prisons.

The restitutionary justification focuses on the effect of the offender’s wrongful act on the victim. Other theories of punishment conceptualize the wrongful act as an offense against society; the restitutionary theory sees wrongdoing as an offense against the victim. Thus, on this view, the principal purpose of punishment must be to make the victim whole to the extent that this can be done: “The point is not that the offender deserves to suffer; it is rather that the offended party desires compensation” (Barnett 1977, p. 289). Accordingly, a criminal convicted of wrongdoing should be sentenced to compensate her victim in proportion to the victim’s loss. The problem with the restitutionary theory is that it fails to distinguish between compensation and punishment. Compensatory objectives focus on the victim, while punitive objectives focus on the offender.

3. Critical Theories of Law

a. Legal Realism

The legal realist movement was inspired by John Chipman Gray and Oliver Wendall Holmes and reached its apex in the 1920s and 30s through the work of Karl Llewellyn, Jerome Frank, and Felix Cohen. The realists eschewed the conceptual approach of the positivists and naturalists in favor of an empirical analysis that sought to show how practicing judges really decide cases (see Leiter 1998). The realists were deeply skeptical of the ascendant notion that judicial legislation is a rarity. While not entirely rejecting the idea that judges can be constrained by rules, the realists maintained that judges create new law through the exercise of lawmaking discretion considerably more often than is commonly supposed. On their view, judicial decision is guided far more frequently by political and moral intuitions about the facts of the case (instead of by legal rules) than theories like positivism and naturalism acknowledge.

As an historical matter, legal realism arose in response to legal formalism, a particular model of legal reasoning that assimilates legal reasoning to syllogistic reasoning. According to the formalist model, the legal outcome (that is, the holding) logically follows from the legal rule (major premise) and a statement of the relevant facts (minor premise). Realists believe that formalism understates judicial lawmaking abilities insofar as it represents legal outcomes as entailed syllogistically by applicable rules and facts. For if legal outcomes are logically implied by propositions that bind judges, it follows that judges lack legal authority to reach conflicting outcomes.

Legal realism can roughly be characterized by the following claims:

  1. the class of available legal materials is insufficient to logically entail a unique legal outcome in most cases worth litigating at the appellate level (the Local Indeterminacy Thesis);
  2. in such cases, judges make new law in deciding legal disputes through the exercise of a lawmaking discretion (the Discretion Thesis); and
  3. judicial decisions in indeterminate cases are influenced by the judge’s political and moral convictions, not by legal considerations.

Though (3) is logically independent of (1) and (2), (1) seems to imply (2): insofar as judges decide legally indeterminate cases, they must be creating new law.

It is worth noting the relations between legal realism, formalism, and positivism. While formalism is often thought to be entailed by positivism, it turns out that legal realism is not only consistent with positivism, but also presupposes the truth of all three of positivism’s core theses. Indeed, the realist acknowledges that law is essentially the product of official activity, but believes that judicial lawmaking occurs more frequently than is commonly assumed. But the idea that law is essentially the product of official activity presupposes the truth of positivism’s Conventionality, Social Fact, and Separability theses. Though the preoccupations of the realists were empirical (that is, attempting to identify the psychological and sociological factors influencing judicial decision-making), their implicit conceptual commitments were decidedly positivistic in flavor.

b. Critical Legal Studies

The critical legal studies (CLS) movement attempts to expand the radical aspects of legal realism into a Marxist critique of mainstream liberal jurisprudence. CLS theorists believe the realists understate the extent of indeterminacy; whereas the realists believe that indeterminacy is local in the sense that it is confined to a certain class of cases, CLS theorists argue that law is radically (or globally) indeterminate in the sense that the class of available legal materials rarely, if ever, logically/causally entails a unique outcome.

CLS theorists emphasize the role of ideology in shaping the content of the law. On this view, the content of the law in liberal democracies necessarily reflects “ideological struggles among social factions in which competing conceptions of justice, goodness, and social and political life get compromised, truncated, vitiated, and adjusted” (Altman 1986, p. 221). The inevitable outcome of such struggles, on this view, is a profound inconsistency permeating the deepest layers of the law. It is this pervasive inconsistency that gives rise to radical indeterminacy in the law. For insofar as the law is inconsistent, a judge can justify any of a number of conflicting outcomes.

At the heart of the CLS critique of liberal jurisprudence is the idea that radical indeterminacy is inconsistent with liberal conceptions of legitimacy. According to these traditional liberal conceptions, the province of judges is to interpret, and not make, the law. For, on this view, democratic ideals imply that lawmaking must be left to legislators who, unlike appointed judges, are accountable to the electorate. But if law is radically indeterminate, then judges nearly always decide cases by making new law, which is inconsistent with liberal conceptions of the legitimate sources of lawmaking authority.

c. Law and Economics

The law and economics movement argues for the value of economic analysis in the law both as a description about how courts and legislators do behave and as a prescription for how such officials should behave. The legal economists, led by Richard Posner, argue that the content of many areas of the common law can be explained in terms of its tendency to maximize preferences:

[M]any areas of law, especially the great common law fields of property, torts, crimes, and contracts, bear the stamp of economic reasoning. It is not a refutation that few judicial opinions contain explicit references to economic concepts. Often the true grounds of decision are concealed rather than illuminated by the characteristic rhetoric of judicial opinions. Indeed, legal education consists primarily of learning to dig beneath the rhetorical surface to find those grounds, many of which may turn out to have an economic character (Posner 1992, p. 23).

Posner subscribes to the so-called efficiency theory of the common law, according to which “the common law is best (not perfectly) explained as a system for maximizing the wealth of society” (Posner 1992, p. 23).

More influential than Posner’s descriptive claims is his normative view that law should strive to maximize wealth. According to Posner, the proper goal of the statutory and common law is to promote wealth maximization, which can best be done by facilitating the mechanisms of the free market. Posner’s normative view combines elements of utilitarian analysis with a Kantian respect for autonomy. On the utilitarian side, markets tend to maximize wealth and the satisfaction of preferences. In a market transaction with no third-party effects, wealth is increased because all parties are made better off by the transaction-otherwise there would be no incentive to consummate the transaction-and no one is made worse off.

On the Kantian side, the law should facilitate market transactions because market transactions best reflect autonomous judgments about the value of individual preferences. At least ideally, individuals express and realize their preferences through mutually consensual market transactions consummated from positions of equal bargaining power. Thus, market transactions tend, ideally, to be both efficient (because they tend to maximize wealth without harmful third-party effects) and just (because all parties are consenting).

d. Outsider Jurisprudence

So-called “outsider jurisprudence” is concerned with providing an analysis of the ways in which law is structured to promote the interests of white males and to exclude females and persons of color. For example, one principal objective of feminist jurisprudence is to show how patriarchal assumptions have shaped the content of laws in a wide variety of areas: property, contract, criminal law, constitutional law, and the law of civil rights. Additionally, feminist scholars challenge traditional ideals of judicial decision-making according to which judges decide legal disputes by applying neutral rules in an impartial and objective fashion. Feminists have, of course, always questioned whether it is possible for judges to achieve an objective and impartial perspective, but now question whether the traditional model is even desirable.

Critical race theory is likewise concerned to point up the way in which assumptions of white supremacy have shaped the content of the law at the expense of persons of color. Additionally, critical race theorists show how the experience, concerns, values, and perspectives of persons of color are systematically excluded from mainstream discourse among practicing lawyers, judges, and legislators. Finally, such theorists attempt to show how assumptions about race are built into most liberal theories of law.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Andrew Altman (1986), “Legal Realism, Critical Legal Studies, and Dworkin,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, vol. 15, no. 2, pp. 205-236.
  • Thomas Aquinas (1988), On Law, Morality and Politics (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co.).
  • John Austin (1977), Lectures on Jurisprudence and the Philosophy of Positive Law (St. Clair Shores, MI: Scholarly Press.
  • John Austin (1995), The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Randy E. Barnett (1977), “Restitution: A New Paradigm of Criminal Justice,” Ethics, vol. 87, no. 4, pp. 279-301.
  • Jeremy Bentham (1988), A Fragment of Government (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Jeremy Bentham (1970), Of Laws In General (London: Athlone Press).
  • Brian Bix (1995), “Conceptual Questions and Jurisprudence,” Legal Theory, vol. 1, no. 4 (December), pp. 465-479.
  • Brian Bix (1996a), Jurisprudence: Theory and Context (Boulder, CO: Westview Press).
  • Brian Bix (1996b), “Natural Law Theory,” in Dennis M. Patterson (ed.), A Companion to Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory (Cambridge: Blackwell Publishing Co.).
  • William Blackstone (1979), Commentaries on the Law of England (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press).
  • Jules L. Coleman (1989), “On the Relationship Between Law and Morality,” Ratio Juris, vol. 2, no. 1, pp. 66-78.
  • Jules L. Coleman (1982), “Negative and Positive Positivism,” 11 Journal of Legal Studies vol. 139, no. 1, pp. 139-164.
  • Jules L. Coleman (1996), “Authority and Reason,” in Robert P. George, The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 287-319.
  • Jules L. Coleman (1998), “Incorporationism, Conventionality and The Practical Difference Thesis,” Legal Theory, vol. 4, no. 4, pp. 381-426.
  • Jules L. Coleman and Jeffrie Murphy (1990), Philosophy of Law (Boulder, CO: Westview Press).
  • Kimberle Crenshaw, Neil Gotanda, Gary Peller, and Kendall Thomas, eds. (1995), Critical Race Theory: The Key Writings That Formed the Movement (New York: The New Press).
  • Patrick Devlin (1965), The Enforcement of Morals (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Gerald Dworkin (1972), “Paternalism,” The Monist, vol. 56, pp. 64-84.
  • Ronald Dworkin (1978), Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).
  • Ronald Dworkin (1982), “‘Natural’ Law Revisited,” University of Florida Law Review vol. 34, no. 2, pp. 165-188.
  • Ronald Dworkin (1986), Law’s Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).
  • Joel Feinberg (1985), Offense to Others (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Joel Feinberg (1979), “Civil Disobedience in the Modern World,” Humanities in Review, vol. 2, pp. 37-60.
  • John Finnis (1980), Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • William Fisher, Morton Horovitz, and Thomas Reed, eds. (1993), American Legal Realism (New York: Oxford University Press).
  • Jerome Frank (1930), Law and the Modern Mind (New York: Brentano’s Publishing).
  • Lon L. Fuller (1964), The Morality of Law (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press).
  • Lon L. Fuller (1958), “Positivism and Fidelity to Law,” Harvard Law Review, vol. 71, no. 4, pp. 630-672 .
  • Klaus Füßer (1996), “Farewell to ‘Legal Positivism’: The Separation Thesis Unravelling,” in Robert P. George, The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 119-162.
  • John Chipman Gray (1921), The Nature and Source of Law (New York: Macmillan).
  • Kent Greenawalt (1987), Conflicts of Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • H.L.A. Hart (1994), The Concept of Law, 2nd Edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • H.L.A. Hart (1983), Essays in Jurisprudence and Philosophy (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • H.L.A. Hart (1963), Law, Liberty and Morality (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Kenneth Einar Himma (1998), “Positivism, Naturalism, and the Obligation to Obey Law,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, vol. 36, no. 2, pp. 145-161.
  • Oliver Wendall Holmes (1898), “The Path of the Law,” Harvard Law Review, vol. 110, no. 5, pp. 991-1009 .
  • Brian Leiter (1998), “Naturalism and Naturalized Jurisprudence,” in Brian Bix (ed.), Analyzing Law: New Essays in Legal Theory (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Brian Leiter, “Legal Realism,” in Dennis M. Patterson, ed. (1996), A Companion to Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers).
  • John Stuart Mill (1906), On Liberty (New York: Alfred A. Knopf).
  • Michael Moore (1992), “Law as a Functional Kind,” in Robert P. George (ed.), Natural Law Theories: Contemporary Essays (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Michael Moore, “The Moral Worth of Retribution,” in Ferdinand Schoeman, ed. (1987), Responsibility, Character, and the Emotions (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Richard Posner (1992), Economic Analysis of Law, 4th Edition (Boston: Little, Brown, and Company).
  • John Rawls (1964), “Legal Obligation and the Duty of Fair Play,” in Sidney Hook (ed.), Law and Philosophy (New York: New York University Press), pp. 3-18.
  • Joseph Raz (1979), The Authority of Law: Essays on Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Joseph Raz (1980), The Concept of a Legal System: An Introduction to the Theory of Legal Systems, Second Edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • Roger Shiner (1992), Norm and Nature (Oxford: Clarendon Press).
  • M.B.E. Smith (1973), “Do We have a Prima Facie Obligation to Obey the Law,” 82 Yale Law Journal 950-976.
  • Patricia Smith, ed. (1993), Feminist Jurisprudence (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • C.L. Ten (1987), Crime, Guilt, and Punishment (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • W.J. Waluchow (1994), Inclusive Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press).

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

Last updated: April 19, 2009 | Originally published: