Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Legal Positivism

Legal positivism is a philosophy of law that emphasizes the conventional nature of law—that it is socially constructed. According to legal positivism, law is synonymous with positive norms, that is, norms made by the legislator or considered as common law or case law. Formal criteria of law’s origin, law enforcement and legal effectiveness are all sufficient for social norms to be considered law.  Legal positivism does not base law on divine commandments, reason, or human rights.  As an historical matter, positivism arose in opposition to classical natural law theory, according to which there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law.

Legal positivism does not imply an ethical justification for the content of the law, nor a decision for or against the obedience to law. Positivists do not judge laws by questions of justice or humanity, but merely by the ways in which the laws have been created. This includes the view that judges make new law in deciding cases not falling clearly under a legal rule. Practicing, deciding or tolerating certain practices of law can each be considered a way of creating law.

Within legal doctrine, legal positivism would be opposed to sociological jurisprudence and hermeneutics of law, which study the concrete prevailing circumstances of statutory interpretation in society.

The word “positivism” was probably first used to draw attention to the idea that law is “positive” or “posited,” as opposed to being “natural” in the sense of being derived from natural law or morality.

Table of Contents

  1. The Pedigree Thesis
  2. The Separability Thesis
    1. Inclusive vs. Exclusive Positivism
  3. The Discretion Thesis
  4. Classic Criticisms of Positivism
    1. Fuller’s Internal Morality of Law
    2. Positivism and Legal Principles
    3. The Semantic Sting
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Pedigree Thesis

The pedigree thesis asserts that legal validity is a function of certain social facts. Borrowing heavily from Jeremy Bentham, John Austin argues that the principal distinguishing feature of a legal system is the presence of a sovereign who is habitually obeyed by most people in the society, but not in the habit of obeying any determinate human superior (Austin 1995, p. 166). On Austin’s view, a rule R is legally valid (that is, is a law) in a society S if and only if R is commanded by the sovereign in S and is backed up with the threat of a sanction. The severity of the threatened sanction is irrelevant; any general sovereign imperative supported by a threat of even the smallest harm is a law.

Austin’s command theory of law is vulnerable to a number of criticisms. One problem is that there appears to be no identifiable sovereign in democratic societies. In the United States, for example, the ultimate political power seems to belong to the people, who elect lawmakers to represent their interests. Elected lawmakers have the power to coerce behavior but are regarded as servants of the people and not as repositories of sovereign power. The voting population, on the other hand, seems to be the repository of ultimate political authority yet lacks the immediate power to coerce behavior. Thus, in democracies like that of the United States, the ultimate political authority and the power to coerce behavior seem to reside in different entities.

A second problem has to do with Austin’s view that the sovereign lawmaking authority is incapable of legal limitation. On Austin’s view, a sovereign cannot be legally constrained because no person (or body of persons) can coerce herself (or itself). Since constitutional provisions limit the authority of the legislative body to make laws, Austin is forced to argue that what we refer to as constitutional law is really not law at all; rather, it is principally a matter of “positive morality” (Austin 1977, p. 107).

Austin’s view is difficult to reconcile with constitutional law in the United States. Courts regard the procedural and substantive provisions of the constitution as constraints on legal validity. The Supreme Court has held, for example, that “an unconstitutional act is not a law; it confers no rights; it imposes no duties; it is, in legal contemplation, as inoperative as though it had never been passed.” (Norton v. Shelby County, 118 U.S. 425 (1886)). Moreover, these constraints purport to be legal constraints: the Supremacy Clause of Article VI of the Constitution states that “[t]his Constitution … shall be the supreme Law of the Land; and the Judges in every State shall be bound thereby.”

The most influential criticisms of Austin’s version of the pedigree thesis, however, owe to H. L. A. Hart’s seminal work, The Concept of Law. Hart points out that Austin’s theory provides, at best, a partial account of legal validity because it focuses on one kind of rule, namely that which requires citizens “to do or abstain from certain actions, whether they wish to or not” (Hart 1994, p. 81). While every legal system must contain so-called primary rules that regulate citizen behavior, Hart believes a system consisting entirely of the kind of liberty restrictions found in the criminal law is, at best, a rudimentary or primitive legal system.

On Hart’s view, Austin’s emphasis on coercive force leads him to overlook the presence of a second kind of primary rule that confers upon citizens the power to create, modify, and extinguish rights and obligations in other persons. As Hart points out, the rules governing the creation of contracts and wills cannot plausibly be characterized as restrictions on freedom that are backed by the threat of a sanction. These rules empower persons to structure their legal relations within the coercive framework of the law-a feature that Hart correctly regards as one of “law’s greatest contributions to social life.” The operation of power-conferring primary rules, according to Hart, indicates the presence of a more sophisticated system for regulating behavior.

But what ultimately distinguishes societies with full-blown systems of law from those with only rudimentary or primitive forms of law is that the former have, in addition to first-order primary rules, secondary meta-rules that have as their subject matter the primary rules themselves:

[Secondary rules] may all be said to be on a different level from the primary rules, for they are all about such rules; in the sense that while primary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do, these secondary rules are all concerned with the primary rules themselves. They specify the way in which the primary rules may be conclusively ascertained, introduced, eliminated, varied, and the fact of their violation conclusively determined (Hart 1994, p. 92).

Hart distinguishes three types of secondary rules that mark the transition from primitive forms of law to full-blown legal systems: (1) the rule of recognition, which “specif[ies] some feature or features possession of which by a suggested rule is taken as a conclusive affirmative indication that it is a rule of the group to be supported by the social pressure it exerts” (Hart 1994, p. 92); (2) the rule of change, which enables a society to add, remove, and modify valid rules; and (3) the rule of adjudication, which provides a mechanism for determining whether a valid rule has been violated. On Hart’s view, then, every society with a full-blown legal system necessarily has a rule of recognition that articulates criteria for legal validity that include provisions for making, changing and adjudicating law. Law is, to use Hart’s famous phrase, “the union of primary and secondary rules” (Hart 1994, p. 107). Austin theory fails, on Hart’s view, because it fails to acknowledge the importance of secondary rules in manufacturing legal validity.

Hart also finds fault with Austin’s view that legal obligation is essentially coercive. According to Hart, there is no difference between the Austinian sovereign who governs by coercing behavior and the gunman who orders someone to hand over her money. In both cases, the subject can plausibly be characterized as being “obliged” to comply with the commands, but not as being “duty-bound” or “obligated” to do so (Hart 1994, p. 80). On Hart’s view, the application of coercive force alone can never give rise to an obligation-legal or otherwise.

Legal rules are obligatory, according to Hart, because people accept them as standards that justify criticism and, in extreme cases, punishment of deviations:

What is necessary is that there should be a critical reflective attitude to certain patterns of behavior as a common standard, and that this should display itself in criticism (including self-criticism), demands for conformity, and in acknowledgements that such criticism and demands are justified, all of which find their characteristic expression in the normative terminology of ‘ought’, ‘must’, and ‘should’, and ‘right’ and ‘wrong’ (Hart 1994, p. 56).

The subject who reflectively accepts the rule as providing a standard that justifies criticism of deviations is said to take “the internal point of view” towards it.

On Hart’s view, it would be too much to require that the bulk of the population accept the rule of recognition as the ultimate criteria for legal validity: “the reality of the situation is that a great proportion of ordinary citizens-perhaps a majority-have no general conception of the legal structure or its criteria of validity” (Hart 1994, p. 111). Instead, Hart argues that what is necessary to the existence of a legal system is that the majority of officials take the internal point of view towards the rule of recognition and its criteria of validity. All that is required of citizens is that they generally obey the primary rules that are legally valid according to the rule of recognition.

Thus, on Hart’s view, there are two minimum conditions sufficient and necessary for the existence of a legal system: “On the one hand those rules of behavior which are valid according to the system’s ultimate criteria of validity must be generally obeyed, and, on the other hand, its rules of recognition specifying the criteria of legal validity and its rules of change and adjudication must be effectively accepted as common public standards of official behavior by its officials” (Hart 1994, p. 113).

Hart’s view is vulnerable to the same criticism that he levels against Austin. Hart rejects Austin’s view because the institutional application of coercive force can no more give rise to an obligation than can the application of coercive force by a gunman. But the situation is no different if the gunman takes the internal point of view towards his authority to make such a threat. Despite the gunman’s belief that he is entitled to make the threat, the victim is obliged, but not obligated, to comply with the gunman’s orders. The gunman’s behavior is no less coercive because he believes he is entitled to make the threat.

Similarly, in the minimal legal system, only the officials of the legal system take the internal point of view towards the rule of recognition that endows them with authority to make, execute, adjudicate, and enforce the rules. The mere presence of a belief in the officials that they are entitled to make law cannot give rise to an obligation in other people to comply with their enactments any more than the presence of a belief on the part of a gunman that he is entitled to issue orders gives rise to an obligation in the victim to comply with those orders. Hart’s minimal legal system is no less coercive than Austin’s legal system.

2. The Separability Thesis

The second thesis comprising the foundation of legal positivism is the separability thesis. In its most general form, the separability thesis asserts that law and morality are conceptually distinct. This abstract formulation can be interpreted in a number of ways. For example, Klaus Faber (1996) interprets it as making a meta-level claim that the definition of law must be entirely free of moral notions. This interpretation implies that any reference to moral considerations in defining the related notions of law, legal validity, and legal system is inconsistent with the separability thesis.

More commonly, the separability thesis is interpreted as making only an object-level claim about the existence conditions for legal validity. As H.L.A. Hart describes it, the separability thesis is no more than the “simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so” (Hart 1994, pp. 181-82). Insofar as the object-level interpretation of the separability thesis denies it is a necessary truth that there are moral constraints on legal validity, it implies the existence of a possible legal system in which there are no moral constraints on legal validity.

a. Inclusive vs. Exclusive Positivism

Though all positivists agree there are possible legal systems without moral constraints on legal validity, there are conflicting views on whether there are possible legal systems with such constraints. According to inclusive positivism (also known as incorporationism and soft positivism), it is possible for a society’s rule of recognition to incorporate moral constraints on the content of law. Prominent inclusive positivists include Jules Coleman and H.L.A. Hart, who maintains that “the rule of recognition may incorporate as criteria of legal validity conformity with moral principles or substantive values … such as the Sixteenth or Nineteenth Amendments to the United States Constitution respecting the establishment of religion or abridgements of the right to vote” (Hart 1994, p. 250).

In contrast, exclusive positivism (also called hard positivism) denies that a legal system can incorporate moral constraints on legal validity. Exclusive positivists like Joseph Raz (1979, p. 47) subscribe to the source thesis, according to which the existence and content of law can always be determined by reference to its sources without recourse to moral argument. On this view, the sources of law include both the circumstances of its promulgation and relevant interpretative materials, such as court cases involving its application.

At first glance, exclusive positivism may seem difficult to reconcile with what appear to be moral criteria of legal validity in legal systems like that of the United States. For example, the Fourth Amendment provides that “[t]he right of the people to be secure in their persons, houses, papers, and effects against unreasonable searches and seizures, shall not be violated.” Likewise, the First Amendment prohibits laws abridging the right of free speech. Taken at face value, these amendments seem to make moral standards part of the conditions for legal validity.

Exclusive positivists argue that such amendments can require judges to consider moral standards in certain circumstances, but cannot incorporate those standards into the law. When a judge makes reference to moral considerations in deciding a case, she necessarily creates new law on an issue-and this is so even when the law directs her to consider moral considerations, as the Bill of Rights does in certain circumstances. On this view, all law is settled law and questions of settled law can be resolved without recourse to moral arguments:

The law on a question is settled when legally binding sources provide its solution. In such cases judges are typically said to apply the law, and since it is source-based, its application involves technical, legal skills in reasoning from those sources and does not call for moral acumen. If a legal question is not answered by standards deriving from legal sources then it lacks a legal answer-the law on such questions is unsettled. In deciding such cases courts inevitably break new (legal) ground and their decision develops the law…. Naturally, their decisions in such cases rely at least partly on moral and other extra-legal considerations (Raz 1979, pp. 49-50).

If the judge can resolve an issue involving the First Amendment merely by applying past court decisions, then the issue is settled by the law; if not, then the issue is unsettled. Insofar as the judge looks to controversial moral standards to resolve the issue, she is going beyond the law because the mere presence of controversy about the law implies that it is indeterminate. Thus, on Raz’s view, references to moral language in the law, at most, direct judges to consider moral requirements in resolving certain unsettled questions of law. They cannot incorporate moral requirements into the law.

3. The Discretion Thesis

Third thesis commonly associated with positivism is the discretion thesis, according to which judges decide difficult cases by making new law in the exercise of discretion. Ronald Dworkin describes this thesis as follows:

The set of these valid legal rules is exhaustive of ‘the law’, so that if someone’s case is not clearly covered by such a rule . . . then that case cannot be decided by ‘applying the law.’ It must be decided by some official, like a judge, ‘exercising his discretion,’ which means reaching beyond the law for some other sort of standard to guide him in manufacturing a fresh legal rule or supplementing an old one (Dworkin 1977, p. 17).

On this view, a judge cannot decide a case that does not fall clearly under a valid rule by interpreting or applying the law; she must decide the case by creating or promulgating a law that did not exist prior to the adjudication. Thus, the discretion thesis implies that judges are empowered with a quasi-legislative lawmaking authority in cases that cannot be decided merely by applying law.

Though often associated with positivism, the discretion thesis does not belong to positivism’s theoretical core. The pedigree and separability theses purport to be conceptual claims that are true of every possible legal system. These two claims jointly assert that, in every possible legal system, propositions of law are valid in virtue of having been manufactured according to some set of social conventions. On this view, there are no moral constraints on the content of law that hold in every possible legal system.

But many positivists regard the discretion thesis as a contingent claim that is true of some, but not all, possible legal systems. Hart, for example, believes there will inevitably arise cases that do not fall clearly under a rule, but concedes a rule of recognition could deny judges discretion to make law in such cases by requiring judges “to disclaim jurisdiction or to refer the points not regulated by the existing law to the legislature to decide” (Hart 1994, p. 272). Indeed, Hart’s inclusive positivism allows him to hold that a rule of recognition could require judges to decide cases in precisely the manner that Dworkin advocates (Hart 1994, p. 263; and see Section IV-2, infra). Thus, at least for inclusive positivists like Hart, the discretion thesis makes a different kind of claim than the conceptual claims that form positivism’s theoretical core (Himma 1999).

Moreover, the discretion thesis is consistent with some forms of natural law theory. According to Blackstone’s classical naturalism, conformity with the natural law is a necessary condition for legal validity in every possible legal system. But insofar as the natural law is incomplete, there will inevitably arise issues that have multiple outcomes consistent with the natural law. Since none of the relevant outcomes in such cases offend the natural law, there is nothing in the assumption of necessary moral constraints on the content of law, in and of itself, that precludes Blackstone from endorsing the discretion thesis in such cases. Of course, if Blackstone believes the natural law contains a principle denying discretion to judges, then that commitment is inconsistent with the discretion thesis. But the assertion there are necessary constraints on the content of law, in and of itself, is consistent with the discretion thesis, even construed as a conceptual claim, as long as there are cases to which the natural law is indifferent.

In any event, Dworkin distinguishes three different senses in which a judge might be said to have discretion: (1) a judge has discretion when she exercises judgment in applying a legal standard to a particular case; (2) a judge has discretion when her decision is not subject to reversal by any other authority; and (3) a judge has discretion when her decision is not bound by any legal standards.

According to Dworkin, positivism’s discretion thesis is committed to the third sense of discretion, which he refers to as strong discretion. On Dworkin’s view, the thesis that judges have discretion only in the sense that they exercise judgment is trivially true, while the thesis that judges have discretion in the sense that their decisions are not subject to being reversed by a higher authority is false. Even the Supreme Court can be reversed by Congress or by constitutional amendment. Thus, on Dworkin’s view, the discretion thesis implies that judges have discretion to decide hard cases by what amounts to an act of legislation because the judge is not bound by any legal standards.

Thus construed, the discretion thesis is inconsistent with ordinary legal practice. Even in the most difficult of cases where there is no clearly applicable law, lawyers do not ask that the judge decide the relevant issue by making new law. Each lawyer cites cases favorable to her client’s position and argues that the judge is bound by those cases to decide in her client’s favor. As a practical matter, lawyers rarely, if ever, concede there are no legal standards governing a case and ask the judge to legislate in the exercise of discretion.

Nevertheless, the problem with Dworkin’s analysis is that it falsely presupposes an official cannot make new law unless there are no legal standards constraining the official’s decision. Indeed, lawmaking authorities in legal systems like the U.S. never have what Dworkin describes as strong discretion. Even the legislative decisions of Congress, the highest legislative authority in the nation, are always constrained by constitutional standards. For example, under the Fourteenth Amendment, Congress cannot enact a law that sets one speed limit for male drivers on interstate highways and another for female drivers.

For his part, Hart concedes that judicial lawmaking authority is limited in two respects: “not only are the judge’s powers subject to many constraints narrowing his choice from which a legislature may be quite free, but since the judge’s powers are exercised only to dispose of particular instant cases he cannot use these to introduce large-scale reforms or new codes” (Hart 1994, p. 273). What explains the judge’s discretion to make new law in a given case, on Hart’s view, is not the absence of legal standards constraining her decision; rather it is the absence of legal standards that dictate a uniquely correct answer to the case. The judge cannot decide such a case merely by applying existing law because there is more than one available outcome that coheres with existing law. In such instances, it is impossible to render a substantive decision (as opposed to simply referring the matter back to the legislature) without creating new law.

The discretion thesis is vulnerable to one powerful objection. Insofar as a judge decides a difficult case by making new law in the exercise of discretion, the case is being decided on the basis of a law that did not exist at the time the dispute arose. If, for example, a judge awards damages to a plaintiff by making new law in the exercise of discretion, it follows that she has held the defendant liable under a law that did not exist at the time the dispute arose. And, as Dworkin points out, it seems patently unfair to deprive a defendant of property for behavior that did not give rise to liability at the time the behavior occurred.

Nevertheless, Dworkin’s view fares no better on this count. While Dworkin acknowledges the existence of difficult cases that do not fall clearly under a rule, he believes they are not resolved by an exercise of judicial discretion. On Dworkin’s view, there is always a right answer to such cases implicit in the pre-existing law. Of course, it sometimes takes a judge of Herculean intellectual ability to discern what the right answer is, but it is always there to be found in pre-existing law. Since the right answer to even hard legal disputes is always part of pre-existing law, Dworkin believes that a judge can take property from a defendant in a hard case without unfairness (Dworkin 1977, pp. 87-130).

But if fairness precludes taking property from a defendant under a law that did not exist at the time of the relevant behavior, it also precludes taking property from a defendant under a law that did not give reasonable notice that the relevant behavior gives rise to liability. Due process and fundamental fairness require reasonable notice of which behaviors give rise to liability. As long as Dworkin acknowledges the existence of cases so difficult that only the best of judges can solve them, his theory is vulnerable to the same charge of unfairness that he levels at the discretion thesis.

4. Classic Criticisms of Positivism

a. Fuller’s Internal Morality of Law

In The Morality of Law, Lon L. Fuller argues that law is subject to an internal morality consisting of eight principles: (P1) the rules must be expressed in general terms; (P2) the rules must be publicly promulgated; (P3) the rules must be (for the most part) prospective in effect; (P4) the rules must be expressed in understandable terms; (P5) the rules must be consistent with one another; (P6) the rules must not require conduct beyond the powers of the affected parties; (P7) the rules must not be changed so frequently that the subject cannot rely on them; and (P8) the rules must be administered in a manner consistent with their wording (Fuller 1964, p. 39).

On Fuller’s view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law’s essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are “internal” to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law: “A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all” (Fuller 1964, p. 39).

These internal principles constitute a morality, according to Fuller, because law necessarily has positive moral value in two respects: (1) law conduces to a state of social order and (2) does so by respecting human autonomy because rules guide behavior. Since no system of rules can achieve these morally valuable objectives without minimally complying with the principles of legality, it follows, on Fuller’s view, that they constitute a morality. Since these moral principles are built into the existence conditions for law, they are internal and hence represent a conceptual connection between law and morality that is inconsistent with the separability thesis.

Hart responds by denying Fuller’s claim that the principles of legality constitute an internal morality; on Hart’s view, Fuller confuses the notions of morality and efficacy:

[T]he author’s insistence on classifying these principles of legality as a “morality” is a source of confusion both for him and his readers…. [T]he crucial objection to the designation of these principles of good legal craftsmanship as morality, in spite of the qualification “inner,” is that it perpetrates a confusion between two notions that it is vital to hold apart: the notions of purposive activity and morality. Poisoning is no doubt a purposive activity, and reflections on its purpose may show that it has its internal principles. (“Avoid poisons however lethal if they cause the victim to vomit”….) But to call these principles of the poisoner’s art “the morality of poisoning” would simply blur the distinction between the notion of efficiency for a purpose and those final judgments about activities and purposes with which morality in its various forms is concerned (Hart 1965, pp. 1285-86).

On Hart’s view, all actions, including virtuous acts like lawmaking and impermissible acts like poisoning, have their own internal standards of efficacy. But insofar as such standards of efficacy conflict with morality, as they do in the case of poisoning, it follows that they are distinct from moral standards. Thus, while Hart concedes that something like Fuller’s eight principles are built into the existence conditions for law, he concludes that they do not constitute a conceptual connection between law and morality.

Unfortunately, Hart’s response overlooks the fact that most of Fuller’s eight principles double as moral ideals of fairness. For example, public promulgation in understandable terms may be a necessary condition for efficacy, but it is also a moral ideal; it is morally objectionable for a state to enforce rules that have not been publicly promulgated in terms reasonably calculated to give notice of what is required. Similarly, we take it for granted that it is wrong for a state to enact retroactive rules, inconsistent rules, and rules that require what is impossible. Poisoning may have its internal standards of efficacy, but such standards are distinguishable from the principles of legality in that they conflict with moral ideals.

Nevertheless, Fuller’s principles operate internally, not as moral ideals, but merely as principles of efficacy. As Fuller would likely acknowledge, the existence of a legal system is consistent with considerable divergence from the principles of legality. Legal standards, for example, are necessarily promulgated in general terms that inevitably give rise to problems of vagueness. And officials all too often fail to administer the laws in a fair and even-handed manner-even in the best of legal systems. These divergences may always be prima facie objectionable, but they are inconsistent with a legal system only when they render a legal system incapable of performing its essential function of guiding behavior. Insofar as these principles are built into the existence conditions for law, it is because they operate as efficacy conditions-and not because they function as moral ideals.

Fuller’s jurisprudential legacy, however, should not be underestimated. While positivists have long acknowledged that law’s essential purpose is to guide behavior through rules (e.g., John Austin writes that “[a] law .. may be defined as a rule laid down for the guidance of an intelligent being by an intelligent being having power over him” Austin 1977, p. 5), they have not always appreciated the implications of this purpose. Fuller’s lasting contribution to the theory of law was to flesh out these implications in the form of his principles of legality.

b. Positivism and Legal Principles

Dworkin argues that, in deciding hard cases, judges often invoke legal principles that do not derive their authority from an official act of promulgation (Dworkin 1977, p. 40). These principles, Dworkin believes, must be characterized as law because judges are bound to consider them when relevant. But if unpromulgated legal principles constitute law, then it is false, contra the pedigree thesis, that a proposition of law is valid only in virtue of having been formally promulgated.

According to Dworkin, principles and rules differ in the kind of guidance they provide to judges:

Rules are applicable in an all-or-nothing fashion. If the facts a rule stipulates are given, then either the rule is valid, in which case the answer it supplies must be accepted, or it is not, in which case it contributes nothing to the decision…. But this is not the way principles operate…. [A principle] states a reason that argues in one direction, but does not necessitate a particular decision (Dworkin 1977, pp. 24-25).

On Dworkin’s view, conflicting principles provide competing reasons that must be weighed according to the importance of the respective values they express. Thus, rules are distinguishable from principles in two related respects: (1) rules necessitate, where principles only suggest, a particular outcome; and (2) principles have, where rules lack, the dimension of weight.

Dworkin cites the case of Riggs v. Palmer as representative of how judges use principles to decide hard cases. In Riggs, the court considered the question of whether a murderer could take under the will of his victim. At the time the case was decided, neither the statutes nor the case law governing wills expressly prohibited a murderer from taking under his victim’s will. Despite this, the court declined to award the defendant his gift under the will on the ground that it would be wrong to allow him to profit from such a grievous wrong. On Dworkin’s view, the court decided the case by citing “the principle that no man may profit from his own wrong as a background standard against which to read the statute of wills and in this way justified a new interpretation of that statute” (Dworkin 1977, p. 29).

The positivist might respond that when the Riggs court considered this principle, it was reaching beyond the law to extralegal standards in the exercise of judicial discretion. But Dworkin points out that the Riggs judges would “rightfully” have been criticized had they failed to consider this principle; if it were merely an extralegal standard, there would be no rightful grounds to criticize a failure to consider it (Dworkin 1977, p. 35). Accordingly, Dworkin concludes that the best explanation for the propriety of such criticism is that principles are part of the law.

Further, Dworkin maintains that the legal authority of standards like the Riggs principle cannot derive from promulgation in accordance with purely formal requirements: “[e]ven though principles draw support from the official acts of legal institutions, they do not have a simple or direct enough connection with these acts to frame that connection in terms of criteria specified by some ultimate master rule of recognition” (Dworkin 1977, p. 41). Unlike legal rules, legal principles lack a canonical form and hence cannot be explained by formal promulgation.

On Dworkin’s view, the legal authority of a binding principle derives from the contribution it makes to the best moral justification for a society’s legal practices considered as a whole. According to Dworkin, a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions: (1) the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and (2) the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1). The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be. Thus, Dworkin concludes, “if we treat principles as law we must reject the positivists’ first tenet, that the law of a community is distinguished from other social standards by some test in the form of a master rule” (Dworkin 1977, p. 44).

In response, positivists concede that there are legal principles, but argue that their authority as law can be explained in terms of the conventions contained in the rule of recognition:

Legal principles, like other laws, can be enacted or repealed by legislatures and administrative authorities. They can also become legally binding through establishment by the courts. Many legal systems recognize that both rules and principles can be made into law or lose their status as law through precedent (Raz 1972, p. 848).

According to this view, legal principles are like legal rules in that both derive their authority under the rule of recognition from the official acts of courts and legislatures. If the Riggs principle that no person shall profit from her own wrong has legal authority, it is because that principle was either declared by a court in the course of adjudicating a dispute or formally promulgated by the appropriate legislative body.

Further, inclusive positivists argue that Dworkin’s account of principles is itself consistent with the pedigree thesis. As Hart puts it, “this interpretative test seems not to be an alternative to a criterion provided by a rule of recognition, but … only a complex ‘soft-positivist’ form of such a criterion identifying principles by their content not by their pedigree” (Hart 1994, p. 263). The idea, familiar from Section II, is that a rule of recognition can incorporate content-based constraints on legal validity, even those rooted ultimately in morality.

c. The Semantic Sting

In Law’s Empire, Dworkin distinguishes two kinds of disagreement legal practitioners can have about the law. Lawyers can agree on the criteria a rule must satisfy to be legally valid, but disagree on whether those criteria are satisfied by a particular rule. For example, two lawyers might agree that a rule is valid if enacted by the state legislature, but disagree on whether the rule at issue was actually enacted by the state legislature. Such disagreements are empirical in nature and hence pose no theoretical difficulties for positivism.

There is, however, a second kind of disagreement that Dworkin believes is inconsistent with positivism. Lawyers often agree on the facts about a rule’s creation, but disagree on whether those facts are sufficient to endow the rule with legal authority. Such disagreement is considerably deeper than empirical disagreement as it concerns the criteria for legal validity-which, according to positivism, are exhausted by the rule of recognition. Dworkin calls this second kind of disagreement theoretical disagreement about the law.

Theoretical disagreement, on Dworkin’s view, is inconsistent with the pedigree thesis because the pedigree thesis explains the concept of law in terms of shared criteria for creating, changing and adjudicating law:

If legal argument is mainly or even partly about [the properties that make a proposition legally valid], then lawyers cannot all be using the same factual criteria for deciding when propositions of law are true and false. Their arguments would be mainly or partly about which criteria they should use. So the project of the semantic theories, the project of digging out shared rules from a careful study of what lawyers say and do, would be doomed to fail (Dworkin 1986, p. 43).

If lawyers disagree about the criteria of legal validity, then the grounds of legal validity cannot be exhausted by the shared criteria contained in a rule of recognition. The semantic sting, then, implies that there must be more to the concept of legal validity than can be explained by promulgation in accordance with shared criteria embodied in a rule of recognition.

The semantic sting resembles one of Dworkin’s earlier criticisms of Hart’s pedigree thesis. Hart believes that the rule of recognition is a social rule and is hence constituted by the conforming behavior of people who also accept the rule as a ground for criticizing deviations. Like all social rules, then, the rule of recognition has an external and internal aspect. The external aspect of the rule of recognition consists in general obedience to those rules satisfying its criteria of validity; the internal aspect is constituted by its acceptance as a public standard of official behavior. Hart believes it is this double aspect of the rule of recognition that accounts for its normativity and enables him to distinguish his theory from Austin’s view of law as a system of coercive commands. For, as Hart points out, a purely coercive command can oblige, but never obligate, a person to comply (see Section I, supra).

Dworkin argues that this feature of Hart’s theory commits him to the claim that there cannot be any disagreement about the content of rule of recognition:

Hart’s qualification … that the rule of recognition may be uncertain at particular points … undermines [his theory]…. If judges are in fact divided about what they must do if a subsequent Parliament tries to repeal an entrenched rule, then it is not uncertain whether any social rule [of recognition] governs that decision; on the contrary, it is certain that none does (Dworkin 1977, pp. 61-62).

On Dworkin’s view, the requirements of a social rule cannot be uncertain since a social rule is constituted by acceptance and conforming behavior by most people in the relevant group: “two people whose rules differ … cannot be appealing to the same social rule, and at least one of them cannot be appealing to any social rule at all” (Dworkin 1977, p. 55).

Jules Coleman responds that if the rule of recognition is a social rule, then Hart’s view implies there must be general agreement among the officials of a legal system about what standards constitute the rule of recognition, but it does not imply there cannot be disagreement as to what those standards require in any given instance:

The controversy among judges does not arise over the content of the rule of recognition itself. It arises over which norms satisfy the standards set forth in it. The divergence in behavior among officials as exemplified in their identifying different standards as legal ones does not establish their failure to accept the same rule of recognition. On the contrary, judges accept the same truth conditions for propositions of law…. They disagree about which propositions satisfy those conditions (Coleman 1982, p. 156).

Coleman, then, distinguishes two kinds of disagreement practitioners can have about the rule of recognition: (1) disagreement about what standards constitute the rule of recognition; and (2) disagreement about what propositions satisfy those standards. On Coleman’s view, Hart’s analysis of social rules implies only that (1) is impossible.

Under the U.S. rule of recognition, for example, a federal statute is legally valid if and only if it has been enacted in accordance with the procedural requirements described in the body of the Constitution and is consistent with the first fourteen amendments. Since, on Hart’s view, the U.S. rule of recognition is a social rule, U.S. officials must agree on the procedures the federal government must follow in enacting law, the set of sentences constituting the first fourteen amendments, and the requirement that federal enactments be consistent with those amendments.

But Hart’s view of social rules does not imply there cannot be any disagreement about whether a given enactment is consistent with the first fourteen amendments. Legal practitioners can and do disagree on what Hart calls penumbral (or borderline) issues regarding the various amendments. While every competent practitioner in the U.S. would agree, for example, that torturing a person to induce a confession violates the fifth amendment right against self-incrimination, there is considerable disagreement about whether compelling a defendant to undergo a psychiatric examination for the purpose of increasing her sentence also violates that right. On Coleman’s view, there is nothing in Hart’s analysis of social rules that precludes such borderline disagreements about whether a practice is consistent with the Fifth Amendment.

Despite its resemblance to this earlier criticism, Dworkin’s semantic sting argument takes aim at a deeper target. The semantic sting targets all so-called semantic theories of law that articulate the concept of law in terms of “shared rules … that set out criteria that supply the word’s meaning” (Dworkin 1986, p. 31). Thus, while the earlier criticism is directed at Hart’s extraneous account of social rules, the semantic sting is directed at what Dworkin takes to be the very heart of positivism’s theoretical core, namely, the claim that there are shared criteria that exhaust the conditions for the correct application of the concept of law.

At the root of the problem with semantic theories, on Dworkin’s view, is a flawed theory of what makes disagreement possible. According to Dworkin, semantic theories mistakenly assume that meaningful disagreement is impossible unless “we all accept and follow the same criteria for deciding when our claims are sound, even if we cannot state exactly, as a philosopher might hope to do, what these criteria are” (Dworkin 1986, p. 45). On this flawed assumption, two people whose concepts of law differ cannot be disagreeing about the same thing.

Perhaps with Coleman’s response to his earlier criticism in mind, Dworkin concedes that semantic theories are consistent with theoretical disagreements about borderline or penumbral cases: “people do sometimes speak at cross-purposes in the way the borderline defense describes” (Dworkin 1986, p. 41). But Dworkin denies semantic theories are consistent with theoretical disagreement about pivotal (or core) cases.  According to semantic theories, he says,

[Y]ou and I can sensibly discuss how many books I have on my shelf, for example, only if we both agree, at least roughly, about what a book is. We can disagree over borderline cases: I may call something a slim book that you would call a pamphlet. But we cannot disagree over what I called pivotal cases. If you do not count my copy of Moby-Dick as a book because in your view novels are not books, any disagreement is bound to be senseless (Dworkin 1986, p. 45).

The problem, on Dworkin’s view, is that many difficult appellate cases like Riggs involve theoretical disagreement about pivotal cases:

The various judges who argued about our sample cases did not think they were defending marginal or borderline claims. Their disagreements about legislation and precedent were fundamental; their arguments showed that they disagreed not only about whether Elmer should have his inheritance, but about why any legislative act, even traffic codes and rates of taxation, impose the rights and obligations everyone agrees they do…. They disagreed about what makes a proposition of law true not just at the margin but in the core as well (Dworkin 1986, pp. 42-43).

On Dworkin’s view, the judges in Riggs were not having a borderline dispute about some accepted criterion for the application of the concept of law. Rather, they were having a disagreement about the status of some putatively fundamental criterion itself: the majority believed, while the dissent denied, that courts have power to modify unambiguous legislative enactments.

Accordingly, theoretical disagreement about pivotal cases like Riggs is inconsistent with semantic theories of law, on Dworkin’s view, because it shows that shared criteria do not exhaust the proper conditions for the application of the concept of law. For the majority and dissenting judges in Riggs were having a sensible disagreement about law even though it centered on a pivotal case involving the criteria of legal validity. Thus, Dworkin concludes, the concept of law cannot be explained by so-called criterial semantics.

In response, Hart denies both that his theory is a semantic theory and that it assumes such an account of what makes disagreement possible:

[N]othing in my book or in anything else I have written supports [a semantic account] of my theory. Thus, my doctrine that developed municipal legal systems contain a rule of recognition specifying the criteria for the identification of the laws which courts have to apply may be mistaken, but I nowhere base this doctrine on the mistaken idea that it is part of the meaning of the word ‘law’ that there should be such a rule of recognition in all legal systems, or on the even more mistaken idea that if the criteria for the identification of the grounds of law were not uncontroversially fixed, ‘law’ would mean different things to different people (Hart 1994, p. 246).

Instead, Hart argues that his theory of law is “a descriptive account of the distinctive features of law in general as a complex social phenomenon” (Hart 1994, p. 246). Hart presents his theory, not as an account of how people apply the concept of law, but rather as an account of what distinguishes systems of law from other systems of social rules. On Hart’s view, it is the presence of a rule of recognition establishing criteria of validity that distinguishes law from other systems of social rules. Thus, according to Hart, Dworkin’s criticism fails because it mischaracterizes positivism as providing a criterial explanation of the concept of law.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Austin, John, Lectures on Jurisprudence and the Philosophy of Positive Law (St. Clair Shores, MI: Scholarly Press, 1977)
  • Austin, John, The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995)
  • Bentham, Jeremy, Of Laws In General (London: Athlone Press, 1970)
  • Blackstone, William, Commentaries on the Law of England (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979)
  • Coleman, Jules, “Negative and Positive Positivism,” 11 Journal of Legal Studies 139 (1982)
  • Dworkin, Ronald M., Law’s Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986)
  • Dworkin, Ronald M., Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Finnis, John, Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • Fuller, Lon L., The Morality of Law, Revised Edition (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1969)
  • Fuller, Lon L., “Positivism and Fidelity to Law–A Reply to Professor Hart,” 71 Harvard Law Review 630 (1958)
  • Faber, Klaus, “Farewell to ‘Legal Positivism’: The Separation Thesis Unraveling,” in George, Robert P., The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996), 119-162
  • George, Robert P., “Natural Law and Positive Law,” in George, Robert P., The Autonomy of Law: Essays on Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996), 321-334
  • Hart, H.L.A., The Concept of Law, Second Edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994)
  • Hart, H.L.A., “American Jurisprudence through English Eyes: The Nightmare and the Noble Dream,” reprinted in Hart, H.L.A., Essays in Jurisprudence and Philosophy (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983), 123-144.
  • Hart, H.L.A., “Book Review of The Morality of Law” 78 Harvard Law Review 1281 (1965)
  • Hart, H.L.A., Essays on Bentham (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1982)
  • Hart, H.L.A., “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals,” 71 Harvard Law Review 593 (1958)
  • Himma, Kenneth E., “Judicial Discretion and the Concept of Law,” forthcoming in Oxford Journal of Legal Studies vol. 18, no. 1 (1999)
  • Mackie, J.L., “The Third Theory of Law,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, vol. 7, no. 1 (Fall 1977)
  • Moore, Michael, “Law as a Functional Kind,” in George, Robert P. (ed.), Natural Law Theory: Contemporary Essays (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992), 188-242
  • Raz, Joseph, The Authority of Law: Essays on Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979)
  • Raz, Joseph, “Authority, Law and Morality,” The Monist, vol. 68, 295-324
  • Raz, Joseph, “Legal Principles and the Limits of Law,” 81 Yale Law Review 823 (1972)
  • Raz, Joseph, “Two Views of the Nature of the Theory of Law: A Partial Comparison,” Legal Theory, vol. 4, no. 3 (September 1998), 249-282
  • Waluchow, W.J., Inclusive Legal Positivism (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994)

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Email: himma@spu.edu
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 28, 2005 | Originally published: